A distinguished classicist during the reign of the French king Louis XIV, Madame Dacier achieved renown for her translation of Greek and Latin texts into French. Her translation of Homer’s Iliad (1699) and Odyssey (1708) remains a monument of neoclassical French prose. In defending Homer during a new chapter of the literary quarrel between the ancients and the moderns, Dacier developed her own philosophical aesthetics. She insists on the centrality of taste as an indicator of the level of civilization, both moral and artistic, within a particular culture. Exalting ancient Athens, she defends a primitivist philosophy of history, in which modern society represents an artistic and ethical decline from its Hebrew and Hellenic ancestors. A proponent of Aristotle, Dacier defends the Aristotelian theory that art imitates nature, but she adds a new emphasis on the social character of the nature that art allegedly imitates. In her philosophy of language, she explores the nature and value of metaphor in evoking spiritual truths; she also condemns the rationalist critique of language which dismisses the fictional or the analogous as a species of obscurantism. The Bible’s robust use of metaphor has established a literary as well as a spiritual norm for Christian civilization. Against modern censors of classical literature on the grounds of obscenity, Dacier defends the pedagogical value of the classics, especially the epics of Homer, in forming the moral character and even the piety of those who avidly study them.
Born in Preuilly-sur-Claise on August 5, 1647, Anne Le Fèvre was raised in the city of Saumur in the Loire region of central France. Her father, Tanneguy Le Fèvre, was a professor of classical languages at a local academy. Under her father’s tutelage, Anne Le Fèvre quickly learned Latin and Greek and demonstrated a precocious skill for the translation of the classics into French. Her adolescent marriage in 1664 to the publisher of her father’s works, Jean Lesnier, rapidly deteriorated; the embittered spouses agreed to a permanent separation.
After the death of her father in 1674, Madame Le Fèvre Lesnier enjoyed the patronage of Pierre-Daniel Huet, a royal tutor to the French dauphin and the future bishop of Avranches. A member of the Académie française, the scholarly cleric introduced her to the controversies surrounding Descartes in contemporary French philosophy. Originally a supporter of Cartesianism, Huet would turn decisively against it in his Critique of Cartesian Philosophy (1689). Huet encouraged Le Fèvre Lesnier’s move to Paris and commitment to a scholarly life devoted to the translation of the classics.
Published in 1674, her first translation, an edition of Callimachus, received the acclaim of fellow classicists. The Duke of Montausier, the overseer of the dauphin’s education, then invited Le Fèvre Lesnier to contribute translations to the series ad usum Delphini (“for the use of the dauphin”) which he had initiated. Her editions of Publius Annius Florus (1674), Sextus Aurelius Victor (1681), Eutropius (1683), and Dictys of Crete (1684) spread the fame of the series far beyond the court circles for which it had been originally designed. Le Fèvre Lesnier also published independent translations of Anacreon (1681), Sappho (1681), Terence (1683), Plautus (1683), and Aristophanes (1684). The emergence of a provincial woman as France’s preeminent classicist made Madame Le Fèvre Lesnier a celebrity in the literary salons of Paris. Padua’s Academy of Ricovrati elected her to membership in 1679.
Shortly after the death of her separated husband, Anne Le Fèvre Lesnier married fellow classicist André Dacier, a former student of her father, in 1683. A year later, the couple retired to Castres in order to devote themselves to theological study. Originally Protestants, both Monsieur and Madame Dacier decided to embrace Catholicism. When they formally entered the Catholic Church in 1685, Louis XIV granted the couple a royal pension in recognition of their conversion.
In the following years, Madame Dacier published new translations of Plautus, Aristophanes, and Terence and collaborated with her husband on several translations, notably new French versions of Plutarch and Marcus Aurelius. These translations of ancient Stoic authors reflected Madame Dacier’s sympathy for neo-Stoicism and her opposition to neo-Epicureanism in the philosophical debates of the period. The literary skill and classical erudition of Madame Dacier earned her the praise of France’s most influential literary critic, Nicolas Boileau.
In 1699, Madame Dacier published her major work, a French translation of Homer’s Iliad. Her version of Homer’s Odyssey followed in 1708. Widely acclaimed as both faithful translations and graceful examples of French prose, the books re-ignited the long-simmering querelle des anciens et des modernes. Siding with the “ancients,” Dacier defended the superiority of classical literature, notably the epics of Homer, over the literary products of modern France. Supporting the “moderns,” Antoine Houdar de la Motte published his own version of Homer in 1714, in which he radically altered the text to suit modern sensibilities and in which he criticized the stylistic and moral flaws of Homer compared with the poetry of modern France. In the same year, Madame Dacier published her major treatise on the question: Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste. The work lambasted La Motte’s translation of Homer and provided a point-by-point refutation of his critique of antiquity. The lengthy treatise also permitted Dacier to declare her philosophical allegiance to Aristotle on artistic questions and to present her own philosophy of art and language.
Even the clergy divided in this new chapter of the querelle. Supporting La Motte, Abbé Terrasson claimed that with its superior knowledge of the world, due to the philosophy of Descartes and technological progress, modern French culture had produced a superior literature. Defending Dacier, Bishop Fénelon argued that classical literature remained superior to the uneven literary achievements of modern France.
When the Jesuit Jean Hardouin proposed a new system for interpreting Homer, Madame Dacier refuted it in her second major theoretical work: Homer Defended against the Apology of Father Hardouin, or the Sequel to the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1716). This treatise reconfirmed her commitment to a neo-Aristotelian theory of art and literary exegesis. It also expanded the grounds for defending the moral and artistic superiority of ancient civilization.
Madame Dacier died at the Louvre on August 17, 1720.
The works of Madame Dacier divide into two categories: translations from classical languages and polemical treatises.
The major translations cover the genres of history, drama, lyrical poetry, and epic. The histories include translations of the history of Rome by Publius Annius Florus (70-140); the history of Rome by Sextus Aurelius Victor (320-390); the history of Rome by Etropius (the fourth century historian of Julian the Apostate); and the chronicle of the Trojan wars by Dictys of Crete (author of a highly fictionalized alleged eyewitness account of the war, known through a fourth-century Latin translation by Q. Septimius). This emphasis on military and political history reflects the type of education deemed appropriate for France’s dauphin.
The dramas include translations of the comedies of Aristophanes (446-386 B.C.E.), Plautus (254-184 B.C.E.), and Terence (195-159 B.C.E.). The lyrical poetry includes the epigrams of the Alexandrian poet Callimachus (310-240 B.C.E.), the verse of Anacreon (570-488 B.C.E.), and the love poems of Sappho (620-570 B.C.E.). The alleged licentiousness of many of these authors appealed to the more libertine salons and sharpened the controversy over the appropriateness of a woman engaged in publication.
It was in the genre of the epic that Madame Dacier achieved her greatest fame. Her translation of the Iliad in 1699 established her as a master of neoclassical French style as well as confirming her reputation as a preeminent classicist. Her preface to the Iliad, staunchly defending Homer and Hellenistic civilization, helped re-launch the querelle des anciens and des modernes. Her translation of the Odyssey in 1708 achieved similar acclaim from scholars and the general public. Both works underwent numerous re-editions and were frequently used in Francophone secondary schools for courses in literature.
Madame Dacier wrote her two polemical treatises toward the end of her life. On the surface, Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1714) and Homer Defended against the Apology of Father Hardouin, or Sequel to the Causes of the Corruption of Taste (1716) are both occasional works. Both books, however, transcend the immediate disputes of the quarrel over Homer; they permit Dacier to present a neo-Aristotelian theory of art, language, mimesis, and moral education.
The philosophical aesthetics developed by Madame Dacier appears primarily in her treatise Of the Causes of the Corruption of Taste [CCT]. Like other eighteenth-century philosophers, Dacier places the question of taste at the center of aesthetic investigation. She considers a society’s degree of artistic taste to be linked to its degree of moral probity and political order. In her normative judgments, Dacier praises the achievement of ancient Greece and judges modern France as decadent in comparison. Declaring herself a partisan of Aristotle, Dacier defends the mimetic thesis that art imitates nature, but she redefines “nature” to include the psychology of the characters depicted and the predominant traits of the society mirrored in art. Her philosophy of language defends the value of metaphorical speech against the rationalist charge of opacity. For Dacier, classical literature possesses ethical as well as formal value inasmuch as it can encourage the formation of moral and even religious virtues in the character of the modern Christian reader.
For Dacier, taste is a central symptom of the general moral and political quality of society. The capacity of a particular culture to produce and appreciate sublime works of art, especially literary works, indicates the culture’s degree of moral and civic maturity. The decline of literary taste presages a decline in virtue among the youth who are exposed to mediocre art. “If we tolerate false [artistic] principles spoiling the mind and judgment [of young people], there are no more resources left for them. Bad taste and ignorance will finish off this work of leveling. As a result, literature will be entirely lost. And it is literature which is the source of good taste, of politeness, and of all good government” [CCT]. Dacier invokes Plato’s authority in defense of her thesis that civic virtue and vice is tied to the quality of the art and literature habitually diffused among the members of the polis. “This is why Socrates wanted his fellow citizens to commit themselves entirely to the youth and to take great care to prepare and form good subjects for the republic” [CCT]. Through a process of empathetic imitation by its audience, great art, as exemplified by Homer’s epics, encourages the ascent of the moral, social, and political virtues central to civilization.
Fragile and fleeting, artistic taste can easily decline. Dacier designates three principal causes of the corruption of taste: poor education; ignorance of teachers; the laziness and negligence of the pupils themselves. Likeswise, when a society abandons the humanist ideal of an educated public who reads and cherishes the classics in the original languages, the civic virtues nurtured by exposure to the classics will inevitably fade.
Dacier identifies two particular causes of the decline of literature and morality in contemporary France. The first is the omnipresence of licentious literature. “One factor contributing to the corruption of taste consists of these licentious shows which directly attack religion and morals. Their soft and effeminate poetry and music communicates all of their poison to the soul and disables all the nerves of the mind” [CCT]. Not without irony, the translator of Plautus and Aristophanes condemns licentious theater for its weakening of intellectual and moral clarity among its habitual spectators.
The second cause, the vogue of sentimental novels, operates a similar destruction of heroic virtue in its poorly constructed tales of romantic love. “The other cause consists of these frivolous and sentimental works…these false epic poems, these absurd novels produced by ignorance and love. They transform the greatest heroes of antiquity into bourgeois damsels. They so accustom young people to these false characters that they can only tolerate true heroes when they resemble these bizarre and extravagant personages” [CCT]. A public sated with sentimental tales of seduction will have little capacity to understand, let alone practice, the heroic civic virtues represented by the characters of Homeric or Virgilian epic.
Dacier’s analysis of the decline of taste and the related decline of civic culture is inscribed in her primitivist philosophy of history. The most perfect examples of literary style lie in the inspired books of the Bible. “When I read the books of Moses and other sacred authors who lived before the time of Homer, I am not astonished by the great taste which reigns in their writings, since they had the true God as their teacher. One senses that no human production could possibly reach the divine character of these writings” [CCT].
Although pagan, ancient Egyptian culture receives a similar panegyric. “I see that geometry, architecture, painting, sculpture, astronomy, and divination flourished among the Egyptians only a few centuries after the great flood. I see a people convinced of the immortality of the soul and of the necessity of a religion, a people who had a very mysterious and enigmatic theology and who built temples and who gave to Greece her very cult and gods. When I see the ancient monuments which remain from this people, I cannot doubt that good taste must have also reigned in their writings, although this baffles me and I do not know where all of this could have come from” [CCT].
The culture of ancient Greece, in particular the epics of Homer, also miraculously resisted the tendency of civilization to decline artistically and morally since biblical times. “I see in Greece all at once a coup of genius. I see a poet who, two hundred years after the Trojan War and against the degradation imprinted by nature into all the productions of the human mind, combines the glory of invention with that of perfection. He gives us a sort of poem without any previous model, which he had imitated from no one, and which no one has been able to imitate since then. This poem’s story, union and composition of its parts, harmony and nobility of diction, artful combination of truth and falsehood, magnificence of ideas, and sublimity of views has always made it considered as the most perfect work issuing from a human hand” [CCT].
The current disdain for Homer and other classical authors reflects the literary-cultural decadence affecting contemporary France. The loss of the Renaissance humanist’s veneration of the classics indicates a moral and political, as well as artistic, decline for French society. “Everywhere today there reigns a certain spirit [disdainful of the classics] more than capable of damaging literature and poetry. This fact has already caused foreigners to reproach us that we are degenerating away from that good taste we had happily developed in the previous century” [CCT]. For Dacier, the only solution to this cultural decline is the neoclassical one: a renewed study of classical languages and literature, with a new literary effort to imitate classical authors in vernacular works and concomitantly an effort to renew political society through the imitation of the civic virtues exalted by Homer and similar Greco-Roman authors.
Throughout her polemical writings, Madame Dacier cites Aristotle’s Poetics as her primary authority for her thesis that art constitutes the imitation of nature. An oft-cited secondary source for this mimetic theory is Horace’s Art of Poetry. Against rationalists such as La Motte, Dacier insists that great art’s imitation of nature does not consist in the reproduction of what literally exists in the external physical world; rather, it mirrors the acts of the hidden soul and rightly incorporates mythology, hyperbole, and idealization into its portrait of the moral universe.
In imitating nature, literature must focus on what is true. Even in writing fiction, the writer must so manipulate the characters and action that they acquire the qualities of verisimilitude. “I am convinced that a writer writes the true more effectively than he or she does the false. The mind struck by a real object feels it much more forcefully than if it were struck by an object it only creates by itself or that it does not believe to exist” [CCT]. Like all other artists, the poet must draw his or her truth from nature, even if the usual domain of the poet is the spiritual nature of the human soul in conflict rather than the physical landscape.
The poet’s imitation of nature is never the literal reproduction of preexistent physical or moral nature. Embellishment of nature is often obligatory if the poet is to place into proper relief the character of his or her personages. “The exceptional brilliance which the poet [Homer] has given to the valor of this hero [Achilles] has confused them [the critics of Homer]. They didn’t see that this exaggerated valor is there to bring out the nature of his character and not to hide his faults. Poets are like painters. They must make their hero more beautiful, as long as they always conserve the resemblance to the hero and they only add what is compatible with the basic character with which they have clothed their hero” [CCT]. In fashioning the hero who dominates the epic and tragic drama, the author inevitably eliminates and exaggerates certain details of human moral action in order to create a striking moral ideal.
To understand the legitimate freedom of the artist in the imitation of nature, it is crucial to grasp the distinction between history and poetry. Whereas the historian depicts what actually happens, the poet can present the probable or the possible. Whereas the historian focuses on the unique fact, the poet dwells on general human truths. “History writes about only what has happened; poetry writes about what might have or must have happened, either necessarily or probably. History reports on particular things, poetry on general things. That is why poetry has greater moral value than does history. General things interest all human beings while particular things are related only to one human being” [CCT]. In this neo-Aristotelian concept of poetic truth, the freedom of the artist is not unlimited. Poetic license to embellish character or plot cannot trespass the limits of the probable.
The legitimate freedom of the poet can also be grasped by contrasting poetry with politics and other practical arts. The truth expressed in the imaginative world of poetry differs from the truth sought in political judgment. “Aristotle was right to say that ‘that one must not judge the excellence of poetry as one judges the excellence of politics, nor even the excellence of all the other arts.’ Politics and all the other arts seek the true or the possible. Poetry seeks the astonishing and the marvelous as long as it does not clearly shock the sense of what is probable” [CCT].
Even the other fine arts do not enjoy the freedom proper to the poet in his or her evocation of nature inasmuch as they focus their imitation of nature on specific, external objects. “In fact, all the other imitations, those of painting, sculpture, architecture, and all the other arts, aim at the imitation of only one thing” [CCT]. Literature alone imitates the universe of the human moral agent; the legitimate license of the poet flows from the challenge of this elusive, spiritual object of mimesis.
In her refutation of La Motte and other critics of Homer, Dacier defends Homer’s use of mythology and other fictional devices in his presentation of the character of Achilles. In particular, she defends the episode of Achilles with the Phoenix, which La Motte had dismissed as a literary absurdity. Dacier contends that the dialogue with the Phoenix helped to enhance the moral character of the flawed hero. “No one is more convinced than I am that everything which exists in nature is not good to be depicted just because it exists. But I believe that what the Phoenix says [in this passage disputed by La Motte] is not in the nature of the things one should not depict. In all times and in all nations…images depend on customs and on ways of thinking. What Homer is doing here…is still quite natural and quite appropriate to show Achilles’s tenderness. This flows quite logically from the tenderness which the Phoenix just showed him. It even serves to heighten the grandeur of Achilles. What kind of child could this be who would have his tears washed away by someone like the Phoenix, son of a king?” [CCT] The imitation of nature depends on psychological and social context. The depiction of a mythological character like the Phoenix helps to reveal the positive moral traits of Achilles, in particular his tenderness and his king-like dignity. Thus, the fact that such a fictional character does not exist in physical nature does not eliminate its usefulness for illuminating the moral nature of the epic hero. The presence of the Phoenix is also justified, in a similar manner, by the cultural context of the poem’s genesis and setting. The dialogue between the Phoenix and the warrior is perfectly logical within the religious presuppositions of the ancient Greek world. It is this world, not the more skeptical world of eighteenth-century France, which art must imitate in Homer’s poetry.
Like her mimetic theory of art, Dacier’s theory of language contests the rationalist thesis that ideal speech provides a clear one-to-one correspondence between a particular object and its linguistic signifier. Dacier insists on the necessity and value of metaphorical speech, even outside the domain of poetry.
Metaphorical speech often communicates truths which cannot be expressed by more literal speech. The frequent use of analogy is necessary for the effective communication of moral truths which elude reduction to straightforward description. “To depict well the objects of which one speaks, there is no method more certain than to provide images by comparison. Does poetry alone use it? Doesn’t eloquent oration use it just as much? Doesn’t God use it? Aren’t the divine Scriptures full of it? Didn’t Our Lord use it again and again in his discourses?” [CCT] The repeated use of metaphor in the Bible itself confirms the propriety of the recourse to metaphor in various types of religious and secular speech.
Dacier mocks the rationalists like La Motte who condemn metaphorical speech as a species of obscurantism. “Should we say, like these literalist minds, that these [biblical] comparisons illuminate nothing and that it would have been better for the Holy Spirit to have made a plain depiction of these objects than to have had recourse to these misleading similarities?…Should we be so sure that these comparisons are imperfect and that they only serve to confuse matters rather than to clarify them?…Doesn’t one sense the awful impiety of such a position? It is not without reason that Scripture calls impiety ignorance” [CCT]. The effort to eliminate metaphorical speech in favor of more literal language reflects the incapacity to grasp the moral realities and religious mysteries only communicated through elaborate simile. The conceits of Scripture provide the inspired models for this metaphorical use of language to evoke the spiritual.
Rather than being inferior to clear propositional language in revealing the truth, poetry is actually more powerful than philosophy. Homer reveals the capacity of poetry to unveil the true through the use of analogy. “No poet has been more successful than him [Homer] in depicting objects by similarity. Could the most philosophical discourse give a stronger and livelier picture of these objects than the images he draws in the mind through these comparisons?” [CCT] Rather than representing confusion, metaphorical speech in the hands of a master like Homer evokes complex spiritual truths which more prosaic speech cannot express.
Dacier also defends metaphorical speech because it has the power to touch the emotions and will of the reader as well as his or her intellect. Rather than conveying simple information, metaphorical rhetoric possesses a persuasive power absent in more literal forms of communication. The value of metaphorical speech in the moral and religious realms lies in its capacity to shape the action of the moral agent and to convert the sinner.
For Dacier, the study of classical literature is essential to shape the moral character of the members of society, especially its governing elite. Against the criticism that both Greek culture and literature are marked by immorality, Dacier defends the moral probity of classical Greek authors and their capacity to foster virtue in their readers. Against the theological argument that the Greek pantheon and the authors it inspired feature immoral deities, Dacier claims that the theology of classical Greek poetry is closer to that of Christian monotheism than its modern critics would admit.
Homer epitomizes the moral value of the Greek classics. “No philosopher has given greater precepts of morality than has Homer….Everyone [except modern critics] has recognized that the Iliad and the Odyssey art two quite perfect tableaux of human life. With admirable variety, they represent everything that is worthy of praise or blame, that is useful or pernicious, in a word all the evils which madness can produce and all the goods which wisdom can cause” [CCT]. As evidence of Homeric passages promoting virtue, Dacier cites the prudence and wisdom apparent in King Nestor’s discourses in the Iliad and the Odyssey.
According to Dacier, La Motte and other modern critics of Homer have seriously misunderstood the moral structure of Homer’s epics and the classical Greek society they mirror. In particular, they have misconstrued the moral nature of the epic hero Achilles. Rather than being a model for moral imitation by the reader, Achilles is in fact a warning against the destructiveness of the vices of vanity, temerity, and arrogance with which Homer has clothed his character. Dacier cites her philosophical guide Aristotle in this interpretation of Achilles as a salutary warning against vice. “Did Aristotle ignore the continual emotional eruptions of Achilles? Where did Aristotle consider them a virtue? Undoubtedly, he made us see that the character of Achilles must represent not what a man does in anger, but rather everything anger itself can do. Consequently, he considered this hero the brutal opposite of the man who does good” [CCT]. The modern dismissal of classical Greek literature as morally damaging is based upon such basic misinterpretations of the moral character of the epic and tragic hero.
Dacier defends the theological as well as the moral probity of Homer’s epics. Against the common Christian charge that classical literature features a pantheon of violent, vicious deities, she insists that Homer actually provides a portrait of God and of the human soul which accords with the biblical prophets and apostles on numerous points. “Homer recognizes one superior God, on which all the other gods are dependant. Everywhere he supports human freedom and the concept of a double destiny so necessary to harmonize this freedom with predestination; the immortality of the soul; and punishments and rewards after death. He recognized the great truth that human beings have nothing good which they have not received from God; that it is from God that comes all the success in what they undertake; that they must request this happy outcome by their prayers; and that the misfortune which occurs to them is called down by their folly and by the improper use they make of their freedom” [CCT]. Given its sound theology and moral psychology, the epics of Homer and similar classical Greek works of literature can nurture the theological as well as the moral virtues essential for a Christian political order.
Since the late seventeenth century, Madame Dacier has been recognized as a preeminent classicist and translator. The essayist Madame de Lambert praised her contemporary for having contradicted anti-intellectual stereotypes of women. “I esteem Madame Dacier infinitely. Our sex owes her a great deal. She has protested against the common error which condemns us to ignorance. As much as from contempt as from an alleged superiority, men have denied us all learning. Madame Dacier is an example proving that we are capable of learning. She has associated erudition with good manners.” [New Reflections on Women, 1727]
Dacier received philosophical as well as literary recognition. Gilles Ménage dedicated his History of Women Philosophers (1690) to Dacier under the accolade of “the most erudite woman in the present or the past.” In his Philosophical Dictionary (1764), Voltaire argued that “Madame Dacier was no doubt a woman superior to her sex and she has done a great service to letters.” Countless encyclopedias of women authors cite Dacier for her erudition and scholarly productivity but her philosophical reflection has received comparatively little attention.
Recent scholarship has continued this literary rather than philosophical focus on Dacier. Garnier (2002), Hayes (2002), and Moore (2002) examine questions of translation during the querelle des anciens et des modernes. Bury (1999) studies Dacier in the context of the role of women intellectuals in the period.
The challenge for a philosophical interpretation of Dacier is to analyze the theories of art, mimesis, language, and education developed in her more theoretical works. There is also the historical challenge to explore the neo-Aristotelianism she defended in the aesthetic rather than the customary metaphysical realm. Her role in diffusing Stoic philosophy through the translations of Plutarch and Marcus Aurelius she co-authored with her husband also merits further study.
All translations from French to English are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 22, 2010 | Originally published: