Cynicism originates in the philosophical schools of ancient Greece that claim a Socratic lineage. To call the Cynics a “school” though, immediately raises a difficulty for so unconventional and anti-theoretical a group. Their primary interests are ethical, but they conceive of ethics more as a way of living than as a doctrine in need of explication. As such askēsis—a Greek word meaning a kind of training of the self or practice—is fundamental. The Cynics, as well as the Stoics who followed them, characterize the Cynic way of life as a “shortcut to virtue” (see Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 104 and Book 7, Chapter 122). Though they often suggest that they have discovered the quickest, and perhaps surest, path to the virtuous life, they recognize the difficulty of this route.
The colorfulness of the Cynic way of life presents certain problems. The triumph of the Cynic as a philosophical and literary character complicates discussions of the historical individuals, a complication further troubled by a lack of sources. The evidence regarding the Cynics is limited to apothegms, aphorisms, and ancient hearsay; none of the many Cynic texts have survived. The tradition records the tenets of Cynicism via their lives. It is through their practices, the selves and lives that they cultivated, that we come to know the particular Cynic ēthos.
The origin of the Cynic name kunikos, a Greek word meaning “dog-like”, is a point of contention. Two competing stories explain the source of the name using the figure of Antisthenes (who Diogenes Laertius identifies controversially as the original Cynic), and yet a third explanation uses the figure of Diogenes of Sinope. First, Antisthenes is said to have taught in the Cynosarges, which is a Greek word that might mean “White Dog,” “Quick Dog,” or even “Dog’s Meat”. The Cynosarges is a gymnasium and temple for Athenian nothoi. “Nothoi” is a term that designates one who is without Athenian citizenship because of being born to a slave, foreigner, or prostitute; one can also be nothoi if one’s parents were citizens but not legally married. According to the first explanation, the term Cynic would, then, derive from the place in which the movement’s founder worshipped, exercised, and, most importantly, lectured. Such a derivation is suspect insofar as later writers could have created the story through an analogy to the way in which the term “Stoic” came from the Stoa Poikilē in which Zeno of Citium taught. Though nothing unquestionably links Antisthenes or any other Cynic to the Cynosarges, Antisthenes was a nothos and the temple was used for worshipping Hercules, the ultimate Cynic hero.
A second possible derivation comes from Antisthenes’ alleged nickname Haplokuōn, a word that probably means a dog “pure and simple”, and is presumably referring to his way of living. Though Antisthenes was known for a certain rudeness and crudeness that could have led to such a name, and later authors, including Aelian, Epictetus, and Stobaeus, identify him as a kuōn, or dog, his contemporaries, such as Plato and Xenophon, do not label him as such. This lack lends some credence to the notion that the term kunikos was applied to Antisthenes posthumously, and only after Diogenes of Sinope, a more illustrious philosopher-dog, had arrived on the scene.
If Antisthenes was not the first Cynic by name, then the origin of the appellation falls to Diogenes of Sinope, an individual well known for dog-like behavior. As such, the term may have begun as an insult referring to Diogenes’ style of life, especially his proclivity to perform all of his activities in public. Shamelessness, which allowed Diogenes to use any space for any purpose, was primary in the invention of “Diogenes the Dog.”
The precise source of the term “Cynic” is, however, less important than the wholehearted appropriation of it. The first Cynics, beginning most clearly with Diogenes of Sinope, embraced their title: they barked at those who displeased them, spurned Athenian etiquette, and lived from nature. In other words, what may have originated as a disparaging label became the designation of a philosophical vocation.
Finally, because Cynicism denotes a way of living, it is inaccurate to equate Cynicism with the other schools of its day. The Cynics had no set space where they met and discoursed, such as the Garden, the Lyceum, or the Academy; for Diogenes and Crates, the streets of Athens provide the setting for both their teaching and their training. Moreover, the Cynics neglect, and very often ridicule, speculative philosophy. They are especially harsh critics of dogmatic thought, theories they consider useless, and metaphysical essences.
The major figures within Cynicism form the pivotal points within a lineage traced from Antisthenes, Socrates’ companion and a major interlocutor in the Socratic dialogues of Xenophon (see especially his Memorabilia and Symposium), through his student, Diogenes of Sinope, to Diogenes’ pupil Crates, and from Crates to both Hipparchia of Maronea, the first known woman Cynic philosopher, and Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism.
Some others among the more notable Cynics include Metrocles of Maronea, brother to Hipparchia and pupil of Crates, Menippus, Demonax of Cyprus, Bion of Borysthenes, and Teles. Thinkers heavily influenced by Cynic thought include Zeno of Citium, Cleanthes of Assos, Aristo of Chios, Musonius Rufus, Epictetus, Dio Chrysostom, and the emperor Julian.
The Socratic schools tend to trace their lineage directly back to Socrates and the Cynics are no exception. As such, the historical authenticity of this heredity is suspect. Nevertheless, it accurately tracks a kind of intellectual transmission that begins with Antisthenes and is passed on to Diogenes, Crates, and Zeno. Cynics seem to have survived into the third century CE; two of Julian’s orations from 361 CE disparage the Cynics of his day for lacking the asceticism and hardiness of “real” Cynics. As a “school” of thought, Cynicism ends in the sixth century CE, but its legacy continues in both philosophy and literature.
Foremost for understanding the Cynic conception of ethics is that virtue is a life lived in accord with nature. Nature offers the clearest indication of how to live the good life, which is characterized by reason, self-sufficiency, and freedom. Social conventions, however, can hinder the good life by compromising freedom and setting up a code of conduct that is opposed to nature and reason. Conventions are not inherently bad; however, for the Cynic, conventions are often absurd and worthy of ridicule. The Cynics deride the attention paid to the Olympics, the “big thieves” who run the temples and are seen carrying away the “little thieves” who steal from them, politicians as well as the philosophers who attend their courts, fashion, and prayers for such things as fame and fortune.
Only once one has freed oneself from the strictures that impede an ethical life can one be said to be truly free. As such, the Cynics advocate askēsis, or practice, over theory as the means to free oneself from convention, promote self-sufficiency, and live in accord with nature. Such askēsis leads the Cynic to live in poverty, embrace hardship and toil, and permits the Cynic to speak freely about the silly, and often vicious, way life is lived by his or her contemporaries. The Cynics consistently undermine the most hallowed principles of Athenian culture, but they do so for the sake of replacing them with those in accord with reason, nature, and virtue.
Though the imperative to live life in accord with nature is rightly associated with Stoicism, the Stoics are following a Cynic lead. Diogenes of Sinope fervently rejects nomos, or convention, by showing the arbitrary and frequently amusing nature of Athenian social, religious, and political mores and trampling the authority of religious and political leaders. Fundamental to this is a redefinition of what is worthy of shame. Diogenes’ body is disorderly, a source of great shame among the Athenians and the reservoir for the principle of shamelessness among the Cynics.
Diogenes uses his body to upend the conventional association of decorum with the good. He breaks etiquette by publicly carrying out activities an Athenian would typically perform in private. For example, he eats, drinks, and masturbates in the marketplace, and ridicules the shame felt when one’s body is unruly or clumsy. This does not mean, however, that there is nothing about which a person ought to feel shame. For example, in Lives of Emminent Philosophers, one finds the following anecdote: “Observing a fool tuning a harp, ‘Are you not ashamed,’ he said, ‘to give this wood concordant sounds, while you fail to harmonize your soul with your life?’ To one who protested ‘I am unfit to study philosophy,’ Diogenes said, ‘Why then live, if you do not care to live well?’” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 65; R.D. Hicks’ translation is altered for this article.)
As Diogenes ’ reappraisal of shame suggests, the Cynics are not relativists. Nature replaces convention as the standard for judgment. The Cynics believe that it is through nature that one can live well and not through conventional means such as etiquette or religion. One reads that Diogenes of Sinope “would rebuke men in general with regard to their prayers, declaring that they asked for things which seemed to them to be good, not for such as are truly good” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 43). This captures the crux of the Cynic notion of living in accord with nature and contrary to convention. Praying for wealth, fame, or any of the other trappings convention leads one to believe are good is a mistaken enterprise. Life, as given by nature, is full of hints as to how to live it best; but humans go astray, ashamed by petty things and striving after objects, which are unimportant. Consequently, their freedom is hindered by convention.
The Cynics clearly privilege freedom, but not merely in a personal sense as a kind of negative liberty. Instead, freedom is advocated in three related forms: eleutheria, freedom or liberty, autarkeia, self-sufficiency, and parrhēsia, freedom of speech or frankness. Their conception of freedom has some shared aspects with other ancient schools; the notion of autonomy which derives from the imperative that reason rule over the passions is found in the ethics of multiple Classical and Hellenistic thinkers. A specifically Cynic sense of freedom, though, is evident in parrhēsia.
An element of parrhēsia, which can be overlooked when it is defined as free or frank speech, is the risk that accompanies speaking so freely and frankly. Legendary examples of the Cynic’s fearlessly free speech occur in Diogenes of Sinope’s interchanges with Alexander the Great. One such example is the following: “When he was sunning himself in the Craneum, Alexander came and stood over him and said, ‘Ask of me any boon you like.’ To which he replied, ‘Stand out of my light’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 28). At another point, Alexander pronounces his rank to Diogenes of Sinope by saying, “I am Alexander the Great King.” Diogenes responds with his own rank, “I am Diogenes the Cynic,” which is to say “Diogenes the Dog” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 60).
The examples above demonstrate the unique confluence of humor, fearless truth telling, and political subversion which distinguishes the Cynic way of living. With a few notable exceptions, the philosophers of antiquity can be found at some time or another in the company of rulers (Plato, Aeschines, and Aristippus all attended the court of Dionysius, Xenophon is intimately associated with Cyrus, Aristotle with the Macedonian ruling family, and so on). The Cynics, however, made it a point to shun such contact. The Cynics strive for self-sufficiency and strength, neither of which is capable of being maintained once one enters into the conventional political game. The life of an impoverished, but virtuous and self-sufficient philosopher is preferable to the life of a pampered court philosopher.
Diogenes Laertius writes that, “Plato saw [Diogenes of Sinope] washing lettuces, came up to him and quietly said to him, ‘Had you paid court to Dionysius, you wouldn’t now be washing lettuces,’ and [Diogenes] with equal calmness answered, ‘If you had washed lettuces, you wouldn’t have paid court to Dionysius’” (Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 58). The lesson of this exchange is clear: whereas Plato views paying court as freeing one from poverty, the Cynic sees poverty as freeing one from having to pay court to a ruler. This second sense of freedom so forcefully advocated by the Cynics, comprises both autarkeia, or self-sufficiency, and parrhēsia, or the freedom to speak the truth: something one at court is never free to do. It is no surprise, then, that when asked what is “the most beautiful thing in the world,” Diogenes replied, “Parrhēsia.” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 69.)
In order to live the Cynic life, one had to be inured to the various physical hardships entailed by such freedom. This required, then, a life of constant training, or askēsis. The term askēsis, defined above as a kind of training of the self but which also means “exercise” or “practice,” is appropriated from athletic training. Instead of training the body for the sake of victory in the Olympic Games, on the battlefield, or for general good health, the Cynic trains the body for the sake of the soul.
The examples of Cynic training are multiple: Antisthenes praised toil and hardship as goods; Diogenes of Sinope walked barefoot in the snow, hugged cold statues, and rolled about in the scalding summer sand in his pithos; Crates rid himself of his considerable wealth in order to become a Cynic. The ability to live without any of the commodities usually mistaken for necessities is liberating and beneficial. It is also, however, a difficult lesson: “[Diogenes of Sinope] used to say that he followed the example of the trainers of choruses; for they too set the note a little high, to ensure that the rest should hit the right note” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 35).
The Cynics are not always given credit when it comes to the notion of cosmopolitanism, for the origin of this term is at times ascribed to Stoicism. Moreover, when it is attributed to Cynicism, it is often characterized as a negative tenet that gains content only once it is transplanted into Stoic doctrine (see John L. Moles’ discussion of “Cynic Cosmopolitanism” in The Cynics). However, cosmopolitanism can be fully understood within its Cynic context if it is taken as more than an oxymoron or a pithy retort: “Asked where he came from, [Diogenes of Sinope] said, ‘I am a citizen of the world [kosmopolitēs]’” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 63). In this last quote, Diogenes is responding to a question calling for him to state his origin with what seems to be a neologism. To be a politēs is to belong to a polis, to be a member of a specific society with all of the benefits and commitments such membership entails. By not responding with the expected “Sinope,” Diogenes is renouncing his duty to Sinopeans as well as his right to be aided by them. It is important to note that Diogenes does not say that he is apolis, that is, without a polis; he claims allegiance to the kosmos, or the universe.
The Cynics, then, cast the notion of citizenship in a new light. To the Greek male of the Classical and Hellenistic period, citizenship was of utmost value. The restrictions on citizenship made it a privilege and these exclusions are, to the Cynic, absurd. Under cosmopolitanism, the Cynic challenges the civic affiliation of the few by opening the privilege to all. General national affiliation was likewise esteemed, and Diogenes’ cosmopolitan response is therefore also a rejection of the limitations of such a view.
Finally, cosmopolitanism revises the traditional conception of the political duties of an individual. As such, the Cynic is freed to live according to nature and not according to the laws and conventions of the polis. The conventional polis is not just rejected but replaced. This has important ethical connections to the notion of living in accord with nature, and can likewise be seen as an important precursor to the Stoic understanding of physis, or nature, as identical to the kosmos, or universe.
The first and most direct Cynic influence is upon the founding of Stoicism. One story, preserved in Diogenes Laertius, tells of Zeno of Citium reading a copy of Xenophon’s Memorabilia in a bookshop while shipwrecked in Athens. He became so taken with the figure of Socrates that he asked the bookseller where he might find such a man. At just that moment, Crates passed by, and the bookseller pointed him out as the one to follow.
Though this, like many of Diogenes Laertius’ stories, may strike one as too propitious to be historically accurate, it preserves the way in which the primary tenets of Stoicism emerge out of Cynicism. The primacy of ethics, the sufficiency of virtue for happiness, the cultivation of indifference to external affairs, the definition of virtue as living in accord with nature, and the importance placed on askēsis, all mark the shared terrain between the Cynics and the Stoics. Indeed, when various Stoic thinkers list the handful of Stoic sages, Cynics, and especially Diogenes of Sinope, are typically among them. Epictetus in particular advocates the Cynic stance, but warns against taking up lightly something so difficult (see Discourses 3.22).
Within political philosophy, the Cynics can be seen as originators of anarchism. Since humans are both rational and able to be guided by nature, it follows that humans have little need for legal codes or political affiliations. Indeed, political associations at times require one to be vicious for the sake of the polis. Diogenes’ cosmopolitanism represents, then, a first suggestion that human affiliation ought to be to humanity rather than a single state.
The impact of Cynicism is also felt in Christian, Medieval, and Renaissance thought, though not without a good deal of ambivalence. Christian authors, for example, praise the Cynics for their self-discipline, independence, and mendicant lifestyle, but rebuke the bawdy aspects of Cynic shamelessness.
Finally, the mark of the Cynic is found throughout the texts of literature and philosophy. Menippean Satire has a clear debt, and Diogenes of Sinope in particular appears as a character in literary and philosophical contexts; Dante, for example, situates Diogenes with other virtuous but pagan philosophers in the first level of hell and Nietzsche is especially fond of both Diogenes and the Cynic attitude. One striking example occurs in section 125 of The Gay Science. Here Nietzsche alludes to the anecdote wherein Diogenes searches for a human being with a lit lamp in daylight (D.L. 6.41). In his own rendition, Nietzsche tells the story of the madman who entered the marketplace with a lit lamp on a bright morning seeking God. It is this same madman who pronounces that God is dead.
University of Arkansas at Little Rock
U. S. A.
Last updated: April 18, 2006 | Originally published: