Cumberland’s best known work is De Legibus Naturae (1672), the title-page of profess to “consider and refute… the elements of Mr. Hobbes’s Philosophy, as well Moral as Civil.” It puts forward a doctrine of morality which is based on the law of nature, and this is accompanied by a running criticism of Hobbes’s views. Cumberland looks upon the law of nature as capable of being inferred from observation of physical and mental phenomena (themselves due to the will of God), and at the same time as pointing out the “action of a rational agent which will chiefly promote the common good.”
He attacks the neo-Platonists, and the theory of innate ideas as a Platonic error:
The Platonists, indeed, clear up this Difficulty in an easier manner, by the Supposition of innate ideas, as well of the Laws of Nature themselves, as of those Matters about which they are conservant; but, truly, I have not been so happy as to learn the Laws of Nature in so short a way. Nor seems it to me well advised, to build the Doctrine of natural Religion and Morality upon an Hypothesis, which has been by the generality of Philosophers as well Heathen as Christian, and can never be proved against the Epicureans, with whom is our chief controversy. [Introduction, Sect. 5]
Laws of Nature, in this ethical reference, are defined by him as “propositions of unchangeable Truth, which direct our voluntary Actions about choosing Good and Evil; and impose an Obligation to external actions even without civil Laws, and laying aside all Considerations of those compacts which constitute civil government” (Ch. 1, p. 39).
He defines “Good” as “that which preserves, or enlarges and perfects, the Faculties of any one thing, or of several” (Ch. 2, p. 165). It follows that the Law of Nature prescribes those actions which “will chiefly promote the common Good, and by which only the entire Happiness of particular Persons can be obtained” (Ch. 5, p. 189). He also includes both happiness and perfection, or development of faculty, as inseparable elements in the Good. He is particularly concerned with the determination of the form of conduct which will lead to the attainment of this end; and his conclusion is that the best method of securing it is that of benevolence, or regard for the common good, as opposed to selfish preoccupation with our own individual interests. “The greatest Benevolence of every rational Agent towards all, forms the happiness state of every, and of all the Benevolent, as far as is in their Power; and is necessarily requisite to the happiest State which they can attain, and therefore the common Good is the supreme Law” (Ch. 1). This endeavor to promote the common good “includes our Love of God, and of all Mankind, who are the Parts of this System. God, indeed, is the principal Part; Men the subordinate: A benevolence toward both includes Piety and Humanity, that is, both Tables of the Law of Nature” (Introduction, Sect. 15, p. 20).
He repeatedly points out that the common good includes our own, as one of its parts; but it must be sought only as a part, in subordination to the whole. Cumberland’s confidence in the perfect coincidence of virtue, or benevolence, and individual happiness ultimately depends upon his doctrine of the divine sanctions of the Laws of Nature. But his main interest in the ethical question is to insist, against Hobbes, upon the “naturalness” of the law of benevolence and the inherent unreasonableness of separating the individual and his good from the system of rational beings of which he is in reality only a part, and with whose good his own is inseparably bound up. Thus, he thinks that the “rules of life” are as plain as the “art of numbering,” and the following propositions are laid down as necessarily true: (1) “that the good of all rational beings is greater than the like good of any part of that aggregate body, that is, that it is truly the greatest good”; (2) “that in promoting the good of this whole aggregate, the good of individuals is contained and promoted”; and (3) “that the good of every particular part requires the introducing and settling of distinct property in such things, and such services of rational agents, as contribute to the common happiness.”
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Last updated: April 12, 2001 | Originally published: