Cited as one of the most pressing issues of our times, health care worker migration is now occurring at unprecedented rates. In the post-colonial era, as many developing countries began to develop and expand their health services and to educate their citizens to staff them, more educated workers left for wealthier countries, often those of the colonists or ones that shared the colonists’ language and other cultural ties.
Health worker migration has seen more than one phase, and taken on many forms. The transnational flow, however—especially from low and middle-income countries to wealthier ones—has never been higher. Of particular concern is asymmetrical migration – the main focus of this article – because it is skewing the distribution of the global health workforce and contributing to severe shortages in some parts of the world. There are also concerns about health worker distribution between urban and rural areas, between the public and private health care sectors, and among fields of specialization, but these will not be discussed here. Because many so-called “source countries” have higher burdens of disease and suffer from lower health care worker-to-population ratios than do destination countries, asymmetrical migration is deepening health inequities and creating what many have described as a global crisis in health.
This article begins by identifying a range of factors that contribute to the movement of health care workers around the globe, specifically from low and middle-income countries to affluent ones. From there it explores ethical issues that arise concerning the deepening of global health inequalities; the status and treatment of migrant health workers, the implications for their families and communities; and the structure of human health resource planning. There is further consideration of the range of agents who might be said to have responsibilities to address these concerns, and what could be said to ground them. Noted are key efforts made to date as well as ideas for further reform.
Although this article refers to both migrants and emigrants, it is primarily emigrants – those who leave one country and take up residence in another – who are the main concern here. Additionally, the focus will be on nurses and care workers, such as nurse aides and home care aides. These health care workers tend to receive less attention than physicians, yet comprise a substantial share of migrant health care labor, in large part to meet the growing demands and expectations for affordable, quality long-term care services in high income countries. Moreover, the loss of nurses and other care workers is especially troubling for they tend to be the backbone of primary care in developing countries. This focus also highlights important issues concerning gender equity.
Neo-liberal economic policies may be the greatest contributor to the contemporary movement of health care workers from low and middle to high-income countries. International financial institutions, chiefly the World Bank and International Monetary Fund (IMF), have aimed at making these countries more competitive players in the global marketplace. Their main tools, structural adjustment policies, have in many places led to reductions in health sector (and other) employment. Many people have thus been motivated to seek work in richer nations. Some countries, such as the Philippines and India, have also taken to recruiting and training their own citizens specifically for care work overseas (Yeates 2009). Intent on gaining a share of their remittances, this strategy has become an integral part of their economic development plans.
When asked why they migrate, Philippine-trained nurses, the largest group working abroad, give responses that reflect these background conditions (ILO 2006; Lorenzo, Galvez-Tan, Icamina et al., et al. 2007; Alonso-Garbayo and Maben 2009). They point to high and growing rates of unemployment and feelings of being “underutilized”, even when employed, because their skills often surpass what they can do for patients given the scarcity of available resources. At the same time, many are “overutilized” where staffing is short. These emigrant nurses identify desires for lower nurse to patient ratios, better working hours, higher salaries, and better opportunities for professional development and their families’ well-being. Some also describe familial pressure: given economic conditions and policies at home, working abroad has come increasingly to be seen as an expected strategy for family survival, even a woman’s duty (Kelly and D’Addario 2008; Nowak 2009). Certain forms of nationalist rhetoric, which I discuss below, may contribute to the pressures brought to bear.
Even though the current rates of migration are unprecedented, in no small part due to global economic policy, nurses and other health care workers in many major source countries have long been primed for emigration. Missionary and military involvement in the Philippines, along with targeted foreign policy strategies, began fueling the mobility of Filipino nurses over a century ago (Choy 2003). As part of a broad effort to serve American colonists and military personnel stationed there with “modern” medicine, the Baptist Foreign Mission Society established the first nursing school in the country – the Iloilo Mission Hospital School of Nursing – in 1906. Many nurses were sent to the US for additional training, sponsored by groups like Rockefeller, Daughters of the American Revolution, and the Catholic Scholarship Fund. By the 1920s, efforts were well underway to export “American professionalism, standardization, and efficiency” in nursing education and practice – lauded as “rational, scientific, and universalistic” – to the Philippines (Brush 1995, 552). Later, in the wake of World War II, in collaboration with the International Council of Nurses, Rockefeller introduced the Exchange Visitor Program to offer experience in American hospitals for nurses trained abroad, including those from the Philippines. By the mid-1960s, most were moving to jobs in US hospitals.
Since these early days, the numbers leaving have grown exponentially (Cheng 2009). The contemporary surge can be traced to the export-oriented, debt-servicing development strategy established by President Ferdinand Marcos. By the late 1990s, a complex, labor-exporting bureaucracy had emerged. Cultivating this care labor and its export have been government-supported educational institutions that educate and train nurses, chiefly for foreign markets in Saudi Arabia, the US, and the UK. With major capital at stake, some governments have been “only too eager to provide this habitat [my emphasis]” for producing care workers, deemed most valuable as export (Tolentino 1996, 53).
As the example of the Philippines demonstrates, colonial histories figure prominently in the contemporary emigration of care workers. These longstanding “interdependent relationships…established over centuries” (Raghuram 2009, 30) contribute to the global flow of health care workers. In addition to those from the Philippines, Indian nurses now constitute one of the largest groups of emigrant health care workers (Kingma 2006; Khadria 2007; Hawkes, Kolenko, Shockness et al. 2009). Their modern-day migration can trace its roots back to the British Empire’s Colonial Nursing Association (Rafferty 2005).
Immigration policies also figure into the flow of health care labor across borders to the extent that selective immigration, especially for skilled workers in areas with shortages, is a strategy increasingly used as an instrument of industrial policy under globalization (Ahmad 2005). Health and long-term care industry organizations in high income countries, who regard international recruitment as a way to address shortages and reduce hiring costs and improve retention, indeed, often lobby to ease immigration requirements in order to gain access to nurses and other care workers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007).
In this context, a for-profit international recruitment industry, involved in a range of activities related to recruitment, testing, credentialing, and immigration has emerged and flourished (Connell and Stillwell 2006; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007). Not only has the size of the industry surged, but so too has the number of countries in which recruiters operate. Many of these countries have high burdens of disease and low nurse-to-population ratios.
The health care policies and planning failures of governments and other agents operating in the health care arena, especially around cost-containment, also play a role (Pond and McPake 2006). The unprecedented vacancies and turnover rates, and growing trend toward early retirement that characterize nursing and direct care work in the US, for example, are attributable to underinvestment, staffing that is insufficient to support quality patient care, increasing hours, between units, centralized decision-making, inadequate opportunity for continuing education and professional development, poor compensation and benefits, and a pervasive sense of disrespect (Aiken, Clarke, Sloan et al. 2002; Berliner and Ginzberg 2002; Allan and Larsen 2003; Institute of Medicine 2003). The worldwide burgeoning need for long-term care, a sector with especially persistent shortages and poor working conditions, alongside what critics cite as the longstanding absence of coherent long-term care policy, is, for example, a major driver of care worker migration. A recent report argues that the unprecedented reliance on migrant care workers around the world is a symptom of inadequate long-term care policy (International Organization for Migration 2010, 7).
Middle class and more privileged families also arguably contribute, albeit unwittingly, to the emigration of care workers from less well-off parts of the world. As Joan Tronto (2006) suggests, the tendency to understand caring in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, has implications for the use of human health resources. Home care provided by emigrant women, for example, is on the rise in many places for those who can afford private help. Seen by the privileged as “[c]heap and flexible, this model is [embraced] to overcome the structural deficiencies of public family care provision [and often, crucially, workplace policies regarding family leave] and strikes a good balance between the conflicting needs of publicly supporting care of the elderly and controlling public expenditure” in privileged parts of the world (Bettio, Simonazzi, and Villa 2006). Trying to do the best they can for their families, often under constraints, families in privileged countries may not consider the implications for those less well off in other parts of the world.
Finally, countries’ “care regimes” can contribute to the flow of migrant workers. How governments structure provisions for the care of children, the ill and the elderly, including support for family caregivers has implications for the demand of migrant workers. In countries with strong welfare states and provisions for care of the dependent, there appears to be less demand than in countries with weak welfare states. What’s more, even in strong welfare states, the structure of the support seems to matter: where support for the dependent and their caregivers is professionalized, or formalized, there is more demand for migrant workers than where schemes are more informal (Michel 2010).
The hope of many government officials and other policy makers has been that remittances sent back to source countries by those working abroad will stimulate economic growth and development through investment and business opportunities, increase trade and knowledge transfer, and over time, reduce poverty. While remittances channel billions of dollars in money and other goods, there is little agreement on the overall impact of migration on countries that export workers (Page and Plaza 2006; Connell 2010). Most studies do not separate out health care workers specifically. Those that do make distinctions among work type have found variation by particular profession, gender, and family circumstance. Evidence suggests that remittances primarily benefit households, often through poverty reduction. In some cases, migrants remit to invest in community programs and groups, or perhaps businesses. Remittances have also been credited for gains in educational attainment, production increases in sectors like agriculture and manufacturing, and entrepreneurial activity.
Still, there is an overwhelming consensus that when health workers leave, population health erodes. Recent evidence suggests that the adverse effects of losing health workers are not likely compensated by remittances, for they do not contribute to the development of health systems, care provision, or compensate for economic losses of educated workers (Ball 1996; Brown and Connell 2006; OECD 2008; Packer, Runnels and Labonté 2010). Low income countries’ investment in education and training for health care workers who ultimately leave for other shores, say some critics, reflect a “perverse subsidy” (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).
Fifty-seven countries face severe health worker shortages (WHO 2006). These shortages affect both the quantity and the quality of health services available and provided. They worsen inequalities in infant, child and maternal health, vaccine coverage, response capacity for outbreaks and conflict, and mental health care. They lead to striking patient-health care worker ratios (especially in rural and remote areas), hospital, clinic, and program closures, and an increased workload for residing health care workers. Shortages in health personnel are said to be the most critical constraint in achieving the U.N. Millennium Development Goals and the WHO/UNAIDS 3 by 5 Initiative (Chen, Evans, Anand, et al. 2004; Médecins sans Frontières 2007). There is, of course, wide variation among countries when it comes to the impact of health care worker migration, depending upon such factors as size of the country, its geography and demographic make-up, disease burden, stock of trained workers, and so on. People in source countries, however, may get less care than they once did, and it may be given by someone with less education and training than would be the case but for migrations. In addition, people who formerly received care may get none at all. In some source countries, the absence of health care workers has caused a “virtual collapse” of health services (Packer, Labonté, and Runnels, 2009, 214). The gap created is often filled within families, as some governments facing under-resourced health care systems cope by “downloading” the work of caring onto women in individual households (Akintola 2004; Wegelin-Schuringa 2006; Harper, Aboderin, and Ruchieva 2008; Makina 2009). The problem is so grave that the Joint Learning Initiative (2004) concluded that the fate of global health and development in the 21st century lies in ensuring the equitable management of human health resources.
There are many ways of capturing what is at stake ethically for the people in source countries whose health care systems are failing. We might say they are harmed because resources are inequitably distributed (Wibulpolprasert and Pengaibon 2003; Dussault and Franceschini 2006), because the equal moral worth of particular groups of people, and in turn, equal opportunity, is denied (Daniels 2008). We might say, as well, that their welfare interests are threatened. Another view would suggest that global health inequities are morally troubling because deprivations in individuals’ capabilities to function threaten their well-being (Ruger 2006). Following Aristotle’s conception of human flourishing and its contemporary formulation in the “capability approach” of Sen and Nussbaum (Sen 1993), well-being on Ruger’s account is defined as having capabilities to achieve a range of beings and doings, or the freedom to be what we want to be and to do what we want to do.
Although the capabilities approach has not specifically been brought to bear on the problem of health worker migration, other rights-based arguments have played a prominent role. A number of commentators launch critiques of the depletion of source countries’ human health resources based on a human right to health (Gostin 2008; Shah 2010; O’Brien and Gostin 2011), a right ensconced in a number of international declarations including the United Nations Charter, the UN Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966), and the WHO Constitution (1948). The necessity of the health workforce to the health system, and in turn, to realizing this asserted right, is recognized in the WHO’s Code of Practice on the International Recruitment of Health Personnel (2010b).
The harm, finally, might be explained in terms of structural injustice. Structural injustice
exists when social processes [that is, social norms and economic structures, institutional rules, incentive structures, and sanctions, decision-making processes, etc] put large categories of persons under a systematic threat of domination or deprivation of the means to develop and exercise their capacities, at the same time as these processes enable others to dominate or have a wider range of opportunities for developing and exercising their capacities.
The ethical concern is not merely that structures constrain. “Rather the injustice consists in the way they constrain and enable,” serving systematically to expand opportunities for the privileged while contracting them for the less well-off (Young 2006, 114).
From a plurality of ethical perspectives, then, the asymmetrical migration of care workers is deeply problematic.
The implications—including ethical, social and political, and economic—for migrant care workers are also significant. Here I explore them with an emphasis on autonomy and equity. If we understand autonomy to mean something like being relatively free to choose one’s actions and course in life from a decent set of options, and equity to mean something like the absence of avoidable and unfair inequalities, the picture that emerges is complex and yields no simple conclusions.
Threats to autonomy and equity for migrant care workers come from several sources. Part of the feminization of international migration, women seeking employment in more affluent countries as maids, nannies, nurses, and other care workers, has come to be an especially integral part of the global economy (Ehrenreich and Hochschild 2002; Van Eyck 2005; Kingma 2006; Dumont, Martin, and Spielvogel 2007). Yet, to the extent that the global migration of nurses and other care workers is fueled by “the ideological construction of jobs and tasks in terms of notions of appropriate femininity” and in terms of racial and cultural stereotypes, it raises concerns. The construction of Filipinas for instance as caring, obedient, meticulous workers, “sacrificing heroines” (Schwenken 2008), of Indian women and Caribbean women as naturally warm-hearted and joyful, serves the aims of governments, industry organizations and employers, recruiters, and even family caregivers in the North. Yet it potentially perpetuates stereotypes and constrains the imaginations, opportunities and choices of women and girls.
Emigrants from low and middle-income countries are situated amidst different genres of nationalist rhetoric that support neoliberal economic policies. One form is organized around specific conceptions of national community, compelling labor migrants to organize their conduct around what is beneficial to states’ economies. Indeed, “the brain drain migrant is a particular subjectivity, forged by the needs of late capitalism.” Her subjectivity becomes “constituted as an assemblage of morality and economic rationality,” within which she “acts in socially appropriate ways not because of force or coercion but [allegedly] because [her] choices align with . . . ‘community interests’” (Ilcan, Oliver, and O’Connor 2007, 80). Another variety of nationalist rhetoric emphasizes “the active citizen,” a “reconfigured political identity . . . whose aim is to maximize . . . quality of life . . . by being [an] active agent in the market” (Schild 2007, 181). These rhetorical strategies operate with a caring face, suggesting that labor emigrants, especially women, will enjoy expanded opportunities for choice and prospects for equality. Yet to the extent that they “encourage[e] and cultivat[e] . . . forms of subjectivity that are congruent with capitalism in its latest phase” (199), enforce expectations for individual responsibility for familial well-being and constrain the set of options available, they may thwart autonomy for many emigrants.
Although married women with children who migrate are encouraged, even pressed—by governments, by family members, or by both given conditions at home—to provide from abroad for their families and countries, and are celebrated as “modern heroes”, they are often blamed for such social ills as divorce, poor school performance by children, and teen pregnancy in their home countries (Parreñas 2005). Gender norms, then, persist and are manipulated, further contributing to the erosion of autonomy and equity.
Most if not all migrant laborers, including those engaged in care work, are subject to “flexibilization,” a “process of self-constitution that correlates with, arises, from, and resembles a mode of social organization” (Fraser 2009, 129). Its central features are fluidity, provisionality, and a temporal horizon of no long-term. Transnational economic and other structures compel care workers to mobilize, for example, when most say they would rather work at home. Movement to care labor markets in the North may involve taking jobs below the education and skill level of care workers, a practice known as “down-skilling”. There is also the rapid expansion of the informal or “grey” economy, and the tendency under neo-liberal economic policies to define more and more jobs as temporary and unskilled. Inequities may persist under such schemes and choices may be constrained.
Furthermore, although countries often incentivize immigration for some workers, including some categories of care workers, questions of immigration and citizenship are contested. Countries “differentially incorporate” migrants when it comes to immigration and citizenship status (Parreñas 2000; Kofman and Raghuram 2006; Carens 2008). Care workers, especially the “unskilled”, often lack citizenship in the countries where they are employed. They therefore have a limited set of political rights and labor protections (Ball and Piper 2002; Ball 2004; Stasiulis and Bakan 2005; Dauvergne 2009; Bosniak 2009). Access to health and social services may also be diminished or lacking altogether (Meghani and Eckenwiler 2009; Deeb-Sosa and Mendez 2008).
More generally, like other migrants who describe feelings of dislocation, some emigrant nurses describe the experience of “having a foot here, a foot there, and a foot nowhere” (DiCicco-Bloom 2004, 28) and lacking a sense of belonging (Van Eyck 2004; Sørenson 2005; Hausner 2011). In addition to potential political disenfranchisement and exclusion from labor protections, many live in transnational families and engage in transnational care practices, adjusting to “extended family relations and obligations across space and time” (Baldock 2000, 221; Parreñas 2005). To the extent that selves are relational, that is, our identities shaped by familial relationships and engagement in the communities and places from which we come (Mackenzie and Stolijar 2000), migration leads not just to a geographic rupture but a “self-rupture” in many instances (Kittay unpublished). Indeed, these care workers experience a sort of “bi-placement” of identity, enduring the harm of “never feeling oneself as fully here” (Kittay unpublished; Hondagneu-Sotelo 1997).
Moreover, relations with family members and with their social and political communities may be transformed (Parreñas 2000; Espiritu 2005). They may be improved from the perspective of migrant care workers, or they may be eroded or fractured. Indeed, these moral harms faced by individuals can at the same time threaten the relationships themselves; they may lead others to “reinterpret our social or moral standing . . . [and] compromise the…bonds we have with them” (Miller 2009, 513).
Research finds that migrant care workers can reap significant benefits. There can be important gains for women in areas like self-trust and confidence, household decision-making and expenditures, as well as in spatial mobility and freedom from restrictive gender norms (McKay 2004; Pessar 2005; Percot 2006). They may advance their “migration project”, that is, achieve goals they have (albeit under constrained conditions) set for themselves, whether this means contributing to the well-being of their families and themselves at home, or ultimately gaining traction and stability in destination countries. Depending upon a range of factors, many care workers may well be vulnerable, yet become more autonomous and gain greater opportunity.
In sum, to the extent that migrants decisions to migrate come about because their own countries lack the capacities to support them and their families, and even facilitate their departures, and to the extent that they live and work under conditions that do not just alter but distort their identities, threaten their self-respect, relationships, and political engagement, and that perpetuate their status as lower-paid workers with few options in the global economy, their overall prospects for enhanced autonomy and equity are highly unclear (Abraham 2004; Connell and Voigt-Graf 2006; Espiritu 2006; Barber 2009; Nowak 2009).
As global capital uses particular places for particular forms of reproduction, and care workers are cultivated, extracted, and exported for the global marketplace – their labor revalued, repackaged, and relocated – not only do health care systems and the ill and dependent suffer, but family and community life, even political capacities, face erosion. Given that the care done within families generates public goods, like citizens, and contributes to their development and duration over the course of life, when a country exports care labor, that is, the women who provide it, it exports capacities for social reproduction (Truong 1996; Parreñas 2000). Most troublingly, to the extent that those with more resources have greater capacities to care—now by importing it—and those who have more resources are further produced and sustained to become more capable citizens, is that the outflow of caregivers may generate profound additional global inequalities in social and political capacity.
Who is responsible for addressing the harms suffered by emigrant care workers, their families and communities, and populations in source countries confronting high disease burdens and worker shortages? The array of agents involved, and therefore candidates for having responsibilities, includes governments in destination as well as source countries, international lending bodies, transnational health care corporations and recruitment agencies, and those who employ emigrant care workers. I begin by considering views on the matter of whether destination countries have obligations to source countries suffering from health inequities, and from there expand to explore what if any responsibilities might be said to exist for these other agents to source countries as well as emigrants.
A variety of arguments hold that destination countries are not obligated to address health inequities in source countries. One line of thought, which assumes that there is something ethically essential about the nation-state, is that although we might have some obligations to the world’s poor, we have duties to prioritize our compatriots (Miller 2004). Another line of argument holds that we have duties not to interfere in the affairs of other societies (Rawls 1999). A third view emphasizes distance rather than shared state membership; our moral intuitions, according to this account, suggest that our strongest obligations are to those nearby (Kamm 2004). Finally, libertarian theorists suggest that we have no obligations save for situations where we have caused harm, which on their account comes in the form of unfairly acquiring goods or resources (Nozick 1974).
Others, however, maintain that there are at least negative duties and possibly positive ones to address health inequities and other problems generated or worsened by the asymmetrical migration of health care workers. Some argue that our shared human dignity is sufficient to ground responsibilities for global health equity. We have duties, in other words, to prevent suffering when we have the capacity to do so on the basis of our equal moral worth as persons (Singer 1972). Countering the argument that we ought not to interfere in the affairs of other societies, a republican approach holds that freedom should be conceived in terms of non-domination rather than non-interference, and this may generate responsibilities of justice that cross borders (Petit 1997). Luck egalitarian accounts maintain that people should not suffer worse opportunities based on where they come from, so justice demands assistance (Caney 2005).
Arguing from various relational conceptions of justice, some theorists point to the dense relations of interdependence that connect people transnationally to justify principles of justice that transcend the boundaries of states. There are several ways to think about these relations, which are more particular than our shared humanity. According to Onora O’Neill (2000), an agent’s moral obligation encompasses all those people whom his or her activities depend upon, and so, is often global in scope. Thomas Pogge maintains that by “shaping and enforcing the social conditions that foreseeably and avoidably cause the monumental suffering of global poverty, we are harming the global poor …” (2005, 33). According to this view, our relationship is a matter of being “materially involved” in or “substantially contributing to” upholding the institutions responsible for injustice (2004, 137). Iris Marion Young proposes a third relational approach: a “social connection model of responsibility”. Here “[o]bligations of justice arise between [agents] by virtue of the social [often transnational] processes that connect them” (Young 2006, 102). Relational conceptions of justice, thus, implicate not only destination countries, but also the other agents who contribute through their policies and practices to the global, asymmetrical flow of care workers and the inequities this exacerbates. They also highlight the limits of libertarian and non-interventionist accounts.
The complexity of the processes and relations involved in generating injustice presents challenges when it comes to the work of attributing and assigning responsibilities. Given the way that structures and processes operate, responsibility is diffused, or dispersed. It can therefore be difficult if not impossible to identify a particular perpetrator (individual, institutional, or corporate) to whom particular harms might be traced directly. As Young explains, while “structural processes that produce injustice result from the actions of many persons and the policies of many organizations, in most cases it is not possible to trace which specific actions of which specific agents cause which specific parts of the structural processes or their outcomes” (Young 2006, 115). At the same time, adverse effects are not necessarily intended. Indeed, structural injustice often occurs as a result of our (individual and institutional) choices and actions as we try to advance our own interests “within given institutional rules and accepted norms” (114).
There is one further line of argument that might be brought to bear here. Responsibility can be motivated by prudential arguments, specifically those that acknowledge global interdependence. In other words, motivated by the idea that negative and positive externalities flow over national boundaries that are increasingly porous, the prudential approach justifies state-based action with transnational implications by affirming our interdependence along with the existence of ‘global public goods’. The idea is “to let international cooperation start ‘at home’, with national policies meant, at a minimum, to reduce or avoid altogether negative cross-border spillovers – and preferably to go beyond that to generate positive externalities in the interest of all” (Kaul, Grunberg and Stern 1999). Even, then, if agents are not motivated by moral reasons, prudence may generate responsible action and policy on the part of destination countries for the sake of source countries (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).
States are certainly not the sole actors on this moral landscape. Typically in discussions of global justice, including discussions of global health equity, states are assumed to have primary responsibility; that is, the “most direct and prior obligations” (Ruger 2006, 1001). Yet, states’ limitations are many. Some states do not have the capability to ensure justice. Others may lack the desire. And some states with the desire to be just are rendered more porous by the activities of other agents—what Onora O’Neill calls “networking institutions” (here, for instance: international lenders, health care corporations and recruiters) operating and exercising power within their borders (O’Neill 2000, 182-185; 2004 246–47). Conceptions of justice, therefore, must reckon with such agents if they are to have any traction under globalization. As noted earlier, relational approaches do, and in turn, assign responsibilities according to such parameters as their scope of power, resources, and degree of contribution to injustice (O’Neill 2000; Young 2006).
As for emigrant and other migrant care workers, the responsibilities of destination countries and those of networking institutions might include reforms in areas such as: recruitment policies and practices; immigration policy; and compensation and working conditions. I discuss these further in the final section.
An array of interventions and ideas has emerged to try to address at least some of the concerns raised here (Stillwell, Diallo, Zurn et al. 2004; Mensah, Mackintosh and Henry 2005; Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007). They aim variously at responding to health inequities, global health workforce management, and workers’ status and treatment. In the discussion below I focus on efforts underway along with ideas for further reform.
Perhaps the most important mechanisms embraced by governments to date are legally binding bilateral or multilateral agreements between source countries or regions and destination countries. These involve agreements for supplies of health professionals from particular countries (specifically those not suffering under low care worker-population ratios and/or high disease burdens) for specified lengths of time to address particular skill shortages. The UK and South Africa, for example, have a bilateral agreement, and some countries within the European Union have multilateral agreements. Recent evidence suggests that state policies can indeed have an impact on health worker migration (Bach 2010). In a related vein, some have called for global resource sharing, including staff sharing programs (Mackey and Liang 2012).
Codes of practice and position statements aimed at protecting the health systems of source countries and ensuring ethical treatment for migrant health workers have also emerged. They emphasize not recruiting from countries with severe shortages and high disease burdens, refraining from unethical recruitment practices, such as deception and misrepresentation, and treating migrant care workers with respect and providing them with labor protections. There are roughly twenty documents developed by governments, including the United Kingdom (UK Department of Health 2004), associations of governments like the Commonwealth Countries (2003) and Pacific Island Countries (Ministers of Health for Pacific Island Countries 2007), along with health professional associations, such as the World Health Organization (2010), the World Federation of Public Health Associations (2005), Academy Health (2008) and the American Public Health Association (Hagopian and Friedman 2006).
While such instruments draw attention to important issues and can raise the level of discourse, a major limit is that they do not address the root causes of migration. They are also voluntary and their impact is difficult to monitor (Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009). Moreover, the structure and financing of a country’s health system is a significant factor when it comes to their scope. In the UK, for example, which has one major public sector employer and one point of entry for health professionals, a code may have more of an impact than in countries with a wide array of independent private sector health care employers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009).
Motivated by compensatory justice, various compensation schemes have been suggested (Agwu and Llewelyn 2009). One model calls for governments of host or destination countries to pay source countries for the investments made in educating health professionals. Alternatively, destination countries could offer funding or other forms of investment for the purpose of capacity building and strengthening health systems in source countries (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).
Perhaps one of the most difficult questions concerns whether health workers have obligations to serve the countries that have provided their education and training (leaving aside countries where export is embedded in economic policy) (Cole 2010; Raustol 2010). Closely tied to this question is the extent to which, if at all, coercion (and what this means precisely) is justified in countries’ policies around health worker migration, particularly retention policies (Eyal and Hurst 2010). Proposals that raise such concerns range from financial and other incentives, where possible, to compulsory service requirements of some specified duration and taxes on migrants (Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007; Masango, Gathu, and Sibandze 2008; Barnighausen and Bloom 2009). Another idea aimed at retaining health care workers is to organize medical school and other health worker curricula in low and middle-income countries around “locally relevant” needs and capacities (Eyal and Hurst 2008). Meanwhile, many source countries are trying to increase training efforts among community and other auxiliary health care workers to fill gaps (Global Health Workforce Alliance 2008).
Global economic policy that shifts to address the constraints that lead to migration faced by care workers in source countries is often the first item on health advocates’ list of reforms. This would mean an end to structural adjustment policies and an investment in health system infrastructure that will staff sufficient numbers and varieties of health care workers, fairly compensate and treat them, and serve the public equitably.
At the country level, specifically in destination countries, long-range planning is clearly essential. When it comes to public health, notes one commentator, “the future is no where in sight” (Graham 2010). Indeed,
[In] spite of its importance, workforce planning and management have traditionally been viewed as low priority by many countries… supply driven with limited attention afforded to population health needs, service demand factors and social, political, geographical, technological and economic factors….[and] carried out in…silos rather than integrated across the various health disciplines/occupations (International Council of Nurses 2006, 10).
Policy makers in such places indisputably have obligations to address these issues for the sake of their own populations. And as has been shown here, many conceptions of justice maintain they also owe it to the poorer nations upon whom they’ve come to rely.
Some might argue for self-sufficiency in human heath resource planning (Mullan, Frehywot and Jolley 2008). This goal seems morally praiseworthy in its quest to avoid unjust relationships between richer and poorer countries. Skepticism as to whether it can be realized given conditions under globalization suggests to many that “shared health governance” ought to become the new model (Ruger 2006, 1001). The precise meaning of this notion is a matter of vitriolic debate; however, in the most general terms it involves governments and global institutions, along with non-governmental organizations, businesses, and foundations, engaged collaboratively in decision-making processes aimed at meeting the specific needs and addressing the constraints particular countries face. Advocates for shared governance over human health resources point to the fact that some form of this is reflected already in a number of areas, including access to essential medicines, vaccines, and tobacco control (O’Brien and Gostin 2011).
The discussion so far has emphasized states and “networking institutions”, and political-legal-institutional reforms. Some contemporary moral and political philosophers, however, would maintain that there is a tendency to underestimate the potential of personal interactions and practices among individuals (Walker 1998; Kurasawa 2007). According to Fuyuki Kurasawa, for example, a “formalist bias” that involves understanding global justice as emerging principally through prescriptive or legislative means, overlooks “the social labour and modes of practice that supply the ethical and political soil within which the norms, institutions and procedures of global justice are rooted” (Kurasawa 2007, 6). He identifies five practices: bearing witness, forgiveness, giving aid, solidarity, and foresight. Such practices may accompany or in some cases facilitate political, legal, economic, and institutional reform.
Here I consider practices that concern the ethical stance people in source countries – especially but not exclusively those who employ them – owe to these emigrants. There are international agreements that call for elements of what I note below, such as the International Convention on the Protection of the Rights of All Migrant Workers and Members of Their Families. I describe three practices, drawing upon Tronto’s concept (2006), of “privileged responsibility”: preventive foresight and solidarity (following Kurasawa), and recognition.
Tronto’s argument is that the tendency among middle class and more affluent families to understand caring (particularly for children, the ill, and the dependent) in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, can lead to moral hazards including social harm. “In a competitive society,” she observes, “what it means to care well for one’s own [family] is to make sure that they have a competitive edge against other [families]” (2006, 10). Ultimately, those acting with what Tronto describes as “privileged irresponsibility” can “ignore the ways in which their own caring activities continue to perpetuate inequality” (13).
To respond to this and other myopias, individuals and families with resources in wealthy countries might practice “preventive forsesight” (Kurasawa 2007) and plan ahead for their own care needs and think critically about their anticipated use of resources. They might ask themselves for example: To what extent do my/our “expectations” or actual needs have implications for others in need of care? Other families? Other communities? Could I/we plan and act in such a way that might avoid or lessen participation in the perpetuation of injustice?
Another way of taking seriously the moral status and significance of migrant care workers, their work, and the implications of their mobility might be through the practice of recognition. Recognition has come to be understood in at least two senses: recognition of individuals’ unique identity as an autonomous individual and recognition of persons as belonging to particular communities or groups. It also includes a third dimension, the recognition of others’ needs for relationships, both interpersonal and associative (Gould 2007, 250). Recognizing emigrant care workers in this way might enrich appreciation for the fact that many live in transnational families. Additionally, recognizing interdependence could mitigate against ignorance concerning health inequities in source countries. A fourth dimension might be added: recognition of the conditions – the places – in which care workers provide care, including conditions in the places where their numbers are few, the disease burden is high, and available resources scant.
Solidarity, an increasingly examined concept both in health ethics as well as global justice, may have relevance here. Contemporary thinking on solidarity suggests that it involves reaching beyond the scope of one’s community to cultivate ties with others who have suffered injustice across distance and amid asymmetries, and standing together in advancing justice and resisting injustice (Gould 2007; Lenard 2010). Relations of solidarity might be forged, for example, between governments, employers and employees, people with diminished access to health care, migrant workers, and family caregivers and care workers for moral or prudential reasons (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).
Health worker migration is not the main cause of health inequities; yet, it contributes to them and possibly others. Thus, conditions that facilitate, and the moral agents who participate in facilitating, migration (above all, asymmetrical) call for moral scrutiny. Additionally, the treatment of emigrant care workers warrants ethical investigation. Policies and practices that undermine values such as autonomy and equity should be seen as morally suspect. Finally, the state-level and global management of human health resources demands urgent attention. The present structure characterized by a “perverse subsidy”, ongoing underinvestment in health care (often where it is most needed), even in destination countries, and narrowly nationalist thinking threatens justice for populations everywhere, especially the poor.
George Mason University
U. S. A.
Last updated: January 9, 2013 | Originally published: