The Cyrenaics are one of the minor Socratic schools. The school was founded by Aristippus, a follower of Socrates. The Cyrenaics are notable mainly for their empiricist and skeptical epistemology and their sensualist hedonism. They believe that we can have certain knowledge of our immediate states of perceptual awareness, e.g., that I am seeing white now. However, we cannot go beyond these experiences to gain any knowledge about the objects themselves that cause these experiences or about the external world in general. Some of their arguments prefigure the positions of later Greek skeptics, and their distinction between the incorrigibility of immediate perceptual states versus the uncertainty of belief about the external world became key to the epistemological problems confronting philosophers of the ‘modern’ period, such as Descartes and Hume. In ethics, they advocate pleasure as the highest good. Furthermore, bodily pleasures are preferable to mental pleasures, and we should pursue whatever will bring us pleasure now, rather than deferring present pleasures for the sake of achieving better long-term consequences. In all these respects, their iconoclastic and ‘crude’ hedonism stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, and their theories were often contrasted with Epicurus’ more moderate hedonism.
The Cyrenaic school was founded by Aristippus (c. 435-356 B.C.), a follower of Socrates and a rough contemporary of Plato. The name ‘Cyrenaic’ comes from Cyrene, Aristippus’ home town, a Greek colony in Northern Africa. Aristippus taught philosophy to his daughter Arete, who in turn taught philosophy to her son Aristippus. Aristippus the younger formulated many of the theories of the Cyrenaic school, so that some scholars count him as being more properly the founder of the school, with Aristippus the Elder being merely the school’s figurehead. However, disentangling the exact contributions of the two to the Cyrenaic philosophy is difficult. Later Cyrenaics, notably Hegesias, Anniceris, and Theodorus, who were rough contemporaries of Epicurus, modified the Cyrenaic ethical doctrines in different directions, and the school died out shortly afterwards, around the middle of the 3rd century B.C. However, it did have some influence on later philosophers. Epicurus most likely developed some of the distinctive features of his ascetic hedonism in order to avoid what he saw as the unpalatable consequences of Cyrenaic hedonism, and many of the Cyrenaic arguments against the possibility of gaining knowledge of the external world were appropriated by later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics.
The Cyrenaics are empiricists and skeptics. As empiricists, they believe that all that we have access to as a potential source of knowledge are our own experiences. These experiences are private to each of us. We can have incorrigible knowledge of our experiences (that is, it impossible to be mistaken about what we are currently experiencing), but not of the objects that cause us to have these experiences. This results in their skepticism—their conviction that we cannot have knowledge of the external world.
The Cyrenaics affirm that pathê–affections, or experiences–are the criterion of knowledge. They distinguish sharply between the experiences that one has–e.g., that I am now seeing gray–and the objects that cause one to have these experiences–e.g., the computer screen.
We can have infallible knowledge of our own experiences, since we have immediate access to them, but we do not have access to objects and qualities in the external world. As the Cyrenaics put it, “The experience which takes place in us reveals to us nothing more than itself.” The Cyrenaics reinforce this point by saying that, strictly speaking, we should not say, “I am seeing something yellow,” for instance, but “I am being yellowed,” or “I am being moved by something yellowly,” since the latter statements make it clear that we are reporting only our immediate perceptual state. (In this respect, the Cyrenaics bear a striking resemblance to some modern epistemologists, who resort to locutions like “I am being appeared to redly now” as describing accurately what is immediately given to us in experience.)
The Cyrenaics have two main arguments for why it is impossible to make inferences about the qualities of objects in the external world on the basis of our experiences:
The Cyrenaics note that the same object can cause different perceivers to experience different sensible qualities, depending on the bodily condition of the perceivers. For instance, honey will taste sweet to most people, but bitter to somebody with an illness, and the same wall that appears white to one person will look yellow to somebody with jaundice. And if a person presses his eye, he sees double.
From the fact that the wall appears white to me and yellow to you, the Cyrenaics think we should infer that we cannot know which quality the wall itself has on the basis of our experience of it, presumably because we have no criterion outside of our experiences to use to adjudicate which one (if either) of our experiences is correct. Such arguments from the relativity of perception are common in ancient Greek philosophy, and other thinkers draw different conclusions; for example, Protagoras says we should conclude that the wall is both white (for me) and yellow (for you), while Democritus thinks that we should conclude that it is neither white nor yellow.
Even if all people were to agree on the perceptual quality that some object has–for instance, that a wall appears white–the Cyrenaics still think that we could not confidently say that we are having the same experience. This is because each of us has access only to our own experiences, not to those of other people, and so the mere fact that each of us calls the wall ‘white’ does not show us that we are all having the same experience that I am having when I use the word ‘white.’
This argument of the Cyrenaics anticipates the problem of other minds—that is, how can I know that other people have a mind like I do, since I only observe their behavior (if even that), not the mental states that might or might not cause that behavior?
The Cyrenaic position bears some striking resemblance to the relativistic epistemology of the sophist Protagoras, as depicted in Plato’s dialogue Theaetetus, and to the skeptical epistemology of the Pyrrhonists. Because of this, the Cyrenaics’ epistemology is sometimes wrongly assimilated that of Protagoras or the Pyrrhonists. However, the Cyrenaics’ subjectivism is quite different from those positions, and explaining their differences will help bring out what is distinctive about the Cyrenaics.
The Cyrenaics and Protagoras do have similar starting-points. Protagoras also says that knowledge comes from perception. He uses basically the same arguments from relativity that the Cyrenaics use, and on their basis asserts that each of us infallibly has knowledge of how things appear to us. So, if I feel that the wind is hot, and judge that “the wind is hot,” I am judging truly (for me) how the wind is. And if the wind feels not-hot to you, and you judge that “the wind is not hot,” you are also judging truly (for you) how the wind is. These apparently contradictory statements can both betrue, since each of us is judging only about how things appear to us.
However, there are important differences between Protagoras’ relativism and the Cyrenaics’ subjectivism. The Cyrenaics would more likely want to say “that the wind appears hot to me is true” (simpliciter) rather than “‘The wind is hot’ is true-for-me.” The Cyrenaic position retains the possibility of error whenever you go beyond the immediate content of your experience, whereas Protagoras says that however things appear to you is ‘true for you.’ According to the Cyrenaics, I may know infallibly that “I am being appeared to hotly now,” but if I were to say that the wind itself were hot, I might be mistaken, and if I were to judge that “You are being appeared to hotly now,” whereas in fact you were having a chilly experience, I would be mistaken. Protagoras, as depicted in the Theaetetus, does away with the possibility of people genuinely contradicting one another, since all statements are about how things appear to the individual making the statement, and hence all (sincere) statements turn out to be true–for that individual, at that time.
Also, when Protagoras says that each us can judge infallibly how things ‘appear’ to us, the sense of ‘appearance’ that Protagoras is using extends beyond the initial restricted sense of phenomenal appearances, e.g., a wind feeling hot or a wall seeming white, to cover beliefs generally. That is, if I believe that “the laws of Athens are just,” then Protagoras would say that this is equivalent to “it seems to me that the laws of Athens are just.” And since each of us can judge infallibly about our own appearances, I can also know that it is true (for me) that “the laws of Athens are just.” The Cyrenaics retain the more restricted sense of ‘appearance,’ where each of can know infallibly our immediate perceptual states, for instance, knowing that I am having a red experience, but this does not extend to knowledge of laws ‘appearing’ to be just, or the future ‘appearing’ to be hopeful.
The later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics make use of arguments from the relativity of perception to try to refute the position of dogmatists, like the Stoics and the Epicureans, who claim that we can gain knowledge of the external world on the basis of sense-perception. However, although the Cyrenaics might properly be called ‘skeptics,’ their skepticism differs from the skepticism of the Pyrrhonists in at least three respects.
The first difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that we can have knowledge of the contents of our experiences, while the Pyrrhonists disavow any knowledge whatsoever. However, this difference might not be as significant as it seems, since the Pyrrhonists do acknowledge that we can accurately report how things appear to us–e.g., that the wind appears hot. However, they refuse to say that this qualifies as knowledge, since knowledge concerns how things are, not merely how they appear to us.
The second difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of the external world, while the Pyrrhonists claim neither that one can nor that one cannot gain such knowledge. The Pyrrhonists would label the Cyrenaic position as a form of ‘negative dogmatism,’ since the Cyrenaics do advance assertions about the impossibility of knowledge of the external world. This is a type of second-order purported ‘knowledge’ about the limits of our knowledge, and the Pyrrhonists, as true skeptics, do not make even these types of pronouncements.
Third, although the Cyrenaics do claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of what the external world is like, it is not as clear that they doubt that there exists an external world, which the Pyrrhonists do. Some sources ascribe to the Cyrenaics the position that whether there is an external world is not known, while others ascribe to them the position that we can know that there is an external world that is the cause of our experiences, but that we cannot know what this world is like. The latter position fits in more smoothly with the way the Cyrenaics conceive of experiences, as effects of external causes (“I am being yellowed”), but has obvious difficulties of its own. (For instance, if we can know nothing about what characteristics objects in the external world have, what basis do we have to think that these objects exist?) However, if this is what the Cyrenaics think, a parallel can be drawn between their position and what Immanuel Kant says about the existence of the noumenal world of ‘things in themselves,’ which is the unknowable source of the data which ultimately forms our experiences.
Finally, the Cyrenaic position, at least in the limited reports we have concerning it, does not appear to be as fully-developed as that of the later skeptics. The academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics engaged in long controversies with the dogmatists, and as a result, they needed to answer the objections of the dogmatists, e.g., that it is impossible to live as a skeptic, or that skepticism is self-refuting. The Cyrenaics, as far as we know, do not address these questions.
The Cyrenaics are unabashed sensual hedonists: the highest good is my own pleasure, with all else being valuable only as a means to securing my own pleasure, and bodily pleasures are better than mental pleasures. Their iconoclastic theory stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, with the traditional virtues of moderation, justice, and friendship being disparaged by them.
3a. The Value and Nature of Pleasure
The Cyrenaics start from the Greek ethical commonplace that the highest good is what we all seek for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else. This they identify as pleasure, because we instinctively seek pleasure for its own sake, and when we achieve pleasure, we want nothing more. Similarly, pain is bad because we shun it.
When the Cyrenaics say that ‘pleasure’ is the highest good, they do not mean that pleasure in general in good, so that we should seek to maximize the overall amount of pleasure in the world, as utilitarians say. Instead, they mean that, for each of us, our own pleasure is what is valuable to us, because that is what each of us seeks. Also, each of us can only experience our own pleasures, and not the pleasures of other people. Thus, the Cyrenaic view is a form of egoistic hedonism.
Pleasure and pain are both ‘movements,’ according to the Cyrenaics: pleasure a smooth motion, and pain a rough motion. The absence of either type of motion is an intermediate state which is neither pleasurable nor painful. This is directed against Epicurus’ theory that thehomeostatic state of being free of pain, need and worry is itself most pleasant. The Cyrenaics make fun of the Epicurean theory by saying that this state of being free of desires and pain is the condition of a corpse.
The Cyrenaics admit that there are both bodily pleasures (for example, sexual gratification) and mental pleasures (e.g., delight at the prosperity of one’s country), and they maintain, against the Epicureans, that not all mental pleasures are based upon bodily pleasures. However, they exalt bodily over mental pleasures, presumably because bodily pleasures are much more vivid than mental pleasures. They also assert that bodily pains are worse than mental pains, and give as evidence for this claim that criminals are punished with bodily instead of mental pains.
One of the most striking features of Cyrenaic ethics is their assertion that it is pleasure, and not happiness, which is the highest good. Almost all other Greek theorists agree that happiness is the highest good, but disagree about what happiness consists in. Even Epicurus, who is a hedonist, remains within this tradition by asserting that happiness is the same as leading a pleasant life. The Cyrenaics, however, say that what we really seek are individual pleasures, e.g., the pleasure of eating a steak. Happiness, which is thought of as the sum of all of these individual pleasures, is valuable only because of the value of each of the individual pleasures that make it up.
Another striking feature of the Cyrenaic theory is its lack of future-concern. The Cyrenaics advocate going after whatever will bring one pleasure now, enjoying the pleasure while one is experiencing it, and not worrying too much about what the future will bring. Although the Cyrenaics say that prudence is valuable for attaining pleasure, they do not seem much concerned with exercising self-control in pursuing pleasure, or with deferring present pleasures (or undergoing present pains) for the sake of experiencing greater pleasure (or avoiding greater pains) in the future.
This lack of future-concern is not a direct consequence of their hedonism, nor of their privileging of bodily over mental pleasures. If pleasure is the highest good, and one wants to maximize the pleasure in one’s life, then the natural position to take is the one Socrates lays out in Plato’s dialogue the Protagoras. Socrates describes a type of hedonism in which one uses a ‘measuring art’ to weigh equally all of the future pleasures and pains one would experience . Although present pleasures might seem more alluring than distant ones, Socrates maintains that this is like an optical illusion in which nearer objects seem larger than distant ones, and that one must correct for this distortion if one is going to plan one’s life rationally. Epicurus, likewise, says that the wise person is willing to forgo some particular pleasure if that pleasure will bring one greater pain in the future. Simply indulging in whatever pleasures are close at hand will ultimately bring one unhappiness.
The texts we have do not allow us to obtain with any degree of confidence the reasons that the Cyrenaics have for their advocacy of the pleasures of the moment. There are at least three plausible speculations, however:
The first reason that the Cyrenaics might have for rejecting long-term planning about one’s pursuits is that they are skeptical about personal identity across time. If all I have access to are momentary, fluctuating experiences, what reason do I have to think that the ‘self’ that exists today will be the same ‘self’ as the person who will bear my name 30 years hence? After all, in most respects, a person at 30 years old is almost completely different from that ‘same’ person at 10, and the ‘same’ person at 50 will also be much changed. So, if what I desire is pleasure for myself, what reason do I have to sacrifice my pleasures for the sake of the pleasures of that ‘other’ person down the temporal stream from myself? Nursing a hangover, or deep in debt, that future self might curse the past self for his intemperance, but what concern is that of mine?
If the Cyrenaics do believe that personal identity does not persist over time, their position would be similar to one espoused by Protagoras in the Theaetetus. Because of the similarities between the Protagorean and Cyrenaic epistemologies, as well as the fact that having such a position would help make sense of the Cyrenaics’ focus on pursuing present pleasures, some scholars have attributed this view of personal identity to the Cyrenaics. However, there is little direct evidence that they held such a view, and the way they describe people and objects seems, indeed, to presuppose their identity across time.
The Cyrenaics may also think that planning for the future, and trying to assure happiness by foregoing present pleasures for the sake of the future, is self-defeating. If this is right, then it is not the case that the Cyrenaics think that future pleasures and pains are unimportant, it is simply that they believe that worrying about the future is futile. One gains happiness, and maximizes the pleasure in one’s life, not by anxiously planning one’s future out, and toiling on behalf of the future, but simply by enjoying whatever pleasures are immediately at hand, without worrying about the long-term consequences.
The Cyrenaics think that “to pile up the pleasures which produce happiness is most unpleasant,” because one will need to be choosing things which are painful for the sake of future pleasures. The Cyrenaics instead aim at enjoying the pleasures that are present, without letting themselves be troubled at what is not present, i.e., the past and future. Epicurus thinks that the memory of past pleasures, and the expectation of future pleasures, are themselves most pleasant, and hence he emphasizes the importance of careful planning in arranging what one will experience in the future. The Cyrenaics, however, deny this, saying that pleasures are pleasant only when actually being experienced.
Finally, the Cyrenaics lack of future-concern may result from radically relativizing the good to one’s present preferences. It’s reported that Aristippus “discerned the good by the single present time alone,” and later Cyrenaics assert that there is no telos–goal or good–to life asa whole; instead, particular actions and desires each aim at some particular pleasure. So the notion of some overall goal or good for one’s entire life is rejected and is replaced by a succession of short-terms goals. As one’s desires change over time, what is good for you at that time likewise changes, and at each moment, it makes sense to try to satisfy the desires that one has at that time, without regard to the desires one may happen to have in the future.
If the Cyrenaics thought that to choose rationally is to endeavor to maximize the fulfillment of one’s present preferences, their position would be analogous to the model of economic rationality put forward by current philosophers like David Gauthier.
In ancient times, the Cyrenaics were among the most dismissive of traditional Greek morality. They say that nothing is just or base by nature: what is just or base is set entirely by the customs and conventions of particular societies. So, for instance, there is nothing in the world or in human nature that makes incest, or stealing, or parricide wrong in themselves. However, these things become base in a particular society because the laws and customs of that society designate those practices as base. You should normally refrain from wrong-doing, not because wrong-doing is bad in itself, but because of the punishments that you will suffer if you are caught.
Many of the stories surrounding Aristippus stress his willingness to do things that were considered demeaning or shocking, like putting on a woman’s robes when the king commands it, or exposing his child to die with no remorse when it was an inconvenience. Although most of these stories are malicious and probably untrue, they do seem to have a basis in the Cyrenaics’ disregard of conventions of propriety when they think they can get away with it. All pleasures are good, they say, even ones that result from unseemly behavior.
The Cyrenaic attitude toward friendship also is consistent with their egoistic hedonism and well outside the traditional attitudes toward friendship. Friendship, according to the Cyrenaics, is entered into for self-interested motives. That is, we obtain friends simply because we believe that by doing so we will be in a better position to obtain pleasure for ourselves, not because we think that the friendship is valuable for its own sake, or because we love our friend for his own sake.
Around the time of Epicurus, a number of offshoot sects of Cyrenaicism sprung up. They seemed to have been concerned mainly with modifying or elaborating Cyrenaic ethics.
Hegesias is an extremely pessimistic philosopher. He maintains that happiness is impossible to achieve, because the body and mind are subject to a great deal of suffering, and what happens to us is a result of fortune and not under our control. Pleasure is good, and pain evil, but life as such is neither good nor evil. It is reported (maybe spuriously) that Hegesias was known as the ‘death-persuader,’ and that he was forbidden to lecture because so many members of his audience would kill themselves after listening to him.
Hegesias stresses that every action is done for entirely self-interested motives, and because of this, he denies that friendship exists. This assumes, of course, that one cannot truly be a friend if one enters into the friendship for entirely self-interested reasons.
Anniceris moderated the extreme psychological egoism of Hegesias. He says that friendship does exist, that we should not cherish our friends merely for the sake of their usefulness to us, and that we will willingly deprive ourselves of pleasures because of our love of our friends.
He also says, however, that our end is our own pleasure, and that the happiness of our friend is not desirable for its own sake, since we feel only our own pleasure, not that of our friend. It is not clear how he makes these different parts of his theory consistent with one another.
Theodorus was a pupil of Anniceris. His main innovation is the rejection of the thesis that pleasure and pain are the things that are intrinsically good and evil. Instead, he says that these are intermediates, and that the experience of joy is the highest good, and the feeling of grief the worst evil. (Theodorus may mean to relegate only bodily pleasures and pains to the status of intermediates, since it is natural to think of joy as a mental pleasure and grief as a mental pain.)
He also believes that friendship does not exist, since wise people are self-sufficient and do not need friends, while the unwise enter into friendship merely to satisfy their needs (and hence are not really friends). He also says that acts like adultery, theft and sacrilege are sometimes allowable, since these acts are not bad by nature, but are simply looked down upon because of societal prejudices, which are engendered in order to keep the masses in line.
None of Cyrenaics’ own writings survive. Thus, in order to reconstruct their views, we need to rely on secondary and tertiary sources which summarize the outlines of Cyrenaic doctrines, or mention the Cyrenaics in passing while discussing some other topic. These sources are not always reliable, and they are often sketchy, so our knowledge of the Cyrenaics is incomplete and tentative. In particular, our sources often mention what the philosophical position of a Cyrenaic is, without recording what his arguments were for that position.
Our main source for Cyrenaic epistemology is Sextus Empiricus, a doctor and Pyrrhonian skeptic who probably lived in the second century A.D. He is a careful and intelligent writer, although he is a fairly late source and is also sometimes polemical. He mentions the Cyrenaics in several places, but his most extended discussion of them occurs in Against the Professors VII 190-200. Another important source for Cyrenaic epistemology is the treatise Against Colotes, by the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 A.D.), a Platonist. The main topic of the essay is an attack on Epicurean epistemology, but Plutarch also deals with the Epicurean criticisms of the Cyrenaics in 1120c-1121e.
Our main source for the lives and ethics of the Cyrenaics is Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century A.D. His 10-book Lives of the Philosophers is a gossipy compendium of what other people have said about the lives and thought of many philosophers. Book 2 includes a discussion of Aristippus and the Cyrenaics. It is stuffed with reports of the Cyrenaics’ scandalous behavior and witty repartee, almost all of which are probably scurrilous, but it also has a valuable summary of the Cyrenaics’ ethical doctrines.
This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it’s a selection of a few recent books and articles to read for those who want to learn more about the Cyrenaics. The books and articles listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.
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Last updated: July 15, 2005 | Originally published: