Contextualism in Epistemology

In very general terms, epistemological contextualism maintains that whether one knows is somehow relative to context. Certain features of contexts—features such as the intentions and presuppositions of the members of a conversational context—shape the standards that one must meet in order for one’s beliefs to count as knowledge. This allows for the possibility that different contexts set different epistemic standards, and contextualists invariably maintain that the standards do in fact vary from context to context. In some contexts, the epistemic standards are unusually high, and it is difficult, if not impossible, for our beliefs to count as knowledge in such contexts. In most contexts, however, the epistemic standards are comparatively low, and our beliefs can and often do count as knowledge in these contexts. The primary arguments for epistemological contextualism claim that contextualism best explains our epistemic judgments—it explains why we judge in most contexts that we have knowledge and why we judge in some contexts that we don’t—and that contextualism provides the best solution to puzzles generated by skeptical arguments.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Subjunctive Conditionals Contextualism
  3. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Accepting Closure
    1. Dretske's Relevant Alternatives Theory of Knowledge
    2. Relevant Alternatives Contextualisms that Reject Closure
  4. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Accepting Closure
  5. Contextualism and Epistemic Rationality
  6. Other Forms of Epistemological Contextualism
    1. Explanatory Contextualism
    2. Evidential Contextualism
    3. Contextualism as a Theory of Knowledge
  7. Objections to Contextualism
  8. Alternatives to Contextualism
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Epistemological contextualism has evolved primarily as a response to views that maintain that we have no knowledge of the world around us. Taking quite seriously the problems presented by skepticism, contextualists seek to resolve the apparent conflict between claims like the following:

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. But I don't know that I have hands if I don’t know that I’m not a brain-in-a-vat (that is, a bodiless brain that is floating in a vat of nutrients and that is electrochemically stimulated in a way that generates perceptual experiences that are exactly similar to those that I am now having in what I take to be normal circumstances).
  3. I don't know that I’m not a brain-in-a-vat (henceforth, a BIV).

These claims, when taken together, present a puzzle. (1), (2), and (3) are independently plausible yet mutually inconsistent. That (1) is plausible seems to require no explanation. (3) is plausible because it seems that in order to know that I'm not a BIV, I must rule out the possibility that I am a BIV. Yet the BIV and I have perceptual experiences that are exactly similar—it seems to the BIV, just as it seems to me, that he has hands, that he is sitting at his desk and in front of his computer, and so on. Accordingly, my perceptual experiences give me no reason to favor the belief that I am not a BIV over the belief that I am. Thus, since I have only my perceptual experiences to go on, I cannot rule out the possibility that I'm a BIV. Considerations like these contribute to (3)’s plausibility.

Moreover, it seems that I can't know that I have hands—and, in general, that I can’t know that I have any body at all —if I can't rule out the possibility that I’m a bodiless BIV. This, then, contributes to the plausibility of (2). It seems in addition that (2) always retains its plausibility, no matter how high or low we set the standards for knowledge. Keith DeRose (1999a) defends this claim by noting that it is always a comparative fact that my epistemic position with respect to the claim that I'm not a BIV is just as strong as my epistemic position with respect to the claim that I have hands. If this is correct, then (2) is true across contexts, no matter what the epistemic standards.

Yet in spite of the fact that they are independently plausible, (1), (2), and (3) are mutually inconsistent; they cannot all be true. It seems, therefore, that we must give up one of these claims. But which one should we give up, and why?

In trying to answer these questions, contextualists maintain that 'know' either is or functions very much like an indexical, that is, an expression whose semantic content (or meaning) depends on the context of its use. For example, the word 'here' is an indexical. I say, "Jaime is here," and what I mean depends on where I am when I say it. If I'm in the conference room, then I mean, all other things being equal, that Jaime is in the conference room. 'I' is also an indexical—its meaning depends on the context of its use and, in particular, on who is using it. When Jaime says, "I am in the conference room," then he means, all other things being equal, that Jaime is in the conference room. Yet when Julie uses 'I', she means something different; Julie’s ‘I’ means Julie.

If 'know' is an indexical, its semantic content (or meaning) will depend on the context in which it is used. Furthermore, since context will affect the semantic content of 'know', context will have an effect on the semantic content of complex lexical items in which 'know' appears, for example, on the semantic content of knowledge attributions like 'Jaime knows that he's in the conference room’. Contextualists have put the point this way:

the truth-conditions of knowledge ascribing and knowledge denying sentences (sentences of the form 'S knows that P' and 'S doesn’t know that P’ and related variants of such sentences) vary in certain ways according to the contexts in which they are uttered. What so varies is the epistemic standards that S must meet (or, in the case of a denial of knowledge, fail to meet) in order for such a statement to be true. (DeRose 1999a, p. 187)

Given this, contextualists maintain that (1), (2), and (3) do not in fact conflict, even though it seems that they do. They suggest, first of all, that some contexts set very high epistemic standards, standards according to which knowledge requires a great deal. Contexts in which these high standards are in play are typically those in which we are considering and taking seriously certain skeptical hypotheses. For example, in order to know anything at all about the world around us, these high standards might require us to rule out the possibility that we are BIVs, or the possibility that we are now dreaming, or the possibility that we are now being deceived by an omnipotent but malevolent demon. Yet our perceptual experiences afford us no evidence that would allow us to rule out these skeptical possibilities, for if we were BIVs, for example, we would be having exactly the same perceptual experiences that we're now having. Thus, we fail to meet these high epistemic standards with respect both to the belief that I have hands and to the belief that I'm not a BIV. (1) is therefore false in these high-standards contexts while (3) is true. According to contextualists, then, we should reject (1) in high-standards contexts. When we do so, we are no longer faced with a conflict, for the conflict presents itself only when we insist on the truth of each of the three mutually inconsistent claims. Moreover, in rejecting (1) in high-standards contexts, contextualism gives the skeptic his due, and takes seriously the compelling nature of skeptical arguments.

Nevertheless, contextualists maintain that in most contexts, the epistemic standards are comparatively low. Typically, these are ordinary contexts in which we are considering no skeptical hypotheses. In such contexts, we can have knowledge of the world around us without eliminating skeptical possibilities like the BIV possibility. In order to know that I have a hand, for example, I need eliminate only possibilities like those in which I have no hands, or in which I have paws or claws instead of hands. Moreover, the evidence provided by my perceptual experiences—the evidence that I obtain by looking at my hands, or by hearing the sounds made when I clap them together—does allow me to eliminate these possibilities. Thus, we can meet the epistemic standards that are in place in low-standards contexts. (1) is therefore true in these contexts while (3) is false. According to contextualists, then, we should reject (3) in low-standards contexts. And here again, in rejecting (3), we keep the conflict between (1), (2), and (3) from presenting itself. Moreover, in rejecting (3) in low-standards contexts, contextualism allows us to retain our ordinary knowledge—it allows us to know the things we ordinarily take ourselves to know.

Yet if we are never actually faced with a conflict between (1), (2), and (3), why does it seem as if we are? Contextualists respond in this way: Since we most often find ourselves in low-standards contexts, we tend to evaluate knowledge attributions according to the epistemic standards that are in place in those contexts. Thus, we tend to reckon (1) true. However, since (3) makes explicit reference to BIVs, our evaluation of that claim tends to lead us to entertain the BIV skeptical scenario. Doing this can raise the epistemic standards—it can push us into a context in which the epistemic standards are quite high—and so we tend to reckon (3) true. And so it seems that we are faced with a conflict between (1), (2), and (3). Yet it merely seems as if we are faced with such a conflict. For, as we have seen, when the epistemic standards are high, (1) is false while (3) is true. But when the standards are lower, (1) is true while (3) is false.

Contextualism also allows us to explain why it seems in certain contexts that we don't know that we have hands (for example). We make these epistemic judgments at least partly because it's true in such contexts that we don't know that we have hands. And we judge in other contexts that we know that we have hands at least partly because such claims are true in those other contexts. Thus, contextualism not only helps us to see our way out of apparent conflicts like those between (1), (2), and (3), but it also helps us to explain why we make the epistemic judgments that we do.

The most prominent forms of epistemological contextualism are based either on Robert Nozick's subjunctive conditionals account of knowledge or on the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge that is associated with Fred Dretske and Alvin Goldman. The primary difference between these two forms of contextualism is in how they characterize epistemic standards. As we will see, the former characterizes the standards in terms of subjunctive conditionals, while the latter characterizes them in terms of relevant alternatives. We will consider subjunctive conditionals contextualism in Section 2 and relevant alternatives contextualism in Sections 3 and 4. Some forms of contextualism, however, are based on neither of these theories. One such view is the version of contextualism that Stewart Cohen advocates most recently, and we will consider this view in Section 5. Let us turn now, though, to subjunctive conditionals contextualism.

2. Subjunctive Conditionals Contextualism

Keith DeRose provides an influential brand of epistemological contextualism. It is intended to solve the puzzles generated by groups of statements like the following:

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. But I don't know that I have hands if I don’t know that I’m not a BIV.
  3. I don't know that I’m not a BIV.

DeRose claims that in contexts in which the standards for knowledge are unusually high, we should reject (1) and that the skeptic can truthfully say in such contexts that I don't know that I have hands. In other contexts, however, the epistemic standards are more relaxed and we can both reject (3) and correctly say that I do know that I have hands.

DeRose's contextualist solution seeks to explain the plausibility of (3) by utilizing resources provided by Robert Nozick. Specifically, DeRose's solution appeals to the Subjunctive Conditionals Account (SCA) of the plausibility of (3). According to SCA, "we have a very strong general, though not exceptionless, inclination to think that we don't know that P when we think that our belief that P is a belief we would hold even if P were false" (DeRose 1999a, p. 193). DeRose calls the belief that P insensitive if it is one that we would hold even if P were false. SCA's generalization thus becomes: We are inclined to think that S doesn't know that P if we think that S’s belief that P is insensitive.

DeRose claims that even though this generalization does not represent our ordinary standard for knowledge, there are contexts in which the skeptic puts it into place as the standard (for example, by mentioning skeptical possibilities like the possibility that you are now a BIV). The standard in such contexts is the skeptical standard, according to which my beliefs must be sensitive if they are to count as knowledge. When this standard is in place, as it is in skeptical contexts, I fail to know that I'm not a BIV. For my belief that I’m not a BIV is not sensitive: I would believe that I wasn’t a BIV even if I were a BIV. Moreover, since (2) is true in all contexts, it follows that I don't know in skeptical contexts that I have hands. In this way, DeRose's contextualism explains the plausibility of (3) and gives the skeptic his due by arguing that there are contexts in which we should reject (1).

But DeRose wants to avoid the boldly skeptical conclusion that I never know that I have hands, and he does this by arguing that in ordinary contexts of knowledge attribution—contexts in which the skeptical standard is not in place and in which the epistemic standards are comparatively low—we can reject (3). In these contexts, the skeptical standard is not in place, and our beliefs need not be sensitive in order to count as knowledge. Thus, we can truthfully assert in ordinary contexts that I do know that I have hands. And, since (2) is true in all contexts, it follows that I know in ordinary contexts that I'm not a BIV. In this way, DeRose’s contextualism explains the plausibility of rejecting (3) and allows us to retain the knowledge that we ordinarily take ourselves to have.

According to DeRose, the relevant difference between these contexts is that the standards for knowledge are quite high in skeptical contexts but comparatively low in ordinary ones. But what accounts for this difference? DeRose recognizes that he must "explain how the standards for knowledge are raised [by the skeptic]" (DeRose 1999a, p. 206) if his solution is to be adequate. Essential to this explanation is DeRose's Rule of Sensitivity:

When someone asserts that S knows (or does not know) that P, the standards for knowledge tend to be raised, if need be, to a level such that S's belief that P must be sensitive if it is to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1999a, p. 206)

He then provides the following explanation of how the skeptic raises the standards.

In utilizing [puzzles like those generated by (1)-(3)] to attack our putative knowledge of O [where O is a proposition that we ordinarily take ourselves to know], the skeptic instinctively chooses her skeptical hypothesis, H, so that it will have these two features: (1) We will be in at least as strong a position to know that not-H as we're in to know that O, but (2) Any belief we might have to the effect that not-H will be an insensitive belief.... Given feature (2), the skeptic's assertion that we don’t know that not-H, by the Rule of Sensitivity, drives the standards for knowledge up to such a point as to make that assertion true. ...And since we're in no stronger an epistemic position with respect to O than we're in with respect to not-H (feature (1)), then, at the high standards put in place by the skeptic’s assertion of [(3)], we also fail to know that O. (DeRose 1999a, pp. 206-7)

DeRose maintains, then, that the skeptic's assertion is the mechanism she uses to raise the standards for knowledge. When the skeptic asserts that I don't know that I’m not a BIV, the Rule of Sensitivity is invoked, and the standards for knowledge are raised to such a level that my beliefs must be sensitive if they are to count as knowledge. And since my belief that I'm not a BIV is not sensitive—that is, since I would believe that I wasn't a BIV even if I were a BIV—I do not know in skeptical contexts that I’m not a BIV. Thus, given the truth of (2), I do not know in skeptical contexts that I have hands (or, for that matter, anything that I ordinarily take myself to know.)

Nevertheless, when no one mentions a skeptical hypothesis, the Rule of Sensitivity is not invoked, and the epistemic standards allow beliefs to count as knowledge even though they are not sensitive. This means that in ordinary contexts, we are still in a position to know the things we ordinarily take ourselves to know.

3. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Rejecting Closure

Perhaps the main motivation for epistemological contextualism is now the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge. There are two kinds of relevant alternatives contextualism. One kind rejects the closure principle, according to which knowledge is closed under known implication:

If S knows that p, and knows that p implies q, then S knows that q.

The closure principle is both plausible and explanatorily valuable. For one thing, it helps to explain how we come to know things via deduction. I know, for example, that tomorrow is Saturday. I know this because I know that today is Friday and that if today is Friday then tomorrow is Saturday. The closure principle helps to account for this knowledge, and the fact that I come to know things via deduction—and in accordance with the closure principle—renders that principle both plausible and desirable.

A second kind of relevant alternatives contextualism accepts the closure principle.

In Section 3.2, we will consider Mark Heller's relevant alternatives contextualism, which represents accounts that reject the closure principle. Before examining Heller's contextualism, however, we should consider the theory that motivates it.

a. Dretske's Relevant Alternatives Theory of Knowledge

Fred Dretske proposes "to think of knowledge as an evidential state in which all relevant alternatives (to what is known) are eliminated" (Dretske 2000b, p. 52). This is the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, or RA. But this leaves several questions unanswered.

First, what is an alternative to p? A proposition q is an alternative to p if and only if it cannot be true both that q and that p. Thus, the proposition that this animal is a Siberian grebe is an alternative to the proposition that it's a Gadwall duck. For the animal cannot be both a Siberian grebe and a Gadwall duck.

Second, what is a relevant alternative to p? Dretske says that a relevant alternative is an alternative "that a person must be in a[n] evidential position to exclude (when he knows that P)" (Dretske 2000b, p. 57). But this doesn't help very much at all. What is it about the alternatives that S must exclude that makes them such that she must exclude them? Unfortunately, there is no widely accepted response to this question. The vote seems to be split between two candidates. Some, including Dretske, say that an alternative q is relevant only if there is an objective possibility that q. But others say that q can be a relevant alternative simply because we regard q as a possibility.

Third, what does it mean to eliminate a relevant alternative? Here, too, there is disagreement. One view about elimination is the strongest view, according to which S can eliminate a relevant alternative q only if her evidence for believing not-q is strong enough to allow her to know that not-q. A proponent of RA might instead adopt the strong view, according to which S can eliminate q if her evidence for thinking that not-q is either strong enough to allow her to know that not-q or strong enough to allow her to have very good reason to believe that not-q. A proponent of RA might also adopt the weak view, according to which S can eliminate a relevant alternative q by meeting one of the following three conditions: (i) her evidence for not-q is strong enough to allow her to know that not-q, (ii) her evidence for not-q is strong enough to allow her to have very good reason to believe that not-q, or (iii) S's belief that not-q is epistemically non-evidentially rational, where this is "a way in which it can be rational (or reasonable) [for S] to believe [that not-q] without possessing evidence for the belief" (Cohen 1988, p. 112). Some RA contextualists make it clear that they have something like the weak view in mind (see Cohen 1988 and Stine 1976), but most fail to make it clear which of the three views they adopt.

Dretske argues that I can know that p without eliminating the irrelevant alternatives to p. Still, he maintains that my knowing that p entails nothing whatsoever about whether I know that q, where q is an irrelevant alternative to p and might even be a necessary consequence of p. This amounts to a denial of the closure principle. Suppose that the alternative that this is a Siberian grebe is irrelevant to my knowing that it is a Gadwall duck. Notice too that the negation of the former proposition is a necessary consequence of the latter proposition—if this is a Gadwall duck, then it is not a Siberian grebe. Dretske claims that I can know that this is a Gadwall duck even though I don't know that it’s not a Siberian grebe. Thus, Dretske holds that the closure principle is false.

This verdict is quite controversial, however, and there is disagreement over this matter even among proponents of RA. I see the lines of this disagreement as boundaries between different kinds of RA theories, and we can classify RA theories according to whether they accept or reject closure. We might choose to do this partly because RA contextualists, as well as RA theorists in general, tend to make it clear whether they accept closure, while they do not always make it clear where they stand on other issues (e.g., on the issue of relevance and on the issue of elimination). Primarily, though, we should distinguish between RA contextualists who accept closure and those who reject it because their views about closure crucially influence how they respond to skepticism. As we shall shortly see, those who reject closure deny one of the conflicting claims, namely, (2), the claim that I don't know that I have hands if I don't know that I’m not a BIV. So, according to RA contextualists who reject closure, there really is no conflict at all between claims (1) and (3). But according to those who accept closure, there is such a conflict. For, by the closure principle, in contexts in which I don't know that certain skeptical alternatives do not obtain, I also fail to know certain things about the external world.

In Section 4, we will see how RA contextualists who accept closure respond to skepticism. In the following section, however, we will examine the response provided by RA contextualists who reject closure.

b. Relevant Alternatives Contextualisms that Reject Closure

Consider the puzzle that is generated by the following argument:

  1. I don't know that I’m not a BIV in a treeless world (that is, a BIVT).
  2. If I know that there is a tree before me (call the italicized proposition T), and I know that T implies my not being a BIVT, then I know that I'm not a BIVT.
  3. So, I don't know that T (given that I know that T implies my not being a BIVT).

In "Relevant Alternatives and Closure," Mark Heller follows Dretske's lead and argues that we can solve this skeptical puzzle by rejecting the closure principle, of which (5) is an instance.

To show why we should give up (5) (and hence the closure principle), Heller argues for a particular interpretation of RA. He claims that (5) is false if his interpretation of RA is true. He calls his interpretation Expanded Relevant Alternatives, or ERA.

(ERA) S knows that p only if S does not believe p in any of the closest not-p worlds or any more distant not-p worlds that are still close enough.

ERA accounts for our inclination to think, for example, that if I know that T, I will not believe that T in any of the closest worlds in which it's not the case that T. In addition, ERA accounts for our inclination to think that something else is sometimes needed if I am to know that T. Imagine that "the actual world is cluttered with papier mâché tree facsimiles which S is unable to distinguish from real trees" (Heller 1999b, p. 200). In this case, we are inclined to say that S doesn't know that T even if she doesn't believe that T in any of the closest not-T worlds. Here, even though worlds that are cluttered with papier mâché tree facsimiles are not among the closest not-T worlds, they are close enough to the actual world to count as relevant. So Heller claims that in at least some cases, if S is to know that p, she must not believe that p in any of the close enough not-p worlds.

ERA provides the foundation for a relevant alternatives contextualism, for it allows us to see different contexts as setting different epistemic standards. Which not-p worlds count as epistemically relevant—that is, which not-p worlds count as being close enough to the actual world—will vary from context to context. And since ERA characterizes epistemic standards in terms of relevant alternatives (that is, in terms of relevant not-p worlds), it allows for the context-sensitivity of epistemic standards.

In light of this, Heller maintains, we may solve the skeptical puzzle by concluding that (5) is false. Note first of all that there are no contexts in which I know that I'm not a BIVT. Given ERA, if I am to know that I'm not a BIVT, I must not believe that I’m not a BIVT in any of the closest BIVT worlds. Thus, since I do believe that I'm not a BIVT in the closest BIVT worlds, I don't know that I’m not a BIVT.

Nevertheless, there are contexts in which I do know that T. This is true because we use "different worlds as relevant alternatives when considering whether [I know that T] from those used when considering whether [I know that I'm not a BIVT]" (Heller 1999b, p. 197). According to ERA, I know in C that T because I don't believe that T in any of the not-T worlds that are close enough to the actual world. (And we need consider only the close enough not-T worlds because those worlds include the closest not-T worlds.) So given that ERA is true, (5) is false: I can know that there is a tree before me (and hence evade the skeptic's snare) even though I don’t know that I'm not a BIVT. We can therefore solve the skeptical puzzle by giving up the closure principle.

Any solution to the skeptical puzzle that denies the truth of (5) must explain why it seems to us that (5) is true. In providing this explanation, Heller argues that (5) seems true because some contexts conform to the demands of the closure principle. For example, there are contexts in which astonishingly distant not-T worlds—for example, worlds in which I am a BIVT—are close enough to the actual world to count as epistemically relevant. In those contexts, I know neither that T nor that I'm not a BIVT. For, in BIVT worlds, I believe both that T and that I'm not a BIVT. The fact that there are contexts such as these, contexts that conform to the demands of the closure principle, can make it seem that (5) is true.

4. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Accepting Closure

Some relevant alternatives contextualisms accept the closure principle. In this section, we will examine the contextualist theory espoused by Stewart Cohen in his influential article "How to be a Fallibilist." Cohen's theory is perhaps the most prominent relevant alternatives contextualism and should be counted among the most notable of all contextualisms.

Cohen's contextualism, like others, is intended to solve certain skeptical puzzles. The puzzle with which Cohen is concerned is familiar—it consists of three independently plausible but mutually inconsistent propositions.

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. If I don't know that I’m not a BIV, then I don’t know that I have hands.
  3. I don't know that I’m not a BIV.

To solve this paradox, Cohen relies on a relevant alternatives contextualism, one that accepts the plausibility—and indeed the truth—of proposition (2), which follows from the closure principle (given that I know that my having hands implies my not being a BIV). Cohen claims that in skeptical contexts, contexts in which the BIV alternative is relevant, we should accept propositions (2) and (3) but deny proposition (1). However, in ordinary contexts, contexts in which the BIV alternative is not relevant, we should accept (1) and (2) but deny (3).

Let's look at the details of Cohen’s account. For Cohen,

an alternative (to [some proposition] q) h is relevant (for [some person] S) = df S's epistemic position with respect to h precludes S from knowing q. (Cohen 1988, p. 101)

Cohen also claims that there are criteria of relevance and that these criteria ought to reflect our intuitions about the conditions under which S knows that q. He says that our intuitions are influenced both by conditions that are internal and by conditions that are external to a person's evidence. Accordingly, he offers two criteria of relevance. First, there is the external criterion.

An alternative (to p) h is relevant if the probability of h conditional on reason r and certain features of the circumstances is sufficiently high (where the level of probability that is sufficient is determined by context). (Cohen 1988, p. 102)

By this criterion, the fact that there are a number of cleverly painted mules in the zoo, whether or not I have any evidence for this fact, can be sufficient to make relevant the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule. Presumably, if there are a number of cleverly painted mules in the zoo, it is probable to some determinate degree d that this is a cleverly painted mule rather than, say, a zebra. And according to Cohen, the context determines, for example, that probabilities of degree d* and higher are sufficiently high to render an alternative relevant. Thus, according to the external criterion, if d is greater than or equal to d*, the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant in this context.

Second, there is the internal criterion.

An alternative (to q) h is relevant if S lacks sufficient evidence (reason) to deny h, i.e., to believe not-h (Cohen 1988, p. 103),

where the amount of evidence that is sufficient is presumably determined by context. By this criterion, the amount of evidence that S has for her belief that this is not a cleverly painted mule can be sufficiently low to make relevant the alternative that it is a cleverly painted mule. We may again presume that S has a determinate amount of evidence a for her belief that this is not a cleverly painted mule. Here, the context determines, say, that amounts of evidence a* and lower are sufficiently low to render an alternative relevant. So if a is less than or equal to a*, the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant in this context.

Both the internal criterion and the external criterion are sensitive to context. According to Cohen, then,

there will be no general specification of what constitutes sufficient evidence to deny an alternative in order for it not to be relevant, and as such, no general specification of what constitutes sufficient evidence to know q. Rather, this will depend on the context in which the attribution of knowledge occurs. (Cohen 1988, p. 103)

But how do the standards of relevance shift? Cohen recognizes that he must explain how this shift occurs if his contextualist solution to the skeptical paradox is to work. Because Cohen thinks of reasons as statistical in nature, he thinks that they advertise both the chance that we believe correctly on their basis and the chance that we believe erroneously on their basis. When the chances for error are highlighted, those chances become salient, and the standards for relevance shift. Thus, highlighting the chances for error allows certain alternatives to become relevant.

For example, suppose that I have reasons to believe that this is a zebra. It looks for all the world like a zebra; it is in an area of the zoo that is clearly marked "zebras"; I believe with good reason that zookeepers put only zebras in areas marked "zebras"; and so on. But perhaps someone underscores the fact that all of these reasons are compatible with this animal's being a cleverly painted mule. Such mules look for all the world like zebras, and in a pinch even the most conscientious zookeeper might put such creatures in an area marked "zebras." Underscoring these facts makes salient the chance that I believe erroneously on the basis of my reasons, and it makes relevant the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule.

This suggests that, for Cohen, the standards of relevance shift whenever someone underscores the statistical nature of our reasons, whenever someone points out that there is a chance that we believe erroneously on the basis of those reasons. So, in ordinary contexts, contexts in which no one underscores the chance that I believe erroneously, that chance will not be salient, and I can know on the basis of my reasons that this is a zebra. However, in skeptical contexts, contexts in which someone does underscore the chance that I believe erroneously, that chance will be salient. In these contexts, my attention will have been focused on the chance that I am wrong, and the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant. Since I cannot eliminate that alternative, I do not know that this is a zebra.

Cohen suggests that his relevant alternatives contextualism allows us to solve skeptical puzzles like those that focus on zebras and cleverly painted mules. This is because his version of the relevant alternatives theory is formulated in terms of evidence, and such puzzles involve beliefs for which we can have evidence. But Cohen suggests that radical skeptical paradoxes involve beliefs for which we can have no evidence—"radical skeptical hypotheses are immune to rejection on the basis of any evidence" (Cohen 1988, p. 111). As it is, then, Cohen's relevant alternatives contextualism seems ill equipped to resolve radical skeptical paradoxes.

To overcome this difficulty, Cohen adjusts his version of the relevant alternatives theory so that it takes into account beliefs for which I can have no evidence. He claims that for some such beliefs it is epistemically rational for me to hold them even though I possess no evidence for them. He calls beliefs of this sort intrinsically rational beliefs. Among the intrinsically rational beliefs is my belief that I'm not a BIV. According to Cohen, it is rational for me to believe that I’m not a BIV even though I have no evidence for that belief.

Taking into account intrinsically rational beliefs, Cohen amends the internal criterion of relevance. First, he says that

it is reasonable for a subject S to believe a proposition q just in case S possesses sufficient evidence in support of q, or q is intrinsically rational. (Cohen 1988, p. 113)

He then provides the following amended version of the internal criterion, or ICa:

(ICa:) An alternative (to p) h is relevant if it is not sufficiently reasonable for S to deny h (to believe not-h), where, presumably, the degree of reasonableness that is sufficient is determined by context.

Cohen now notes that according to ICa: the alternative that I am a BIV is not ordinarily relevant. For my belief that I'm not a BIV is intrinsically rational. This means that the alternative that I am a BIV does not preclude me from knowing, on the basis of my reasons, that I have hands. Thus, I can know in ordinary contexts that I have hands (given both that my reasons are sufficient for my knowing that I have hands and that all relevant alternatives are eliminated). Furthermore, Cohen claims that since the standards are comparatively low in ordinary contexts, I can also know in those contexts that I'm not a BIV.

However, there are contexts in which the skeptic underscores the fact that I can have no evidence for my belief that I'm not a BIV. By doing this, the skeptic focuses my attention on the chance of error. According to Cohen, this makes relevant the alternative that I am a BIV, and I cannot eliminate that alternative. So, by the standards that apply in these skeptical contexts, I know neither that I'm not a BIV nor that I have hands. In this way, then, Cohen solves the radical skeptical puzzle while maintaining that closure holds.

5. Contextualism and Epistemic Rationality

Certain objections have led Cohen to abandon the relevant alternatives contextualism that he presents in "How to be a Fallibilist" and to revise his contextualist solution to radical skeptical paradoxes. He is most troubled by two objections. First, he is troubled by the idea that I can have evidence for my belief that I'm not a BIV. Second, he is troubled by the idea that his account commits him to the view that I can have a priori knowledge of some contingent facts, in particular, of the fact that I'm not a BIV. On the view that he presents in "How to be a Fallibilist," I can know that I’m not a BIV solely on the basis of the intrinsic rationality of denying that I am a BIV. According to Cohen (see Cohen 1999, p. 69), this means that I can know a priori that I'm not a BIV and hence that I can have a priori knowledge of some contingent facts. These two objections have led Cohen away from his earlier relevant alternatives contextualism.

Even though Cohen now admits that I can have evidence for my belief that I'm not a BIV, he still thinks that there are beliefs for which I can never have evidence. He formulates a new radical skeptical paradox in terms of such beliefs. Cohen asks us to imagine a creature that is a BIV but will never have evidence that it is. Call such a creature a BIV*. Now, my belief that I'm not a BIV* is a belief for which I will never have evidence. We can formulate the following new paradox in terms of that belief.

  1. I know that I have hands.
  1. f I don't know that I’m not a BIV*, then I don’t know that I have hands.
  2. I don't know that I’m not a BIV*.

Since this paradox involves a skeptical hypothesis for which I can never have evidence, the idea that I can have evidence for my belief that I'm not a BIV* should not trouble Cohen’s solution to this new paradox.

But given that Cohen has abandoned the relevant alternatives framework, just what is his solution to the BIV* paradox? He notes first of all that my belief that I'm not a BIV* can be intrinsically rational, or what he now calls non-evidentially rational. Once again, S's belief that p is non-evidentially rational if it is epistemically rational for S to believe that p even though S has no evidence for that belief. Furthermore, Cohen now suggests that

S knows that p if and only if her belief that p is epistemically rational to some degree d, where epistemic rationality has both an evidential and a non-evidential component, and where d is determined by context. (see Cohen 1999, pp. 63-69, 76-77)

Suppose, then, that I have a certain amount of evidence for my belief that I have hands, and that my belief that I have hands is therefore evidentially rational to degree de:. Suppose too that my belief that I'm not a BIV* is non-evidentially rational to some degree dne. Cohen claims that "the non-evidential rationality [of my belief that I'm not a BIV*] is a component of the overall rationality or justification for any empirical proposition" (Cohen 1999, p. 86, fn. 36). So we may suppose that my belief that I have hands is epistemically rational to degree d*, where d* equals de plus dne.

Cohen now says that the degree to which a belief must be epistemically rational if it is to count as knowledge is "determined by some complicated function of speaker intentions, listener expectations, presuppositions of the conversation, salience relations, etc." (Cohen 1999, p. 61). He suggests that the listeners' cooperation is an essential part of this function. He also claims that in ordinary contexts this complicated function specifies that a belief is sufficiently epistemically rational if it is epistemically rational to degree do. And d*—the degree to which my belief that I have hands is epistemically rational—is greater than do. This means that I can know in ordinary contexts that I have hands. "And since my having a hand entails my not being a brain-in-a-vat [and a fortiori a BIV*], in those same [ordinary] contexts, my belief that I am not a brain-in-a-vat is sufficiently rational for me to know I am not a brain-in-a-vat" (Cohen 1999, p. 77). This allows him to overcome the objection that I know a priori that I'm not a BIV, for "my knowledge that I am not a brain-in-a-vat is based, in part, on my empirical evidence (the evidence that I have a hand), and so is not a priori" (Cohen 1999, p. 76). In ordinary contexts, then, we accept propositions (1) and (7) of the new radical skeptical paradox, but deny proposition (8).

But in skeptical contexts the complicated function specifies that a belief is sufficiently epistemically rational only if it is epistemically rational to degree ds. And d* is less than Ds This means that in skeptical contexts "my belief that I have a hand is not sufficiently rational for me to know I have a hand. In those same [skeptical] contexts, I have no basis for knowing I am not a brain-in-a-vat" (Cohen 1999, p. 77). In skeptical contexts, we accept propositions (7) and (8) but deny proposition (1). In this way, then, Cohen solves the BIV* paradox while maintaining that closure holds.

6. Other Forms of Epistemological Contextualism

Besides those already discussed, a few other forms of epistemological contextualism warrant mention. We begin with the form that belongs to Steven Rieber, which is most similar to those already considered.

a. Explanatory Contextualism

In "Skepticism and Contrastive Explanation," Steven Rieber provides a contextualist solution to the skeptical puzzle generated when (1), (2), and (3) are considered together. He first proposes the following analysis of knowledge:

S knows that P … iff: the fact that P explains why S believes that P. (Rieber 1998, p. 194)

He next claims that his analysis of knowledge "generates the sort of context-sensitivity needed to solve the skeptical puzzle" (Rieber 1998, p. 195). He says that "what counts as an explanation is highly context-dependent. In particular, as recent work on contrastive explanation has made clear, it can depend on an implied contrast" (Rieber 1998, p. 195). For example, only those who have syphilis contract paresis, but most of those who have syphilis never get paresis. Suppose that Smith has both syphilis and paresis. We might ask

(S) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he contracted paresis?

According to Rieber, the answer to this question can depend on what is being implicitly contrasted with Smith. If there is an implied contrast with Jones, who has neither syphilis nor paresis, then we understand (S) to be asking

(J) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he rather than Jones contracted paresis?

And the answer to (J) might well be yes. However, if there is an implied contrast with Brown, who has syphilis but did not contract paresis, then we understand (S) to be asking

(B) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he rather than Brown contracted paresis?

And the answer to (B) might well be no. So it seems that whether one thing explains another can depend on context. Thus, given Rieber's explanatory analysis of knowledge, knowledge too will be context-sensitive.

Rieber's analysis of knowledge seems to him to be well suited to solve the skeptical puzzle. He suggests that on his analysis of knowledge, to ask

(9) Do I know that I have hands?

is to ask

(9a) Does the fact that I have hands explain why I believe that I have hands?

Rieber claims that in ordinary contexts the answer to (9a) is clearly yes, and so I know in such contexts that I have hands. Presumably, I also know in those contexts that I'm not a BIV.

But a consideration of the BIV skeptical possibility can make salient a contrast with that possibility. When this contrast is salient, we understand (9) to be asking

(9b) Does the fact that I have hands rather than being a handless BIV explain why I believe that I have hands rather than that I am a handless BIV?

The answer to (9b) is no, for all of the evidence that I have for my belief that I have hands is compatible with my being a handless BIV. And whenever the answer to (9b) is no, so is the answer to (9). Thus, in skeptical contexts, contexts in which a contrast with the BIV possibility is salient, we should accept (3) but deny (1). The skeptic can truthfully say in such contexts that I know neither that I'm not a BIV nor that I have hands.

Rieber's explanatory contextualism thus solves our skeptical puzzle. In ordinary contexts, we accept (1) and (2) but deny (3). I know in such contexts both that I have hands and that I'm not a BIV. However, when we consider certain skeptical possibilities, certain contrasts become salient. In these contexts, I know neither that I have hands nor that I'm not a BIV.

b. Evidential Contextualism

In "Contextualism and the Problem of the External World," Ram Neta argues that the standards for knowledge are invariant, and therefore that we should not see the skeptic as being able to raise those standards. We ought instead to understand the skeptic to be restricting what can count as evidence. The skeptic does this, according to Neta, by exploiting the context-sensitivity of our attributions of evidence. When she brings up the BIV skeptical hypothesis, for example, the skeptic restricts what I can truthfully regard as my evidence to just those mental states that are available to me whether or not I am a BIV. That is, she prevents any of my current mental states from counting as evidence for my beliefs about the external world, thereby creating an unbridgeable (in this context, at least) epistemic gap between my evidence and my beliefs. In these contexts, my beliefs fail to meet the epistemic standard and therefore fail to count as knowledge. Still, in contexts in which I am considering no skeptical hypotheses, I can have plenty of evidence for my beliefs about the external world. In such contexts, my beliefs can meet the epistemic standards and can therefore count as knowledge. In this way, Neta's version of contextualism, like the other versions we've considered, is meant to resolve familiar conflicts and to explain why we judge in most contexts that we have knowledge but why we judge in other contexts that we don't.

c. Contextualism as a Theory of Knowledge

The last two forms of epistemological contextualism, those belonging to Michael Williams and to David Annis, have few similarities with the forms we've considered so far.

In his recent work, Williams argues for contextualism, which is, for him, the view that "independently of all [situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors], a proposition has no epistemic status whatsoever. There is no fact of the matter as to what kind of justification it either admits of or requires" (Williams 1996a, p. 119). His arguments for contextualism also count as arguments against epistemological realism, which is the view that even independently of contextual factors, there is a fact of the matter as to what kind of justification a belief requires. In particular, epistemological realism maintains the truth of the doctrine of epistemic priority (or DEP). According to DEP, our beliefs about the external world must be justified by sensory experience if they are to amount to knowledge. Williams argues that epistemological realism in general and DEP in particular are "contentious and possibly dispensable theoretical ideas about knowledge and justification" (Williams 1999b, p. 144). He also argues that skepticism depends essentially on these contentious ideas, and that, being theoretical, they are not forced on us by our ordinary ways of epistemic thinking. This suggests that skepticism is unnatural and thus that the burden of proof belongs to the skeptic. Yet since the skeptic cannot carry this burden, we have, according to Williams, no reason to take skepticism seriously.

Annis' contextualism is meant to be an alternative both to foundationalism and to coherentism. Annis complains that both foundationalism and coherentism ignore the social nature of justification. According to his version of contextualism, then, S is justified in believing that p only if she can meet certain objections that express real doubts. These objections can include, but are not necessarily limited to, those according to which S is not in a position to know that p and those according to which p is false. We might object, for example, that since S is not reliable in situations like this, she is not in a position to know that the book on yonder shelf is brown. Thus, if S is to be justified in believing that the book is brown, she must be able to meet that objection. The justification of S's belief that p also depends, according to Annis, on who offers certain objections and on the importance of S's being right about p. It matters, for example, that it is S's flight instructors, rather than her teasing friends, who object that she is unreliable when it comes to distinguishing the colors of fairly distant objects. A theory of justification that includes contextual parameters like these, Annis argues, fares better than either foundationalism or coherentism, both of which overlook the social nature of justification.

7. Objections to Contextualism

In this section, we will discuss two leading objections to epistemological contextualism. These are by no means the only criticisms that have been leveled against contextualism, but they introduce themes that have motivated additional objections as well as alternatives to contextualism. A discussion of these objections, then, should provide a center of operations for an exploration of objections to contextualism.

Palle Yourgrau (1983) argues that contextualism allows for dialogues such as the following since it claims that the standards for knowledge shift from context to context:

A: Is that a zebra?
B: Yes, it is a zebra.
A: But can you rule out its merely being a cleverly painted mule?
B: No, I can't.
A: So you admit you didn't know it was a zebra.
B: No, I did know then that it was a zebra. But after your question, I no longer knew.

This dialogue strikes Yourgrau as absurd, for it seems that nothing changes during the course of the conversation that would account for a change in B's epistemic state: B is in just as good an epistemic position at the beginning of the conversation as she is at the end of the conversation, and so it seems that if B knows at the beginning, she should also know at the end. This suggests that, contrary to epistemological contextualism, we cannot affect shifts in the standards for knowledge simply by mentioning certain skeptical possibilities.

Contextualists (see DeRose 1992) have replied to this sort of objection by saying that once A introduces a skeptical possibility and thereby raises the standards for knowledge, B can no longer truly say, "I did know then that it was a zebra." Once the standards for knowledge have been raised, the truth of any attribution of knowledge, including an attribution that is meant to apply only at some time in the past, must be judged according to those higher standards. Once the standards have been raised, B cannot both attribute knowledge to himself in the past and deny knowledge to himself in the present. He should now only deny himself knowledge; once the standards have been raised, neither B's past self nor his present self knows that this is a zebra.

Stephen Schiffer has leveled a different sort of criticism at epistemological contextualism. Again, contextualism maintains that we attribute knowledge relative to standards that shift from context to context. This is to say, in effect, that when we say that B knows that this is a zebra, we mean that she knows relative to such-and-such an epistemic standard that this is a zebra. Putting this another way, contextualism maintains that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative. Yet the contextualist's response to Yourgrau’s objection suggests that B—or anyone else, for that matter—might fail to realize that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative to an epistemic standard that shifts from context to context. Schiffer argues, however, that it is a general linguistic truth that speakers do realize that certain attributions are implicitly relative. For example, anyone who utters, "It's raining," in order to say that it’s raining in London knows full well that she’s asserting that it's raining in London. Yet, according to Schiffer, when we utter, "B knows that it’s a zebra," we typically do not take ourselves to be asserting that B knows relative to any standard. All this suggests, Schiffer argues, that the contextualist is wrong to think that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative, and hence wrong to think that the standards for knowledge can shift from context to context.

8. Alternatives to Contextualism

Objections like these push people away from epistemological contextualism and toward theories that envisage epistemic standards that remain invariant from context to context. Two such theories present themselves as alternatives to contextualism. The first is skepticism, and the second is Mooreanism. Both skeptics and Mooreans maintain that the standards for knowledge do not shift. Yet while the skeptic claims that they are invariantly quite high, the Moorean claims that the standards are invariantly comparatively low.

The skeptic contends not only that there are no contexts in which we know that we're not BIVs, but also that there are no contexts in which we know that we have hands (see, for example, Unger 1975 and Stone 2000). This response strikes some as implausible, however, since it does not accord with the thought that there are many contexts in which we can and do know things about the world around us.

The Moorean contends that there are never any insurmountable obstacles to our knowing both that we have hands and that we're not BIVs.

Ernest Sosa's Moorean response begins with the rejection of Nozick’s idea that knowledge requires sensitivity (see Section 2). He argues instead that knowledge requires safety, according to which S would believe that p only if it were the case that p (see Sosa 1999, p. 142). Moreover, both my belief that I have hands and my belief that I'm not a BIV are safe. Hence, both beliefs can always count as knowledge. Sosa says that

after all, not easily would one believe that [one was not radically deceived] without it being true … . In the actual world, and for quite a distance away from the actual world, up to quite remote possible worlds, our belief that we are not radically deceived matches the fact as to whether we are or are not radically deceived. (Sosa 1999, p. 147)

Yet if I can know across contexts that I'm not a BIV, why is it that it sometimes seems as if I don't know that I’m not a BIV? Sosa maintains that since we can easily mistake safety for sensitivity, and since the belief that we're not BIVs is not sensitive, it can sometimes seem to us that our belief that we're not BIVs is not safe and thus that we don’t know that we’re not BIVs. Nevertheless, this is, according to Sosa, a mere appearance. For, since our belief is safe, we can know across contexts that we're not BIVs and thus adopt a Moorean response to our skeptical puzzles.

Tim Black also provides a Moorean response to these puzzles. Employing Nozick's sensitivity requirement for knowledge, Black argues in "A Moorean Response to Brain-in-a-Vat Scepticism" that the only worlds that are relevant to whether or not S knows that p are those in which S's belief is produced by the method that actually produces it. This means that BIV worlds—possible worlds in which S is a BIV—are not relevant to whether S knows that she's not a BIV. For BIV worlds are worlds in which her belief is produced by a method other than the one that actually produces it. Thus, since BIV worlds are not relevant to whether S know things about the external world, S can know both that she has hands and that she's not a BIV. This, too, suggests a Moorean response to our skeptical puzzles.

9. Conclusion

We have now characterized epistemological contextualism in a way that allows several different theories to count as versions of that position. We have seen in particular that epistemological contextualists maintain that certain features of conversational contexts shape the standards that one must meet in order for one's beliefs to count as knowledge. Understood in this way, a fairly wide range of views will count as versions of epistemological contextualism. Different versions will disagree over which features of conversational contexts can shape the epistemic standards, and over how the relevant contextual features help to shape those standards. Yet in spite of the differences between versions of epistemological contextualism, each seeks to achieve the valuable ends of explaining our epistemic judgments and solving the puzzles that are generated by skeptical arguments.

10. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Tim Black
Email: tim.black@csun.edu
California State University, Northridge
U. S. A.