Karl Popper: Critical Rationalism

popper“Critical Rationalism” is the name Karl Popper (1902-1994) gave to a modest and self-critical rationalism. He contrasted this view with “uncritical or comprehensive rationalism,” the received justificationist view that only what can be proved by reason and/or experience should be accepted. Popper argued that comprehensive rationalism cannot explain how proof is possible and that it leads to inconsistencies. Critical rationalism today is the project of extending Popper’s approach to all areas of thought and action. In each field the central task of critical rationalism is to replace allegedly justificatory methods with critical ones.

Section 2 explains how critical rationalism arose out of the breakdown of Popper’s first justificationist attempt to account for scientific progress. Section 2 also presents Popper’s first application of his non-justificationist perspective to new fields in his The Open Society and Its Enemies. Section 3 first explains Joseph Agassi’s view of the critical appraisal of metaphysical theories in scientific contexts as well as his view of piecemeal rationality, and secondly portrays William Bartley’s more comprehensive view of non-justificationism. Section 4 discusses Imré Lakatos’s extension of critical rationalism to mathematics. Section 5 portrays Hans Albert’s systematic version of critical rationalism. His perspective incorporated results of Popper, Agassi and Bartley and extended them to social and political theory. Section 6 suggests that Mario Bunge’s fallibilism ─ which he developed independently of critical rationalists ─ is sufficiently close to their views to count here: he develops critical tools for achieving progress without justification in virtually all areas of thought. Section 7 discusses attempts to develop critical rationalism in new and simpler ways. These views seek to do without frameworks and methodological rules; their originators are Jagdish Hattiangadi, Gunnar Andersson, and David Miller. These theories deprive rational thought of needed steering mechanisms. Section 8 presents the reintroduction of forms of justification designed to be compatible with Popper’s criticism of induction. These have been developed by Alan Musgrave, Volker Gadenne and John Watkins. Section 9 explains how Popper’s emphasis on the importance of methodological rules in science has led to a critical rationalist sociology of science. The main task of this sociology of science is to examine existing rules and methods as furthering or hindering research. Section 10 calls attention to the alternative philosophical anthropology which Agassi has proposed as a framework for critical rationalism. Whereas Popper saw rationality as contrary to human nature’s craving for security, Agassi sees rationality as natural, but partial and improvable. Section 11 describes how Popper’s original political manifesto in The Open Society and Its Enemies has led to attempts to use his arguments to defend both right-leaning and left-leaning political theories. Section 12 returns to Popper’s early researches in educational theory. His philosophy led to concerted efforts to develop a new pedagogy which emphasizes active problem solving as the best learning method. This pedagogy should promote autonomy and critical thinking. Section 13 concludes with the suggestion that the success or the failure of the project of substituting critical for allegedly justificatory methods has still to be judged.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Popper and Non-Justificationism
  3. Joseph Agassi and William Bartley
  4. Critical Rationalism in Mathematics
  5. Hans Albert
  6. Mario Bunge and Fallibilism
  7. Critical Rationalism without Frameworks of Methodological Rules
  8. Critical Rationalism, Truth and Best Theories
  9. Critical Rationalist Sociology of Science
  10. Philosophical Anthropology and Critical Rationality
  11. Critical Rationalism and Political Society
  12. Popper and Education Theory
  13. Conclusion
  14. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Critical rationalism emerged from research by the Würzburg school of psychology. This school sought to develop a deductivist philosophy of science to complement their deductivist psychology. While working on this program, Karl Popper stumbled onto a non-justificationist theory of scientific knowledge: he explained the growth of knowledge without proof. Non-justificationism, that is, the theory that no theory can be proven, is at least as old as Socrates, but Popper’s version of it is the first that also purports to explain the growth of knowledge. Popper and other critical rationalists took on the project of explaining the growth of knowledge without justification. This project has produced various competing theories of rationality and has been extended to many fields. This article will concentrate on the internal logic and problems involved in the development of critical methods capable of producing the growth of knowledge.

Of the numerous justificationist predecessors let only this be said. The overwhelming majority of those who comment on critical rationalism claim that critical rationalism is somehow incoherent and that inductivism is better. A major exception was Bertrand Russell. He appreciated the logical strength of critical rationalism and knew the logical weakness of induction. Nevertheless he clung to induction. He thought that critical rationalism was a philosophy of despair. Whether his judgment of critical rationalism was correct depends on whether its development can bring progress. To show this progress, new critical rationalist ideas are described and presented below. This should provide an answer to Russell that he amply deserves.

2. Popper and Non-Justificationism

Inductive inferences have observations as premises and theories as conclusions. They are notoriously invalid but often are deemed unavoidable. Critical rationalism views them as unnecessary. This point of view grew gradually out of Karl Popper’s attempt to describe science without their use in Die beiden Grundprobleme der Erkenntnistheorie (1932-33), where he still operated within the framework of justificationism, that is, while viewing the aim of scientific method as the proper (justified) assessment of the truth value of certain sentences. He hoped to build a theory of the proper assessment of sentences, that is, of the possibility of proving the truth or falsity of some sentences. He began with the fact that a theory is false if it contradicts a singular sentence describing some observation reports. Popper then said that such singular sentences were veridical, that is, truthful as opposed to illusory, so they may be used to produce final proofs of the falsity of some universal sentences. For example, the singular sentence, “That swan is black,” if it is a true report of some observation, can be used to produce a final proof of the falsity of the universal sentence, “All swans are white.” But, he argued, proof of universal sentences or the demonstration that they are probable requires inductive inferences. As a consequence no such putative proof can be valid.

Popper himself found the theory he presented in Die beiden Grundprobleme der Erkenntnistheorie without chapter 5 inadequate for three reasons. The first reason is that singular statements are not veridical. He began work on this problem in chapter 5 of Die beiden Grundprobleme. This chapter contains a theory of science which differs on important points from the theory found in the rest of that volume. The second reason that Popper’s first attempt broke down is that one can circumvent refutations by ad hoc stratagems, as Hans Reichenbach quickly pointed out in a note which responded to Popper’s first publication of his view in Erkenntnis. The third reason was Popper’s inability to handle the problem of the demarcation of science from non-science with his idea that we show how science properly assigns truth values to sentences with no inductive inference. On a justificationist theory of the task of the philosophy of science such as Reichenbach’s, which was identical to Popper’s theory as he wrote Die beiden Grundprobleme without chapter 5, science should be demarcated by the proper assignment of truth values: science is the set of sentences with justifiably assigned truth values. The task of the philosophy of science is to explain how these assignments are properly made. (Reichenbach said the calculus of probabilities serves that purpose.) Popper argued that it is not possible to properly assign either the truth value True or some degree of probability to universal sentences. He called such sentences “fictions”, which is a term he had earlier taken over from Hans Vaihinger. On the theory presented in Die beiden Grundprobleme without chapter 5, after science had done its job, there were still, on the one hand, some fictions which ought to be deemed scientific such as the theories of the Würzburg school in psychology and, perhaps, as he said later, Einstein’s physics, and, on the other hand, other fictions which should be deemed unscientific, such as the psychologies of Freud and Adler. He could not distinguish between these two sets of theories within his justificationist framework, since, on this view, only proofs or refutations of these theories could do that. He asserted, however, that no proof was possible and refutations could establish only the falsity of universal propositions.

As a consequence of these three difficulties Popper developed an entirely different theory of science in chapter 5, then in Logik der Forschung. In order to overcome the problems his first view faced, he adopted two central strategies. First, he reformulated the task of the philosophy of science. Rather than presenting scientific method as a tool for properly assigning truth values to sentences, he presented rules of scientific method as conducive to the growth of knowledge. Apparently he still held that only proven or refuted sentences could take truth values. But this view is incompatible with his new philosophy of science as it appears in his Logik der Forschung: there he had to presume that some non-refuted theories took truth values, that is, that they are true or false as the case may be, even though they have been neither proved nor refuted. It is the job of scientists to discover their falsity when they can. So, he worked around the difficulty posed by the fact that, on the one hand, he had to assume that theories were refutable and thus had truth values, whereas, on the other hand, he thought that only proven or refuted theories had truth values at all. He argued that his view could be interpreted as realist or as antirealist. He hedged his bets as best he could and appealed to Mach, who had stipulated that one should avoid participation in any metaphysical dispute.

In Logik der Forschung Popper solved his three initial difficulties in the following ways. First, instead of claiming that singular sentences were veridical, he said that basic statements are only provisionally accepted, provided that they were repeatable and so testable. He thereby introduced the following rule: consider only repeatable basic statements. He claimed that the provisional acceptance of basic statements does not disqualify them as refutations of theories—no longer simply universal sentences—because for the most part we can agree on which basic sentences we provisionally assume to be true. Second, he proposed the rule that one should always replace some theory which is contradicted by a basic statement by whichever new alternative has the highest degree of falsifiability. This rule should guarantee that refutations lead to progress. Reichenbach had declared that there was no logic of scientific method, that is, no proof or refutation. The basis for his claim that there could be no refutation was that any theory could be protected from a putative refutation with some ad hoc maneuver. Popper responded to Reichenbach with his Logik der Forschung (Logic of Research) and by introducing methodology into his deliberations. The methodological rule enabled him to avoid ad hoc protection of theories and thus enabled him to show how theories could be refuted. Third, he introduced the rule: only refutable theories—the term “fiction” no longer appears in his work—are scientific and may be deemed scientific.

This view was no longer justificationist, that is, it no longer claimed properly to assign truth values to sentences. All “assignments” are conjectural. But Popper had at that point no non-justificationist theory of rationality in general; his theory applied to science alone. He did not at that point notice problems which his theory raised for the broader framework of rationality which all philosophers of science had used since antiquity, the framework that identified the rational with the proven.

The conflict between Popper’s new theory of science and his older theory that only proven or refuted sentences can take truth values was removed by Tarski. Tarski’s definition of truth, as Tarski explained to Popper, allows for non-proven but still true sentences. Tarski thereby did away with the theory of truth that had given Popper so much trouble. Tarski did not necessarily offer Popper an adequate theory of truth for his philosophy of science. But Tarski did free him from a false theory which was a great impediment to the construction of a truly fallibilist, realist theory of science. Popper never clearly explained the importance that Tarski had for him at the time. This failure to explain how the logic of his problem changed as a result of Tarski’s theory was part of his repression of the fact that he had held a justificationist theory of truth for a long time, even after he began writing a fallibilist book. After his meeting with Tarski, he was free to develop his fallibilist theory of science in new ways, because he could claim that theories could be true even though there was no proof of them. During his earlier years in London, during 1946-1965 or so, he returned to the possibilities this fact opened up.

In Logik der Forschung Popper developed a theory of the growth of scientific knowledge without justification. But he had no general theory of rationality without justification. Indeed, he still limited rationality to science and methodology. However, at least three problems arose for this limited view of rationality.

Popper maintained at that point that scientists gain knowledge not by proofs but by refutations of good conjectures and by replacing them with new and better ones. These new conjectures avoid earlier mistakes, explain more, and invite new tests. He originally thought of this theory as eo ipso a theory of rationality: outside of science and methodology he made no allowance for rationality. He identified research, science and methodology, as the title of his book indicates.

Difficulties piled up fast. First, if rationality is limited to science, how is methodology rational? Methodology can only be rational if methodology is the empirical study of science—as Whewell said—or if non-empirical research can be rational. Popper could not view methodology as a science of science because he held that it is not merely descriptive but also prescriptive. Yet it should be rational.

The second problem arose as Popper tried to apply his methodology of the physical sciences to the social sciences. The Poverty of Historicism and The Open Society and Its Enemies defend the open society on the grounds that only open societies preserve reason, that is, criticism, and as a consequence only open societies can be civilized. But why is a choice for the open society rational? He had no answer. He merely said that the acceptance of reason was a consequence of sympathy for others. Nothing can be said to convince those to change their minds who accept the barbaric consequences of fascism or communism.

The third problem concerns metaphysics. Before he had ever developed his own philosophy of science, he had defended in his doctoral dissertation the view that metaphysical hypotheses can serve as working hypotheses in the construction of scientific theories. His discussion there merely concerned the use of physicalist metaphysics as a guide for psychological research. He said that this was fine, but one should not decide a priori that a view of psychological processes as physical is needed or even possible. Scientific research—he was not clear then what that meant—should decide this. He was later pressed, however, to decide between competing metaphysical theories with which to interpret science, even in the absence of a scientific answer. Was the world determined or not? Questions such as this raised the question as to whether one metaphysical theory can be better or worse than another and whether one could find out which one is better. He gave up his earlier view of rationality as limited to scientific research and methodology, but he still insisted that for science some metaphysical theories are merely heuristic, and no more than that.

To extend his theory that rationality consisted of scientific research and methodology alone, Popper loosened his standard of rationality. Rejecting the older standard of rationality -- proof - - as too high, he began to view the standard for science, refutability, as too high for the rationality that obtains outside science. Whereas earlier he had replaced justification with refutation, he now replaced refutation with criticism. Popper thereby created a new philosophical perspective by generalizing his theory of scientific research. The name he gave to this extension is “critical rationalism.” Popper introduced it in the introduction to his Conjectures and Refutations, where he characterized it briefly as the critical attitude. He used it also to describe views he developed earlier, in The Open Society and Its Enemies.

Could his critical rationalism apply to other fields? Could various fields also not only do without (epistemological) justification but also raise their levels of rationality with the use of critical methods? Critical rationalism became a project to employ critical methods as a substitute for epistemological justification in all areas of life.

3. Joseph Agassi and William Bartley

Outside of Popper’s own efforts to develop this project, the first two most significant endeavors were undertaken by Joseph Agassi and William Bartley. Although Agassi’s efforts began somewhat earlier than Bartley’s, their development overlaps considerably; the two were in conversation with each other for much of the time that they were working out their ideas as Popper’s students. I begin with Agassi, who developed Popper’s philosophy piecemeal and then turn to Bartley who attempted to give critical rationalism a comprehensive statement, that is, a version of it which would explain how a critical rationalist could adopt a critical stance toward any idea whatsoever, including its own claims.

Agassi began with his dissertation, in which he posed the question, How can metaphysics be used to guide scientific research without making science subordinate to it? Duhem had warned that, were science to concern itself with metaphysics, it would be subordinate to it. Encouraging scientists to engage in metaphysical debates would cause dissent and lead them away from science’s main task of constructing empirical theories.

Agassi’s project was to show how metaphysical research could facilitate empirical progress without tyrannizing science. He did this by extending Popper’s theory of the methods of scientific practice to include the critical, and thereby progressive, use of metaphysical theories to guide scientific research. On his view metaphysics need not be a mere heuristic, that is, a source of ideas, but rather a systematic guide to scientific research and a provisional standard for desirable theories. Metaphysics can be useful in advancing science by giving guidelines for the search for empirical explanations and by deepening the understanding of the world offered by science. But, he also said, it can help achieve these aims only when used critically. A critical stance toward metaphysics is possible when two or more metaphysical research programs compete with each other to construct empirically refutable theories. This, he argued, is just what happened when Faraday used his metaphysical field theory as the framework within which he constructed physical (field) theories. His competitors tried to explain the same phenomena under the Newtonian assumption that all forces act at a distance. Faraday’s theory of electro-magnetic events eventually had an enormous impact, because his metaphysics enabled him to construct better physical theories than his competitors.

Bartley developed a comprehensive version of critical rationalism. He argued that there were two problems that showed Popper’s original version was too limited. Popper encountered the first of these as he wrote The Open Society and Its Enemies where he discussed the problem: Why should one be rational? He conceded that rationality is limited, as its choice is pre-rational, a decision based on feelings. Bartley viewed Popper’s problem of the limits of the ability to argue rationally in favor of rationality as parallel to a problem he (Bartley) had earlier encountered in religious philosophy: defenders of religion claim that commitment to some religion is just as rational as commitment to rationality: each individual has to choose some starting point, and each starting point must be arbitrary. Each starting point then is just as pre-rational as the other, since each choice is beyond the limits of reason.

Bartley viewed the inability to defend rationality rationally as amounting to the inability to show the superiority of rational methods to solve problems over any other method. Bartley saw this limitation as an important defect. But in Popper’s approach to rationality as critical rather than justificatory, he found a way to overcome it. For, he argued, on the one hand, the theory of rationality as proof should itself be proven, but in fact it is not provable, whereas, on the other hand, the theory of rationality as readiness to appraise theories critically should itself be open to criticism, and this is quite possible. It is then no longer the case that the adoption of a rational approach to problems is no more rational than commitments to belief systems, such as those of some religion: the theory that rational practice means holding all theories open to criticism, may itself be held open to criticism. This also means that the use of rational methods to solve problems may be rationally defended, that is, we may use rationality to answer objections to the use of rationality.

Could this theory allow one to hold religious beliefs rationally by holding them open to criticism? Bartley never answered this question explicitly. He hinted that he did believe this was the case, and some have understood him as adopting this position. Some critical rationalists are believers and some are not. Standards here remain vague. The winner of the Popper essay prize argued that Christians were also critical rationalists, because they discussed, for example, the theological significance of their religious experiences and have developed their views at Church councils. (Elliot 2004) Agassi has pointed out that the Talmudic tradition is highly critical within certain bounds, yet cannot be said to have a high degree of rationality. If all critical discussions, even those within sects, qualify their practitioners as critical rationalists, then critical rationalism itself dissolves. To take seriously the replacement of justification with criticism, Agassi suggests, requires demarcation between effective and ineffective critical methods.

Bartley called his view “comprehensively critical rationalism” to distinguish it from Popper’s critical rationalism. It should not merely explain how one can conduct rational inquires in specific fields, but it should apply to the theory of rationality itself. Bartley added a list of critical standards one may use to evaluate ideas in any area whatsoever: a proposed idea should be a solution to an important problem, internally consistent, not refuted, and consistent with science. The first three are incorporated into virtually all critical rationalist theories. The fourth has been treated with more caution: science might also be mistaken, especially when it contains competing theories. A new metaphysical alternative may be inconsistent with established physical theory, as Faraday’s was, yet be quite important for progress.

John Watkins considered Bartley’s theory a reinforced dogmatism with a “Heads I win, tails you lose” strategy: If comprehensive critical rationalism faces no effective criticism it wins, but if it does, it thereby shows that it can meet its own standards and then again it wins. This criticism overlooks the fact that, if it faces effective criticism, it is shown to be wrong. Bartley’s standard is a necessary condition of rationality, but meeting it is no reason for clinging to an effectively criticized theory.

Bartley’s ideal of holding all ideas open to criticism has been an important part of critical rationalism. But it soon became apparent that the problems of how to develop critical rationalism were more important than demonstrating just how comprehensive it could be or of maintaining this comprehensive position. In order to see how and why this realization came about it is useful to return to Agassi.

Agassi deems the focus of Bartley’s of approach to be misplaced: it unduly emphasizes the defense of rationality as rationally defensible. Rationality does not need defense; it needs improvement, Agassi says. And we may try to improve it piecemeal. We are all rational to some degree and are all interested from time to time in using reason more effectively than we now do. We cannot help but be rational, since thinking is, like seeing, innate to some extent. No one is always rational or perfectly rational any time. Our best hope, then, is to use rationality to improve the partial and limited rationality which we all use to one degree or another. We use a bootstrap process in that we use the rational methods we now have at hand to develop better methods, whereby the methods we use may very well be corrected or even discarded.

Agassi also applied Popper’s non-justificationism to the historiography of science. Like many, Popper wanted the theory of science to describe science, but he hardly tried to apply his view to the history of science. Agassi developed a far wider picture of the history of science from Popper’s viewpoint, contrasting the traditional inductivist and conventionalist historiographies with a non-justificationist one. Inductivism distorts the history of science as it is the view of innovations as either completely right or quite useless; conventionalism distorts the history of science because it explains away radical changes. John Wettersten extended this application to the historiography of psychology, explaining how a non-justificationist approach was needed to remove peculiar distortions there.

4. Critical Rationalism in Mathematics

In Proofs and Refutations Imré Lakatos extended the range of critical rationalism into mathematics. This area is just where one would expect that it would be the most difficult to develop a theory of the growth of knowledge by criticism rather than by proof, or, as Lakatos put it, by proofs and refutations. Putative counter-examples, he illustrated historically, often refute “proofs” and thus require improvements.

Lakatos did not provide for the use of frameworks to formulate problems in mathematics, nor did he discuss the rules which mathematicians should follow in formulating and criticizing proofs. He forcefully argued against premature formalization, but he did not allow for the modern method of introducing a field axiomatically from the start. His theory of response to criticism only shows that varying ways of responding to problematical cases are available.

As a beginning this is fine. But caring for the central task of critical rationalism, that is, for the development of critical methods (in mathematics) as an alternative to the quest for justifications, requires the replacement of justificationist methods with critical ones. Is this at all possible? Answers to this question might enlighten us about the rationality of mathematical research. They might supplement and/or improve Lakatos’s portrayal of mathematical research by accounts of the ways it proceeds, and explain how decisions about the direction of research are made rationally.

Several thinkers have taken up this question; but with only one exception, they have sought to use Lakatos’s justificationist methodology of scientific research programs. The exception is Peggy Marchi who broke off her research before she had constructed any developed view. Three thinkers, however, have made attempts to take Lakatos’ methodology of research programs in a critical spirit and then apply it to the history of mathematics.

D.D. Spalt (Spalt 1981) argues that Lakatos’ methodology of research programs is inapplicable to the history of mathematics as mathematicians are more open skeptical and critical than Lakatos’ methodology describes. This confirms Lakatos’s turn away from a critical approach, but does not help us further since it does not go on to ask if a genuinely critical approach, say, to the use of research programs such as Agassi’s would help us. But Spalt also finds no mathematicians who follow any clear research program at all. He defends a view of mathematics which has great similarity to Feyerabend’s view of science: there is no methodology which can describe all mathematical research.

G. Giorello (Giorello 1981) argues that Lakatos’ theory of scientific research programs is better applicable to mathematical research than Popper’s or Kuhn’s. Teun Koetsier in turn found Giorello’s argument inadequate (Koetsier 1991 pp. 145ff.). This is not surprising, since Lakatos’ methodology of research programs is sketchy.

Koetsier was not satisfied with Giorello’s vague results nor with Spalt’s negative ones. He proposed a revision of Lakatos’ theory which would enable him to describe how mathematical research proceeds. His revised version is closer to Agassi’s theory of research programs, which, Agassi suggested, might be used to explain how mathematical problems were chosen and how mathematical research was coordinated.

Lakatos’s historical reconstructions of mathematical developments are Popperian in that they portray not only mathematical theorems and their proofs, but also their refutations, and their replacement by new ones. Koetsier criticizes this portrayal. He finds instead that the aim of mathematical research has been directed at refining mathematical theorems. The refined theorems are then by and large accepted and entered into the body of mathematical knowledge, where they then stay, subject only to further refinements. Koetsier agrees, however, that Lakatos’s theory does show how mathematicians work when solving problems within some narrowly defined areas of research. This research is fallible, he agrees, and this allows it to progress by the discovery of difficulties with previous theories which are overcome by succeeding ones.

Koetsier discusses clusters of mathematical theories that are part of identifiable research traditions. These traditions pose their own problems and are identifiable by their offerings of clusters of mathematical theorems. Each tradition, however, is not replaced by some competing one as in the case of science, where one explanation is superseded by another leading to the rejection of the former. In this respect the theories of science of Popper and/or Lakatos cannot be applied to the history of mathematics. Rather, each theory progresses in its domain and the results it produces are largely cumulative.

In order to explain how progress is made in such research traditions, Koetsier employs the suggestion made by Marchi that theorems should be taken as analogous to facts. (Marchi 1976) Whereas scientists seek to explain facts, mathematicians seek to prove theorems. Theorems are, just as facts, accepted provisionally. Instead of seeking to explain them as in science, mathematicians seek to prove them. Mathematics grows as new theorems are discovered and proved.

This theory leads back to the problem posed by Agassi and Marchi: How is research coordinated? Koetsier finds that Lakatos’s theory of mathematics describes “local” mathematical research rather well. It describes how they solve problems within some cluster of theories and/or methods. He finds various research traditions, which have been used to set problems. But, he does not explain how such traditions arise nor why they are chosen. Mathematical research is, then, coordinated by interests in particular kinds of mathematical objects and/or particular methods. But, how are these chosen? Why do they change?

Koetsier also faces the question: Which theorems should mathematicians prove and why? He notes that some are central and others that seem simply too ad hoc to bother with. But, how does one decide? He offers a list of measures by which to judge the importance of theorems. His list of methods for appraising the ad hoc nature of theorems is interesting but still rather ad hoc. (Koetsier p. 170-171)

Agassi’s theory of metaphysical research programs might have helped him here. Unlike Lakatos’ inferior and subsequent theory, Agassi’s was designed to solve the problems of “How is scientific research coordinated?” or “How do scientists choose their problems?” and “How can we explain simultaneous discoveries?” His answer is that problems in science are often chosen for their relevance to metaphysical problems. He developed at some length and in some depth the conflict between Faraday’s field theory and Newton’s atomic theory to show how problems were chosen which bore on this controversy and how the two metaphysical research programs could compete against each other.

How much of the choice of problems in the history of mathematics can be explained by Agassi’s conjecture that they are regularly chosen due to their relevance to metaphysical problems? This is still an open question. But some problems clearly were. Among them are problems concerning irrational numbers, whether numbers exist in a Platonic world, problems concerning the nature of infinitesimals or irrational numbers or the square root of minus one or the nature of transfinite numbers as well as questions concerning the possibilities of non-Euclidean geometries. A history of mathematics written from this point of view might be enlightening, if it could portray underlying metaphysical concerns as focusing mathematical research on certain kinds of problems and the development of methods to deal with them.

It should be noted that J. O. Wisdom had portrayed the development of the calculus as a response to the criticisms of Berkeley before Lakatos began his research (Wisdom 1939; 1941). His view is less radical than Lakatos’s however, since Lakatos, but not Wisdom, said that the growth of mathematical knowledge by proofs and refutations continues even after the introduction of new formal methods of logic. The formal proofs in the logical language are indeed, Lakatos says, immune from refutations, but the translations from the mathematical into the logical language are always open to question.

5. Hans Albert

In the 1960s, Hans Albert began to apply critical rationalism to social and political theory. His writings have become the standard statement of critical rationalism in the German-speaking world, if not elsewhere. He argues that any attempt at justification faces a three-pronged difficulty that is traceable to Agrippa: One alternative leads to an infinite regress as one seeks to prove one assumption but then needs to assume some new one; a second alternative lands in a circular argument as one assumes what one seeks to prove; a third alternative takes some arbitrary starting point and holds to it dogmatically. Outside of these three unacceptable moves, justificationism offers no other alternative. Since none of these three alternatives provide any justification at all, we should abandon the quest for justification. Instead we should hold all theories open to criticism, as Popper and Bartley have proposed. He takes over Agassi’s theory of research programs, but, due to his emphasis on the comprehensive nature of critical rationalism, tends to side with Bartley more than Agassi on questions of rationality. He has never, however, had any open dispute with Popper, Bartley or Agassi even though the three thinkers disagree on various significant points. He builds what he can from their points of view into his own version and avoids controversial issues among critical rationalists, while developing polemics against its detractors.

His major project is to explain how the theory of rationality proposed by Popper, Bartley and Agassi is, or can be made to be, applicable to virtually all areas of human endeavor—ethics, politics, social science, science, and so forth. He has from time to time presented this as an alternative to the so-called Frankfurt School that was especially influential in Germany in the late 60s and 70s. Its members thought themselves capable of deep analyses of society to show what went wrong in German history—why, for example, Germany was authoritarian. Members of this school berated alternatives such as Albert’s as “positivist,” by which they seemed to have meant that it did not take into account the human dimensions of imperfect institutions. Because it looked at them too narrowly from an empirical, technical perspective it passed over too quickly the unhappy consequences they have. Albert countered that the failure to separate descriptive and prescriptive questions leads to the failure of the Frankfurt School to draw a realistic picture of society and such a picture is the necessary foundation for any adequate theory of social reform, which critical rationalism by no means opposes. It attempts rather to make it realistic. The political ideas of critical rationalism as presented by Popper and by Albert were the most popular in Germany next to those of the Frankfurt School. Albert also presented critical rationalism as superior to the hermeneutic theories of Hans-Otto Apel and Hans Georg Gadamer.

Albert has dealt extensively with methodology in economics, criticizing neo-classical economics for its unrealistic assumptions about the rationality of human actions, and its presumptions that there can be a measure of the social welfare of society. But he views the tradition of neoclassical economics as the best that the social sciences have to offer. He hopes to reform it by making its psychological assumptions more realistic. Here he decidedly parts company with Popper, who is far more skeptical about the use of theories of human nature, especially psychological ones. Albert rejects what he consider to be the exaggerated assumptions of rational-choice economics, and he suggests Popper’s methodological individualism is not the same as the one that economists often use. But he has not constructed any systematic alternative.

6. Mario Bunge and Fallibilism

The researches mentioned so far grew directly out of Popper’s non-justificationist theory of science. Mario Bunge developed a non-justificationist theory of science, especially of physics, before he had ever heard of Popper, and he does not view his work a part of the project known as critical rationalism. It nevertheless can count as a version of critical rationalism: it is a non-justificationist effort to improve standards of criticism. Bunge describes the crucial event in the later development of his philosophy as the realization that frameworks—he calls them systems--were crucial for the growth of knowledge. Bunge’s “systems” differ from the “frameworks,” whose usefulness is emphasized by some critical rationalists, if they differ at all, in taking as the best critical methods and most progressive research the formal, precise wording of theories. Bunge apparently feels more affinity with those thinkers who emphasize the use of formal methods and who futilely seek justification, than with those who deny the possibility of justification and deem the use of formal methods more limited than he does. This is understandable, since he holds that the attainment of precision is crucial for rationality and, on his view precision is best obtained with formal methods, and sometimes can be obtained only in this way. As a corollary of this attitude, he proposes to respond to difficulties first with small changes that preserve systems, and move to larger ones when these prove inadequate. This is the exact opposite of what Popper said, as he advocated that one should always prefer that theory which has the highest degree of falsifiability. These thinkers, however, do not disagree about the aim of the philosophy of science, which is to improve critical standards so that the best possible theories are created and honed, but rather about the best means for doing that. In the wake of Einstein, Agassi resolves this conflict by proposing that both approaches can be used simultaneously.

7. Critical Rationalism without Frameworks of Methodological Rules

In contrast to critical rationalists who emphasize the need for both theoretical frameworks and methodological rules, there are also critical rationalists who dispense with both. Jagdish Hattiangadi, Gunnar Andersson and David Miller are examples. Hattiangadi says that all problems are contradictions encountered in attempts to master everyday problems of survival. Theoretical frameworks play no role in the formulation of problems, though traditions apparently do. It is hard to see the difference. One of the difficulties that his view encounters is that it makes it impossible to define problems well. For, the problem posed by the assumptions {p, ~p, a, b, c} turns out to be the same as the problem posed by the assumptions {p, ~p, x, y, z}. Another difficulty the theory faces is that it should, but does not, present a contradiction to earlier versions of critical rationalism that it allegedly improves upon. Moreover, some problems are due to gaps in our knowledge that are not contradictions. Formulations of good problems thus require frameworks that include some selection rules.

Posing problems of knowledge in terms of the identification of methodological rules for gaining knowledge was the crucial breakthrough that enabled Popper to move beyond his early Die beiden Grundprobleme. When one dispenses with them, one has an ad hoc approach to critical methods. They grow of themselves, Hattiangadi suggests, as attempts to solve practical problems. No other special critical activity is needed or useful. He explains the growth of critical methods as part of the struggle for survival: those who use the best methods to solve practical problems survive and reproduce themselves best. This view runs the danger of relapsing into Hegelianism, since it judges as best any intellectual development which is successful. Should fundamentalist Hinduism or Islam or Christianity (or all of them together) win the day, will they then be the best expression of rationality?

Gunnar Andersson views Popper’s introduction of methodological rules as quite unnecessary: all contradictions between theories and observations pose problems and all responses to them should be prima facie acceptable. He takes off the table the most crucial aspect of the project of critical rationalism: how can we best improve our critical methods and our capacity to learn from mistakes? Even without any appeal to an evolutionary process such as that used by Hattiangadi, Andersson assumes that science will do just fine without critical studies of its methods. He does not discuss his optimism or the fears of those who do not share it. He says virtually nothing about non-scientific inquiry and rational action.

David Miller’s critical rationalism is the third example of attempts to characterize rationality without explaining how the use of theoretical frameworks or methodological rules furthers it or hinders it. He concentrates on improving criticism of the logic of justification; he ignores Popper’s crucial move from the mere portrayal of the logic of research to the formulation of methodological rules. He agrees that science is better off because it handles theories critically, but does not bother with the details. He ignores the question: How is the use that science makes of criticism distinct, if at all, from other uses of it? However, he apparently sides with Bartley’s comprehensively critical rationalism. He has effectively bolstered Popper’s arguments against attempts to use induction to establish any degree of probability of any theory and effectively criticized Popper’s theory of verisimilitude. Having concluded that there is no evidence which can increase the probability that a theory is true, he concludes that there can be no good reasons whatsoever for any theory or any course of action. All we can ask, he suggests, is: Why not? We only have reasons for the rejection of theories, never for their endorsement.

But it does not follow from his correct observation that we can have no evidence which increases the probability that a theory is true, that there are no good reasons to consider any theory true. Miller suggests that in the interest of truth we should not make fanciful claims. But he says nothing about reasons for preferring, say, highly explanatory theories over less explanatory ones, or ones that solve problems better than others, or that we can improve our methods of elimination of theories beyond the mere random quest for contradictions. On a commonsense understanding of good reasons, all these possibilities may constitute good reasons for preferring some theories over others, even if they do not increase the probability that any theory is true.

On Miller’s view it seems a person can declare true any unrefuted theory, say a minimal astrological theory, or Descartes’ theory that souls have no extension, without violating any rationalist precept. He does not offer any selection procedure. He relies entirely on the interest in the truth, which, he claims, prevents arbitrariness. This is hardly enough: arbitrariness is not obvious. He rejects the possibility of taking advantage of our ability to assign truth values as we fancy, as it is frivolous; he does not tell us how to spot the frivolous. Talmudists and scholastics certainly have an interest in truth, are hardly frivolous, and use arguments extensively, yet they are hardly rational in any way comparable to the rationality of scientists. Popper’s mature philosophy began as he specified rules that should prevent frivolity. He saw the need for methodological rules to make criticism effective.

Some critics say Miller’s version of critical rationalism seems to have lost its way. By limiting himself so severely to logical analysis and neglecting the methodological aspects of rationality, Miller gives his philosophy a characteristic typical of positivism; by limiting his considerations to logic, he suggests that almost anything goes.

Theoretical frameworks are needed to direct rational thought and conduct, and methodological rules are needed to improve criticism and to maintain critical standards. Popper took over from the psychology of Otto Selz the idea that rational thought is directed because it is problem-oriented: without problems to direct thought it becomes a random process. And without frameworks we cannot formulate and choose problems well.

Miller can defend his view by explaining that he, too, recommends procedures to select theories to consider true. This takes us back to the problems of social standards of rationality, of problem-solving, of desiderata and of methods of critique which other critical rationalists are engaged in solving. About all this he remains silent. Yet his view that there are no good reasons for considering some statements true seems to render these redundant. If they are redundant, he should explain how we can do without them; if not, he is saying what most critical rationalists agree about.

8. Critical Rationalism, Truth and Best Theories

Alan Musgrave, Volker Gadenne and John Watkins all came out of Popper’s circle. But Musgrave and Gadenne nevertheless focus on the search for some assurance that the theories they trust really are trustworthy; Watkins wants some empirical standard to determine which theory is now the best. Their peculiarity is that they seek methods of selecting credible theories or the best theories, while recognizing the validity of the criticisms of methods of justification launched by critical rationalists.

Musgrave endorses Popper’s arguments that show the impossibility of sensible assignments to theories of some measure of probability. But he finds wanting Popper’s way of avoiding skepticism, because Popper fails to offer reasons for beliefs. Only if it does that can Popper respond to the charge that his view is too skeptical. Musgrave regards his effort, then, as a vital defense of critical rationalism. In order to provide the needed defense, he seeks a standard for reasonable belief. He says that Popper has such a solution: we should believe that that theory which has best withstood criticism is true. He adds that Popper should have said so more clearly.

Skepticism is the theory that no theory is any better than any other. Critical rationalism offers tentative rules for the choice of theories to examine, not to believe in. Musgrave endorses Popper’s criticism of all attempts to specify the probability of any theory being true. He considers his position fallibilist and critical rationalist, because he accepts evidence to justify belief in a theory only if the evidence results from attempts to refute it. And, he claims, no evidence justifies claims that a theory is true, but only belief in a theory. Belief in a theory that has withstood criticism is justified, then, but not the claim that it is true. It is not clear why Musgrave suggests that the task of justifying beliefs is less insoluble and less superfluous than that of justifying theories.

Volker Gadenne resembles Musgrave somewhat. He agrees with Popper that theoretical science may very well do without evidence for belief, but he disagrees with him about actions: these require decisions as to which hypothesis is best. He suggests, then, that confirmed theories are preferable as a pragmatic ground for belief. Unlike Musgrave, he realizes that Popper’s theory of corroboration cannot serve this purpose, as it allots the least probable theories, the ones that take the most risks, the highest degree of corroboration. But acting on them is still most risky. He therefore has a different theory of corroboration. He separates content from degree of corroboration in order to justify choosing the most highly corroborated theories to guide actions.

Admittedly we do need standards to limit the risk of the application of theories, as Agassi has pointed out. As a matter of principle, Agassi notes, we may demand that theories be tested in severe ways in order to reduce risk. But this procedure is not designed to increase belief or confidence in hypotheses or likelihood of theories. (It is not clear what Gadenne claims for corroboration.) For example, two theories might be equally applicable to some practical situation, one of which may by more risky, because it has more consequences than its competitor. We may still prefer it as a basis for action, even though we have, according to Gadenne’s theory, more reason to believe the weaker theory. The stronger theory may enable us to do more. We have, for example, introduced nuclear energy even though we have far less reason, on Gadenne’s standards for belief, to believe that using nuclear power is less risky than using coal. We use gene-technology for various purposes, even though Gadenne’s theory of belief offers reasons to refrain from using it. We thus have standards for application of theories in technology and other areas of life which are quite independent of belief, thus apparently refuting Gadenne’s theory.

Gadenne might respond by contending that the belief in question is not belief in a theory but belief in the success of its application. So, before applying it, we try to increase our belief that the application will succeed. But this is also not the case. We seek to anticipate problems and to test, as well as we can, whether some given application will lead to success or not. We try to apply risky theories because they promise more. When we know we are taking considerable risks, we anticipate them as best we can, and prepare to change course quickly. When we do not anticipate risks, but hope for great success, we simply act to test our hopes. The realization that these always may be frustrated may lead to total paralysis on the basis of Gadenne’s theory of the need for corroboration as a means of choice of theories that enable us to act. Planning to solve our problems and realize our hopes employs theories with explanatory power. It also takes into account criticism of possible courses of action, and requires decisions. Belief or reassurance or corroboration are not required. Gadenne’s theory, just like Musgrave’s, leads us back to numerous insoluble and superfluous problems in the search for justification: How much corroboration must we seek before we act?

Judges must justify the sentences they impose on criminals. Proposals to take risks with the environment or to defend it should be justified too─on a case by case basis. Social standards have to be sufficiently agreed upon to allow for a consensus. On the core doctrine of critical rationalism, such standards cannot have epistemological justification; they are based on conjectures as to how we can avoid mistakes, and when there are different candidates, they are all subject to criticism. More cannot be done, and so all decisions are unjustified and so they all incur risks.

John Watkins intended his theory to go beyond Popper’s suggestion that we should choose the theory that has the highest degree of explanatory power. He wished to explain why the theory corroborated to the highest degree is the best now available. But it is hard to see why one theory has to be identified as the best. It is often the case that one theory will be better in one respect and another in some other respect. Such a situation poses problems for both theories. It is reasonable to attempt to solve problems facing each theory quite independently of which theory is now the best on available evidence—if indeed, such a judgment can be made in any sensible way. The attempt to reduce all the good qualities to one quality which is fundamental or the most important is quixotic, as Popper’s failed attempt to reduce all good qualities of theory to high degree of testability illustrates. (In the development of his theory of metaphysical research programs Agassi first pointed out that explanatory power can vary independently from testability.) The refined theory of corroboration which Watkins offers is quite irrelevant to practice, where what counts is adequacy for the task at hand and not some abstract measure of current success. Also, in practice we do not want to know which theory is the best, but how various serious alternatives may be improved. Furthermore, there is no point in trying to say which theory is the best at any given time with such a difficult procedure as Watkins has offered: before we have determined which of two alternatives is the best, both alternatives will very likely have been modified and we will have to start all over again.

Theories should have good qualities before we set about criticizing them, if we are not to waste our time in a random search. These good qualities are methodological: What does the theory explain? What problems does it solve? How can it be criticized? They are not epistemological: What evidence do we have for its truth? How can we be reassured we are on the right track? How do we know it corresponds to what the truth is like? Watkins views himself as a critical rationalist even though he stresses corroboration, because he does not relate corroboration to appraisals of the truth or probability of theories, but rather to other good qualities of theories. But he changes the project of critical rationalism from substituting methods of criticism for methods of justification to the quixotic project of determining which theory is best at any given time on the basis of its corroboration.

9. Critical Rationalist Sociology of Science

A crucial feature of critical rationalism is the theory that social norms determine the degree of rationality which individuals are able to exercise. This is a direct outgrowth of Popper’s use of methodological rules to explain the growth of science. Because science is a social activity, Popper argued, Robinson Crusoe could not do science. One individual, he suggested, cannot both put forth and criticize theories adequately. Rationality comes from cooperation. To be effective in bringing about the growth of knowledge, criticism should follow social rules.

This feature of critical rationalism has led to a critical rationalist sociology of science and technology. The task of this sociology is the appraisal of the rules of science and technology. Do they encourage or hinder the formulation and circulation of bold conjectures and their effective critical appraisal? This effort began with Agassi’s criticisms of Popper’s rule to always prefer the theory with the highest degree of testability: Sometimes a testable theory has a higher explanatory power than some competitor, he argued, but also has a lower degree of testability than this competitor. We may, then, prefer it. The same holds for Popper’s rule that all basic statements used in science should be repeatable: an independently testable explanation of a basic statement is sufficient. From these studies he moved on to inquiries into science as an open society. Even in the face of the traditional association of science with openness of debate and discussion, a variety of modern thinkers such as Michael Polanyi and Thomas Kuhn have opposed this view.

John Wettersten has continued critical rationalist studies in the sociology of science with examinations of how adventurous and conservative styles of research complement and compete with each other, how stylistic standards can hinder research, how a problem-oriented approach may improve standards in science and technology, and how critical rationalism may be used to guide sociological research. Wettersten has developed critical studies of alternative approaches to the sociology of science: a critical rationalist approach aims at minimizing the idealization of science, but without explaining scientific knowledge away.

I.C. Jarvie has recently studied how and when Popper added a theory of the institutions of science to his theory of the logic of science (Jarvie 2001) . In The Open Society and Its Enemies Popper explicitly added a social dimension to his view of science which was only implicit in Logik der Forschung. Popper did not, however, move on to sociological studies of science. He was so concerned not to explain away scientific knowledge as a mere social phenomena that he did not engage in the social studies of science even though his view called for such studies. He did not see that the effort to minimize idealized versions of science by describing how science encourages and hinders research poses no temptation to explain away scientific knowledge.

10. Philosophical Anthropology and Critical Rationality

As rationality is never perfect, and as idealization is to be minimized, Jarvie and Agassi tried to solve a number of central issues in the social sciences under the assumption that rationality is a matter of degree. This invites a new philosophical anthropology. In order to understand human nature it is desirable to desist from seeking all-or-nothing theories of humanity as, for example, a mere machine or of rationality as perfect. Human rationality cannot be understood apart from its mechanical or biological or social or rational aspects; human mechanism and biology and society cannot be understood apart from their rational aspects.

11. Critical Rationalism and Political Society

In addition to being a study of the methodology of the social sciences Popper’s The Open Society and Its Enemies is a political manifesto. It sets minimal conditions for democratic politics: it must avoid utopian social engineering. The exclusive use of piecemeal social engineering requires that societies be open and that critical appraisal of government policies be carried out. Governments must set abstract conditions for how a society functions, but they should leave individuals free to act as they choose. This freedom includes the right of individuals to build their own social groups.

John Watkins and Bryan Magee have added significant observations about Popper’s contribution. Watkins pointed out that Popper’s theory offered a basis for a pluralistic society which traditional theories of rationality cannot: justificationist theories allow only one view to be justified given the evidence at any time, whereas critical rationalism allows for a range of defensible theories which may democratically compete in the political arena. Magee (1995) has argued that Popper’s philosophy offered a good antidote for those who would reject existing society as no good on the basis of utopian standards and demand radical reform. It explained why all societies have grave defects, that they could be corrected to some degree piecemeal, but that no radical change of society had any hope of making the situation any better.

Popper’s abstract demarcation of closed and open societies does not touch most political controversies today, which concern disagreements among defenders of the open society. As a consequence, critical rationalists such as Jeremy Shearmur and Gerard Radnitzky have attempted to pull Popper’s theory toward Hayek and laissez-faire economics, whereas others, such Malachi Hacohen, Agassi and Helmut Schmidt have found in his theory a framework for theories of active social reform. Popper said very little about competing democratic forms of government and what he has said is not necessarily connected to his philosophical deliberations in any obvious way.

Popper’s observation that reform has unintended and unknown consequences which may then require further adjustments or backtracking has been read as a support for Hayek’s demand that all government should be severely limited. Popper’s observation that no society is perfect and his demand that social reform should eliminate some of its worst aspects have been read as support of a moderate socialism.

12. Popper and Education Theory

Popper began his research as a student of the Pedagogical Institute of the University of Vienna. Members of the Würzburg School such as Karl Bühler and Otto Selz were closely associated with the school reform movement led by Eduard Burger. Selz explained how learning could be improved when it centred on active problem solving. Popper adopted his view and argued that the memorization of important material by repetition would be replaced with a Selzian, problem-orientated approach. Wettersten has explained this as a beginning of integrated psychology and pedagogy that Popper has further developed by adding to it his methodological insights. Other critical rationalists followed this lead stressing the import of active problem solving, and adding the formation of conjectures and exercises in criticism and improvement of them. Also, emphasizing Popper’s insight that science only makes advances in social settings, they have added the demand not to ignore the fact that learning involves social interaction, whereby autonomy, as the needed prerequisite for critical thinking, is also deemed a prime goal of any good pedagogy.

13. Conclusion

The salient points of critical rationalism open new possibilities in ethics, which until now has been merely couched in terms of the need to be critical and open. A problem-oriented ethics may replace traditional rule and consequence oriented ones. The use of critical standards of debate to appraise the history of philosophy opens up new perspectives as illustrated in the work of Curtis on Darwin’s reception (Curtis 1987) and Wettersten’s study of the reception to Whewell. It offers new paths for the study of related fields such as economics, where Kurt Klappholz and Lawrence Boland have led the way, for the study of methods and historiography of psychology as mentioned, and the possibility of a new theory of institutions as structures which individuals use to solve problems and appraise alternatives.

Various efforts such as these are still too fresh to be appraised and various defenders of critical rationalism differ on crucial issues. Just what, if any, its long-term impact will be is still quite open; debates among its exponents and between them and opponents are still on-going. The crucial issue is whether and to what degree methods of criticism can be substituted for epistemological methods of justification in all areas of life. This is the way we can face the stimulating criticism of Russell, who viewed critical rationalism as defeatist. Only the exhibition of bold, fruitful thinking may answer it. There is ongoing research to develop a critical theory of the history of philosophy, of the sociology of science, of political philosophy, of ethical theory, and of social and political institutions. If critical rationalism is merely a theory of weak justification as Musgrave, Gadenne and Watkins would have it, or if it ignores problems of the direction of research and intellectual standards as perhaps Hattiangadi, Andersson and Miller do, then it may deservedly be forgotten.

14. References and Further Reading

The literature on critical rationalism is enormous. Manfred Lubbe in his Karl R. Popper, Bibliographie 1925-2004 lists over four thousand publications on Popper. And his list omits many publications. The following bibliography is slanted to give background to the above portrayal of critical rationalism, on the one hand, and to contain a sampling of some of the most important literature, on the other. It is unavoidable that some publications which might not be so very important are listed as background, while others which may be of some significance are omitted in order to keep the list relatively short.

  • Agassi, Joseph, Towards an Historiography of Science, History and Theory, Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Beiheft 2, (1963).
  • Agassi, Joseph, Science in Flux (Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publ. Co., 1975).
  • Agassi, Joseph , Towards a Rational Philosophical Anthropology (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1977).
  • Agassi, Joseph, Science and Society (Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publ. Co., 1981).
  • Agassi, Joseph, Technology: Philosophical and Social Aspects (Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publ. Co., 1985).
  • Agassi, Joseph, A Philosopher’s Apprentice: In Karl Popper’s Workshop (Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi, 1993).
  • Agassi, Joseph and Jarvie, I.C. (eds) Rationality: The Critical View (Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 1987).
  • Albert, Hans, Traktat über kritscher Vernunft (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck Verlag, 1968).
  • Albert, Hans, Plädoyer für kritischen Rationalismus (München: Piper Verlag, 1971).
  • Albert, Hans, Konstruktion und Kritik (Hoffmann und Campe Verlag, 1972).
  • Albert, Hans, Traktat über rationale Praxis (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck Verlag, 1978).
  • Albert, Hans, Kritischer Vernunft und menschlicher Praxis (Stuttgart: Philipp Verlag jun. Verlag, 1984).
  • Albert, Hans, Treatise on Critical Reason (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985).
  • Albert, Hans, Marktsoziologie und Entscheidungslogik (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck Verlag, 1998).
  • Bartley, William Bartley, The Retreat to Commitment (London: Chatto and Windus, 1964).
  • Berkson, William and Wettersten, John, Lernen aus dem Irrtum, Forward by Hans Albert (Hamburg: Hoffmann und Campe Verlag, l982).
  • Berkson, William and Wettersten, John, Learning from Error, English edition of Berkson and Wettersten l982 (La Salle: Open Court Publishing Co., l984).
  • Boland, Lawrence A, The Foundations of Economic Method (London: George Allen & Unwin, 1982).
  • Bunge, Mario (ed.) The Critical Approach to Science and Philosophy (Glencoe: The Free Press, 1964).
  • Bunge, Mario, “Instant Autobiography”, Studies on Mario Bunge’s Treatise, eds. Paul Weigartner and Georg J.W. Dorn, Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi, 1990, 677-684
  • Curtis, Ron, Darwin as an Epistemologist. Annals of Science 44, 379-408.
  • Elliot, Benjamin, Falsifiable Statements in Theology: Karl Popper and Christian Thought, Karl Popper Essay Prize, 2004.
  • Gadenne, Volker, ed. Kritischer Rationalismus und Pragmatismus, Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi, 1998.
  • Fried, Yehuda, and Agassi, Joseph, Paranoia: A Study in Diagnosis (Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publ. Co., 1976).
  • Hattiangadi, Jagdish, “Methodology without methodological rules,” in: R.S. Cohen and M.W. Wartofsky (eds), Language logic and method, Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science (Dordrecht: Kluwer 1982), pp. 103-51.
  • Jarvie, I.C., The Revolution in Anthropology (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1964).
  • Jarvie, I.C., The Republic of Science (Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi, 2001)
  • Jarvie, I.C. and Laor, Nathaniel (eds), Metaphysics and Science (Dordrecht, Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1994).
  • Jarvie, I.C. and Laor, Critical Rationalism, the Social Sciences and the Humanities (Dordrecht, Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1994).
  • Klappholtz, Kurt and Joseph Agassi, ‘Methodological Prescriptions in Economics’, Economica (Feb. 9, 1959): 60-74.
  • Koetsier, Teun, Lakatos’ Philosophy of Mathematics: An Historical Approach (Amsterdam: North Holland, 1991).
  • Lubbe, Manfred, (ed.) Karl R. Popper, Bibliographie 1925-2004 (Frankfurt: Peter Lang, 2005).
  • Lakatos, Imré, Proofs and Refutations: The Logic of Mathematical Discovery, John Worral and Elie Zahar (eds) (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1976).
  • Magee, Bryan, "What Use Is Popper to a Politician," in Anthony O’Hear (Ed.), Karl Popper: Philosophy and Problems (Cambridge: Cambridge Universty Press 1995), pp. 259-273. Reprinted in Ian C. Jarvie and Sandra Pralong (eds), Popper’s Open Society after Fifty Years: The Continuing Relevance of Karl Popper (London: Routledge 1998), pp. 146-158.
  • Marchi, Peggy, “Mathematics as a Critical Enterprise” in R.S. Cohen, P.K. Feyerabend and M.W. Waratofsky (eds), Essays in Memory of Imré Lakatos (Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publ. Co. 1976) pp. 379-394.
  • Miller, David, Critical Rationalism (LaSalle: Open Court, 1994).
  • Musgrave, Alan, Common Sense, Science and Skepticism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993).
  • Popper, Karl, „Ein Kriterium des empirischen Charakters theoretischer Systeme,“ Erkenntnis 1 (1932-33), 426-27.
  • Popper, Karl, Logik der Forschung, Siebente Auflage (Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr(Paul Siebeck), 1982).
  • Popper, Karl, The Logic of Scientific Discovery (London: Hutchinson & Co., 1962).
  • Popper, Karl, The Poverty of Historicism (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1960).
  • Popper, Karl, Objective Knowledge (Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1972).
  • Popper, Karl, Conjectures and Refutations (New York: Basic Books, 1963, 1965).
  • Popper, Karl, Die beiden Grundprobleme der Erkenntnistheorie (Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr(Paul Siebeck), 1979).
  • Popper, Karl, The Open Society and Its Enemies, Fourth Edition (New York: Harper & Row, 1962).
  • Popper, Karl, “The Rationality Principle,” in: David Miller (ed.) Popper Selections (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985), pp. 357ff.
  • Popper, Karl, Gesammelte Werke. Band 1: Frühe Schriften. Hrsg. v. Troels E. Hansen. (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 2006.)
  • Reichenbach, Hans, Erkenntnis, 1 (192-33), 426-7.
  • Selz, Otto, Über die Gesetze des geordneten Denkversaufs, eine experimentelle Untersuchung. Erste Teil (Stuttgart: Spemann, 1913).
  • Selz, Otto, Über die Gesetze des geordneten Denkverlaufs, Zweiter Teil, Zur Psychologie des produktiven Denkens und des Irrtums. Eine experimentelle Untersuchung, (Bonn: Cohen, 1922).
  • Shearmur, Jeremy, Hayek and After, Hayekian liberalism as a research program (London: Routledge, 1996).
  • Spalt, Detlef D., Vom Mythos der mathematischen Vernunft (Darmstadt: wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1981)
  • Watkins, J. W. N., Science and Skepticism (London: Hutschison; Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Watkins, J. W. N., “Imperfect Rationality” in R. Borger and F. Cioffi (eds) Explanation in the Behavioral Sciences (Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1970), pp. 167-217.
  • Wisdom, J.O., “The Analyst Controversy: Berkeley’s influence on the development of mathematics,” Hermathema 54, (1939): 3-29.
  • Wisdom, J.O., “The Compensation of Errors in the Methods of Fluxions,” Hermathema 57 (1941): 3-29.
  • Wettersten, John, “The Place of Bunge” in Joseph Agassi and Robert S. Cohen (Eds) Scientific Philosophy Today (Dordrecht, Boston, London: D. Reidel, l982a) pp. 465-86.
  • Wettersten, John, The Roots of Critical Rationalism, Schriftenreihe zur Philosophie Karl R. Poppers und des kritischen Rationalismus, Kurt Salamun (Ed.) (Amsterdam und Atlanta: Rodopi, 1992a).
  • Wettersten, John, ‘The Sociology of Scientific Establishments Today’, British Journal of Sociology, 44, 1 (1993): 68-102.
  • Wettersten, John, "Braucht die Wissenschaft methodologische Regeln?" Conceptus, Wettersten, John “After Popper,” Review-essay of David Miller, Critical Rationalism and Alan Musgrave, Common Sense, Science and Skepticism, Philosophy of the Social Sciences, 26, 1 (1996b): 92-112.
  • Wettersten, John, "Eine aktuelle Aufgabe für den kritischen Rationalismus und die Soziologie," in Hans-Jürgen Wendel und Volker Gadenne (eds) Kritik und Rationalität (Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr(Paul Siebeck) 1996c), pp. 183-212.
  • Wettersten, John, "The Critical Rationalists’ Quest for an Effective Liberal Pedagogy," in Gerhard Zecha, Critical Rationalism and Educational Discourse (Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi:, 1999a), pp. 93-115.
  • Wettersten, John, "Popper’s Historical Role: Innovative Dissident," Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie, Vol. 36, No. 1, Jan. 2005, 119-133.
  • Wettersten, John, "New Insights on Young Popper," Journal for The History of Ideas, (Oct. 2005); pp. 603-631.
  • Wettersten, John, How Do Institutions Steer Events? An Inquiry into the Limits and Possibilities of Rational Thought and Action (Aldershot: Ashgate Publ. Co., 2006)
  • Zecha, Gerhard, ed., Critical Rationalism and Educational Discourse (Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi, 1999).

Author Information

John R. Wettersten
Email: wettersten@t-online.de
Mannheim Universit
Germany