Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724—1777)

daizhenDai Zhen, also known as Dai Dongyuan (Tai Tung-yuan), was a philosopher and intellectual polymath believed by many to be the most important Confucian scholar of the Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE). He was also the foremost figure among the sophisticated new class of career academics who rose to prominence in the mid-Qing. A prominent critic of the Confucian orthodoxy of the Song and Ming dynasties (known today in the West as “Neo-Confucianism”), Dai charged his predecessors with philosophical errors that had dire moral consequences for their adherents and brilliantly showed them to be rooted in misreadings of the Confucian classics. Chief among these errors was the tendency to understand feelings and desires as being obstacles to proper moral deliberation and action, a view that Dai saw as opening to the door to frictionless moral judgments, free of calculations of benefit or harm and not responsible to the felt responses of others. Dai aimed to restore feelings and desires to prominence by assigning a central place to sympathetic concern (shu) in moral deliberation. He thus reconceived the fundamental nature of the Neo-Confucian universe in a way that explained moral claims in terms of the human affects. He accomplished this dramatic reconfiguration of the Neo-Confucian thought against the backdrop of social institutions that showed little enthusiasm for, and sometimes outright hostility to, his philosophical endeavors.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Moral Agency
    1. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account
    2. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation
  3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation
  4. Metaphysics and Metaethics
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Born in 1724 to a poor cloth merchant of Anhui province, Dai Zhen emerged from an unlikely educational background, attending local schools because his father could not afford the customary private tutorials. By the time Dai was eighteen, however, his genius and scholarly accomplishment had won him the acclaim of his elders and shortly thereafter the backing of a reputable literary scholar in his own clan. Bolstered by a series of endorsements and his own evident academic success, Dai came under the tutelage of the famous classicist Jiang Yong (1681-1762), through whom he became acquainted with many figures in the thriving community of mid-Qing academics. Dai soon proved to be not just a precocious and prolific scholar but a versatile one as well. His 1753 commentary on the Poetry Classic was finished contemporaneously with his first major work in phonology, and both followed closely on the heels of a celebrated treatise in mathematics. Although Dai’s interest in philosophical topics was evident quite early, he did not finish his best-known treatises in this field of intellectual endeavor until late in life, the two most important being On the Good (Yuan Shan) and An Evidential Study of the Meaning and Terms of the Mencius (Mengzi ziyi shuzheng). Between these it is the Evidential Study that is generally regarded as his masterwork, being widely appreciated for its sophistication and rigor. By his own account, hisEvidential Study was his greatest labor of love. Several of the last years of his life were spent writing and revising it, and it is likely that he would have continued to revise the work if it were not for his untimely death 1777.

Dai became a leading figure in the dominant new philological or evidential studies (kaozheng) movement, partly because of his interest in mathematics, calendrical studies, and ancient languages and partly because of his exacting standards of argument. Yet Dais relationship to the philological movement was an uneasy one. Like other philological thinkers, he shared an interest in using hard evidence and careful exegesis to reconstruct the language and practices of the ancients. He also shared with many of them the deep conviction that the orthodox Confucianism of Zhu Xi (1130-1200), which by his time had reigned for several centuries, was thoroughly contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist ideas and needed to be corrected with the tools of evidential scholarship. But Dais contemporaries in philological studies tended to believe that the misreadings and obfuscations of orthodox Confucianism were an inevitable part of theoretical speculation about the meanings and principles (yili) of the classics. For Dai, in contrast, the purpose of evidential studies was to reconstruct the meanings and principlesincluding the ethics and metaphysicsof the Confucian canons ancient authors.

This difference of opinion regarding the study of meanings and principles appears to have led Dai to part with his philological contemporaries in two crucial ways. First, while the professional scholars of his time increasingly valued specialization in certain subfields such as astronomy or geography, Dai nevertheless remained a devoted generalist, seeing all of the various disciplines as potentially working together to reconstruct the often highly theoretical meanings of terms and moral practices contained in the classics. Second, while Dais contemporaries believed it was his contributions in fields such as phonology and mathematics that made him the most formidable scholar of his time, Dai himself believed his greatest contributions to be his treatises on such theoretical topics as human nature, metaphysics, and (especially) moral deliberation and cultivation. In his own lifetime Dais highest accolade was a prestigious position on the staff that compiled the Complete Collection of the Four Treasuries (Sikuquanshu) for the Imperial Librarya collection of classic texts that heavily favoredworks of philological interest. Admirers in Dais own era regarded his treatises on meanings and principles as a monumental waste of time, and most of his early biographers barely mentioned such work, even though it became the central focus of his thought and efforts by the end of his life. But while Dais more speculative labors may have been judged harshly in the mid-Qing, his own appraisal of his work and its importance has been vindicated by later scholars. He has come to be hailed as the foremost representative of Qing dynasty philosophy and is routinely presented as such in surveys of Chinese thought.

2. Moral Agency

a. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account

Dai presents his best-known philosophical work, the Evidential Study, as an indictment of Neo-Confucianism. Of particular concern to him is the reigning orthodoxy of Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Zhu Xi (1130-1200), whose thought had been deeply embedded in China’s governing institutions for centuries, and whose very moral and metaphysical language had come into popular use. At the heart of Dai’s critique is an array of worries about the Neo-Confucian picture of moral agency, where acting well is conceived primarily as a matter of freeing certain native, spontaneous instincts from the influence of feelings and desires. Of particular concern to Dai is the view that merely by eliminating or paring away such feelings and desires one can somehow become a good moral agent. As Dai sees it, this view neglects not just the deliberative, non-spontaneous work that one must do in order to act well, but also the crucial role that affects should play in those deliberations. Thus his critique is aimed in particular at the idea that our native instincts, once freed of the influence of our feelings and desires, are somehow “complete and self-sufficient”—adequate by themselves to give proper moral guidance (Evidential Study, ch. 14, 27).

In Dai’s view, this Neo-Confucian account is factually wrong, and as such does profound injustice to the role that education and cultivation should have in the development of the moral understanding. If we see our work in moral self-cultivation as primarily subtractive or eliminative—as a matter of overcoming bad feelings and desires so as to let the refined parts of the nature act of their own accord—then, Dai maintains, it makes no sense to think of moral education as contributing to the growth and maturation of the moral understanding. What we learn in the process of study (xue) might be understood as having instrumental value, helping to free us from the grip of our bad dispositions and realize the dormant moral sensibilities in ourselves, but once that is accomplished the content of our knowledge would seem to play noconstitutive part in moral comprehension. It is this demotion of education to mere instrument that the erudite Dai Zhen finds to be deeply mistaken. When we learn from the classics, he argues, they have a transformative effect on the faculty of the understanding (xinzhi), helping it to see the morally salient features of one’s life more clearly and respond more appropriately (ch. 14). Just as the nourishment of food and water actually becomes a part of the thing it is meant to nourish, he maintains, so too do the contributions of one’s education become, in a psychological analogue to digestion, a part of the understanding (ch. 9, 26).

Dai is particularly troubled by the pernicious effects the Neo-Confucian account has on its adherents—and, after centuries of Neo-Confucian orthodoxy, on popular culture as well. When the account is strictly followed, he argues, it does not allow the feelings of others to have the right kind of purchase on our own moral evaluations and judgments. If the principal work of moral action lies in eliminating meddlesome emotions, Dai argues, then our deliberations could not be informed by personal acquaintance with the feelings of others (the kind we get from imagining ourselves asthe other person, which is presumably distinct from the kind we get by inferring merely from general rules or observational data). The sentiments stirred by such an acquaintance would be seen as interfering with the authentic expression of the good natural instincts within oneself. Left unchecked by a proper understanding of the felt responses of others, however, Dai maintains that a person’s moral conclusions are at best subjective “opinions” (yijian) and not what Dai calls “invariant norms” (buyi zhi ze)—so named because they represent views that could under ideal circumstances attain a kind of universal agreement across all times and places (ch. 4, 42). In several remarkable passages, Dai writes movingly about the abuses of power that such a doctrine would condone when adopted by those in a position to impose their decisions on the weak or institutionally disadvantaged, unconstrained by the feelings of the helpless people most affected by such decisions (ch. 5, 10).

Another pernicious feature of the Neo-Confucian account, and for Dai Zhen the most alarming one, is that it prevents proper consideration of benefits and harms from figuring in one’s moral deliberations. This problem inspires Dai’s most passionate remarks, as he notes repeatedly how the Neo-Confucian view would blind its adherents to the detrimental effects of their own actions. Unable to consult their desires, he argues, moral agents would have no practicable way of discerning what really matters to the well-being of others (nor, he hints, would they even be capable of recognizing what would or would not contribute to their own well-being). Combined with the first worry, about the inability of others’ claims to suitably inform one’s own personal deliberations, this leaves agents in what Dai describes as “a state of profound blindness,” unable to know what behaviors qualify as good and incapable of being alerted to their mistakes by others (ch. 4). When the doctrine of native self-sufficiency is deeply embraced, Dai concludes, “its harm is great, and yet no one is able to be aware of it” (ch. 43).

b. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation

Dai Zhen’s corrective for the shortcomings of the Neo-Confucian view (and its Daoist and Buddhist forebears) is an emotional attitude known as “shu,” whose meaning for Dai most closely approximates what we might call “sympathy” or “sympathetic concern.” The characteristic way of exercising shu, for Dai, is to imagine oneself in another’s shoes and so ask what one might desire if one were that person. By reconstructing another person’s desires one can better appreciate the extent to which certain states of affairs would benefit or harm that person. Dai assumes that some simulation of desires (and resultant feelings) is necessary to take proper account of potential benefits and harms, and he insists that the desire-averse picture of moral action upheld by the Neo-Confucians rules out such an exercise from the start. Thus he concludes that the Neo-Confucian picture is unable to fulfill what he takes to be a fundamental demand of any viable account of moral deliberation.

Not just any exercise of shu will provide reliable information about human well-being. For Dai, as for most other Confucian thinkers, shu can be done well or poorly. Given the rather cerebral form of moral cultivation Dai advocates, he believes that most moral agents need a great deal of education before they can make truly informed judgments. Even with this caveat in mind, however, Dai’s critics and occasionally his admirers have often constructed accounts of shuthat make it all too easy to dismiss.

One temptation for those whose intuitions are driven by the English word “sympathy” is to see Dai as advocating an exercise in mirroring or replicating the psychological states of others, especially their desires. If this were the case, shu would seem a poor indicator of the mirrored person’s well-being, since the person may well want things that are bad for her. But in fact Dai’s account of shu leaves it open to the moral agent to simulate counterfactual psychological states. Strictly speaking, Dai understands shu as the act of “taking oneself and extending it to others” (ch. 15), leaving it to the agent to judge which states would be the appropriate ones to synthesize.

A more common temptation is to say that Dai advocates bringing whatever desires we happen to have into our sympathetic reconstruction of the other’s point of view. If I am a solitary type of person, presumably, then I am to imagine others with the same preference for solitude. But this interpretation leaves Dai vulnerable to the charge of sympathetic paternalism, whereby one reconstructs another’s point of view on the basis of affective predispositions that are not the other’s. If this is how shu is supposed to work, then it would again seem a flawed measure of well-being, for others might benefit a great deal more from friendship and company than I, for instance.

The problem with this reading is that it assigns shu no critical role in selecting the desires that are to be synthesized. Just as the first interpretation depicts shu as naïvely mirroring or replicating the wants of another, the second depicts it as naïvely adopting one’s own wants, with no regard to whether these are true indicators of the other’s well-being. In fact, there is considerable evidence that Dai Zhen, at least in his more cogent moments, understands shu as being much more selective than either of these models would suggest. More than just imagining others with the same desires that one happens to have, Dai also sees shu as helping to identify the desires that really matter for welfare in the first place, which he understands as the desires that contribute to “life” (sheng) or “the fulfillment of life” (sui sheng). These are the basic desires which, upon sufficient reflection, we find that we all share—a common core that belong to what Dai sometimes characterizes as “the ordinary human feelings” (ren zhi changqing) and more often describes as the “true feelings” (qing) (ch. 5). In using shu, Dai suggests, one finds similarities that cut across distinctions in power or position: “If one genuinely returns to oneself and reflects on the true feelings of the weak, the few, the dull, the timid, the diseased, the elderly, the young, the orphaned, or the solitary, can those [true feelings] of these others really be any different from one’s own?” (ch. 2).

While there is evidence to suggest that Dai sees shu as having a robust role in selecting desires, it is less clear what the precise mechanism of selection is supposed to be. Possibly the very exercise of constructing a new point of view is supposed to help free one of the clutter of one’s own misguided or excessively idiosyncratic predilections. And Dai probably sees the special care or concern for a person inherent in shu as drawing attention to the desires that really matter to her, much in the way that grief or love draw attention to the features of a person to which the griever or lover is most attached. Dai also hints that there should be some sort of comparative exercise in shu, where one reconstructs the emotional reactions of others and measures them against those that one would have oneself under similar circumstances.

However Dai understands shu to work in detail, he is emphatic about its use as a form of moral deliberation. So understood, Dai suggests, it relies upon our desires in ways incompatible with the Neo-Confucian account of moral agency. His criticisms point to at least two such ways. First, proper moral action as Dai conceives of it requires that we use our desires in the process of deliberation. Second, it requires that we have a certain baseline of dispositions to want the right things. In other words, moral deliberation requires that we “have desires” both in an occurrent sense (as when I am described as actively feeling some inclination to eat good food) and in a dispositional sense (as when I am described as the kind of person who wants good food, even if I am presently working on an essay and not thinking about food at all). Thus, Dai’s picture of moral agency conflicts with the Neo-Confucian account not just in how it envisions moral deliberation but also in its conception of the kind of person that a good moral agent should be. Dai maintains that good human beings should have robust dispositions to desire beneficial things, which in turn requires that they have a healthy interest in their own well-being or life-fulfillment. Without the desire to “fulfill one’s own life,” Dai contends, one will “regard the despairing conditions of others with indifference” (ch. 10). Dai thus unabashedly asserts that even self-interested desires should figure prominently in the life of the virtuous moral agent.

3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation

Like most Confucian philosophers, Dai Zhen shows a great deal of interest in the moral proclivities of human nature, a topic which by his time had long taken its bearings from Mencius’ (391-308 BCE) famous claim that the natural dispositions are good, and Xunzi (310-219 BCE) equally renowned polemic against this Mencian view. Although Dai is not alone in taking up this particular debate between Mencius and Xunzi, it nevertheless presents him with an important opportunity to sort through an apparent tension in his work, for it is Mencius that Dai takes to speak with final authority, and yet many of Dai’s own views carry an undisguised debt to Xunzian thinking about the relationship between nature, agency, and self-cultivation. Unlike most major figures who have weighed in on the Mencius-Xunzi debate, then, Dai has an interest in confirming much of Xunzi’s position while showing with great care and nuance how Xunzi’s views can be rendered compatible with the thesis that human dispositions are good by nature.

The parts of Xunzi’s doctrine that resonate most deeply with Dai Zhen concern the need to reshape the natural dispositions. If they are already more or less good, Xunzi reasons, it is hard to see why we would need an education that in any meaningful way transforms them. Our nature would already provide adequate or nearly adequate resources for moral self-improvement. Furthermore, Xunzi is plausibly read as upholding a picture of moral cultivation where the heart-and-mind must often overrule the desires, directing the body to act in ways contrary to the tug of one’s felt inclinations.

Like Xunzi, Dai is particularly concerned to develop a picture of the natural dispositions that would countenance a transformative account of self-cultivation. After all, one of the centerpieces of his philosophical work is a critique of the Neo-Confucian account of cultivation as merely subtractive or eliminative—as helping us to remove the bad parts of our nature, but forming no constitutive part of the cultivated self. Dai also shares with Xunzi the presupposition that this transformation requires some sort of power by the heart-and-mind to overrule the desires, and even uses language nearly identical to Xunzi’s to describe the mechanism of control—likening the heart-and-mind to the ruler (jun) of the body in that it issues orders of “permission or denial” (ke fou) to act on the desires of the latter (ch. 8). Thus Dai believes both that our dispositions begin in need of a great deal of reshaping and that one’s heart-and-mind must often resist the pull of the natural dispositions in order to reshape it.

One can consistently maintain this view while upholding the doctrine of natural goodness, Dai thinks, simply by acknowledging that there are parts of one’s nature that are not manifest in the raw, pre-cultivated state. Dai recognizes (as is now routinely observed) that much of Xunzi’s argument depends on a narrow understanding of “nature,” by which anything that appears before the deliberate activity of moral education is considered natural, and anything that appears afterwards is a product of human artifice. But Dai insists that one’s nature consists of latent capacities as well, potentialities which may not always be immediately manifest but which could nevertheless be said to be part of one’s nature, or in one’s nature, as the potential to grow into a peach tree is in the pit of a peach (ch. 25, 29).

In saying this, Dai takes himself to be making a much stronger and more capacious claim than one might think, for if human beings have in their nature the potential to become good, Dai believes, then this happy outcome could be brought about only by building upon nascent goodness, or virtues, already in existence. In other words, if we are to be capable of both understanding the good and being motivated by it, then we must already have some germ of moral understanding and some ability to delight in the good, even if these moral buds have no discernable effect on our behavior. This is because, as Dai puts it, moral inquiry and study are to one’s moral capacities as the nutritive powers of food and drink are to the material endowments of the body: one cannot use them to nurture or grow their intended objects unless some budding form of that object already exists (ch. 26).

This particular move in Dai’s argument might seem controversial. It assumes, after all, that the operations of moral inquiry and study really are like the nurturing of something that already exists, and not, for example, like the procreation or generation of something entirely new. But underlying this argument is a larger commitment to a picture of moral education as always building on some prior ability to appreciate the relevant norms, and it may have been this commitment that in the end makes the Xunzian account of the natural dispositions untenable in Dai’s eyes. For Dai, even at the earliest stages one learns by drawing upon one’s pre-existing grasp of propriety (li) and righteousness (yi), enlarging and expanding upon the understanding that one already has. In contrast, for Xunzi (as Dai reads him), those who aspire to goodness must start from scratch, without the benefit of nascent tendencies to appreciate the good (ch. 25-26).

4. Metaphysics and Metaethics

Most accounts of Dai Zhen’s place in the history of Chinese philosophy focus on his contributions to the ongoing dispute about the ontological status of li (pattern, principle) and qi (vital energy, material force), the two things most often proposed as the fundamental constituents of the universe in later Confucian metaphysics. Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi were arguably dualists about li and qi, acknowledging that the two could not exist apart from one another, but also seeing them as mutually irreducible. By contrast, Dai’s treatises seek to explain away the phenomena and the canonical terminology that strike so many of his predecessors as referencing irreducible notions of li, often by recasting them as references to the cyclical movements of yin and yang, or as particular arrangements of emotions or material bodies—all of these being typically understood as qi-based phenomena. Dai never declares himself a monist about qiin any unambiguous way,but he nevertheless devotes himself to showing how conceptions of the former should be explained in terms of the latter, and he is now frequently cited for the philological ingenuity and argumentative creativity that he brought to bear against Zhu Xi’s dualism.

As the great synthesizer of Neo-Confucian thought, Zhu Xi understands li as the cosmological patterns or principles that both make a thing the kind of thing it is (e.g., a human being rather than a goat) and determine the norms to which a thing should conform (e.g., serving one’s family, being of sound mind, and so on). Proper accounts of a thing’s kind and its norms should, Zhu believes, ultimately appeal to these patterns, not to the endowment of qi—the stuff that makes up one’s body and embodied feelings and desires—that a thing happens to have. Zhu understands li both as patterns that belong to the cosmos as a whole and, as Dai is fond of pointing out, as formless things that somehow exist inside all concrete individuals, including the heart-and-mind of every human being. These internalized li are, for Zhu, the “parts” or “manifestations” (fen) of the cosmological li, which implies in turn that the patterns belonging to each concrete individual are produced by (and thus harmonize with) the patterns that govern Heaven and Earth.

Dai Zhen’s trenchant criticism of the metaphysical picture offered by Zhu and other Neo-Confucians is that they wrongly took li and qi to be “two roots” (er ben)—that is, they mistakenly saw li as being “rooted” separately from qi (ch. 19). This critique encapsulates two general sorts of errors that he finds in the thought of his Neo-Confucian predecessors. The first is their tendency to see li as being separately “rooted” in the sense of having independent causal power. For example, Dai never embraces the view that the liare somehow responsible for making an individual thing the kind of thing it is. If li have anything to do with distinguishing between kinds, he maintains, it is simply because they represent the fine-grained features of things that we use to identify what kind they are, not the causal agent that makes them what they are (ch. 1). Similarly, he takes issue with the Neo-Confucian assertion that there is some li-based cosmological force that gives rise to qi’s tendency to fluctuate between two extremes (yin and yang). For Dai, the term for this purported cosmological force, known from the Classic of Change as “extreme polarity” or “taiji,” simply describes or names the fundamental oscillation in the cosmic qi. It is not a distinct force that makes the qi move as it does (ch. 18).

The second sense in which Dai’s predecessors see li as separately “rooted” is in conceiving of it as having independent explanatory power, such that one could give an adequate account of li without appealing to qi. The consequences of this sort of error are most apparent in moral claims. For Zhu Xi, to say that someone’s behavior is virtuous or good is to say that it is a proper expression of the li in her, which means in turn that it is a proper expression of some natural endowment of patterning imbued in her heart-and-mind by Heaven. Dai sees this as the wrong sort of story to tell, not just because it presupposes the existence of an unlikely causal agent (the formless “li” of the individual heart-and-mind), nor because he rejects the view that our Heavenly-endowed nature is predisposed in some small way to recognize and delight in the good (in fact, Dai seems to accept some version of this picture). Rather, Dai sees it as mistaken because it has nothing to do with why such behavior is good. Dai’s own preferred account invokes not the proclivities of Heaven as a basis for moral claims, but instead the proper arrangement of such worldly qi-based things as emotional dispositions and desires. Things are in accordance with their proper patterns, Dai asserts, when “the feelings do not err” (ch. 2).

Ever the attentive classicist, Dai traces much of the confusion he finds in the Neo-Confucian usage of “li” to a subtle misreading of the Confucian canon. In the Confucian classics, Dai notes, when the term “li” is used in its moral sense it tends to refer to the state of things when they are patterned in the right way, or “well-ordered” (tiao li) (ch. 1). Thus to speak of the “li” of something (e.g., a person, a boat) is not to refer to some formless object in that thing, but simply to the perfected state of that thing. The Neo-Confucians run afoul of this original sense of the word in assuming that “li” must denote something like an actual object, existing in esse. In so doing, Dai suggests, they open the door to a very different explanation of how someone becomes a “li” or “well-ordered” version of herself, where what makes her well-ordered is not simply that she has improved upon her feelings and desires in the right way, but that some quasi-object in her has expressed itself in the right way. For Dai, in contrast, it is enough to think of li as the state of things as they ought to be:

The exhaustive grasp of human li is nothing but an exhaustive grasp of what is imperative (biran) in human relations and daily affairs, and that is all. “What is imperative” is to push something to its greatest limit, where it can no longer be altered, and this is to speak of its perfection, not to trace out its root. (ch. 13)

5. Influence

At the time of Dai Zhen’s death he was widely revered for his scholarship in such fields as mathematics and phonology but ignored or dismissed as a philosopher. Among his contemporaries, the best-known admirers of his work on metaphysics and ethics were Hong Bang (1745-1779) and Zhang Xuecheng (1738-1801), though their admiration had little impact on other scholars of the era. Dai’s most successful student and friend, Duan Yucai (1735-1815), wrote a biography of Dai in which he dutifully reported his teacher’s profound devotion to and enthusiasm for his less popular philosophical works. But Duan never shared that enthusiasm and himself worked on conventional philological issues.

Only in the late nineteenth and early twentieth century were Dai’s On the Good and Evidential Study taken up with much interest, notably by reform-minded thinkers such as Zhang Taiyan (1868-1936), Liu Shipei (1884-1919), and Liang Qichao (1873-1929), who were particularly drawn to Dai’s suggestion that Cheng-Zhu thought countenanced abuses of power unchecked by the feelings and desires of the disadvantaged or powerless. Later, with the rise of Marxist thought in China, Dai’s attack on Neo-Confucian li—and his concomitant interest in explaining phenomena in terms of qi—made his work a convenient centerpiece for sweeping narratives about the decline of “idealism” and rise of “materialism” in the Ming and Qing dynasties. To some extent this preoccupation with Dai’s place in the li-qi debate lingers in the literature today, although scholars have increasingly turned to focus on his moral philosophy in its own right. Throughout the last two centuries, Dai has remained one of the chief sources of inspiration to those Confucian scholars who find Song and Ming Confucianism to be unviable or fundamentally contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist concepts. As such, he continues to be regarded as one of the most prominent internal critics of the Confucian tradition today.

6. References and Further Reading

Although the study of Dai Zhen’s life and work has become a minor cultural industry in the last couple of decades, there is still relatively little published material that focuses primarily on his philosophy, and even less that is accessible to those unfamiliar with the exegetical disputes prominent in his day. Readers are encouraged to begin with Feng Youlan and Philip J. Ivanhoe (below), and to make use of general surveys of the history of Chinese philosophy.

  • Chin, Ann-ping, and Freeman, Mansfield. Tai Chen [Dai Zhen] on Mencius: Explorations in Words and Meanings. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • A widely available summary of Dai’s life and thought, with a complete if not always careful translation of Dai’s most important philosophical work, the Evidential Study.
  • Ewell, John W. Reinventing the Way: Dai Zhen’s Evidential Commentary on the Meanings of Terms in Mencius (1777). Berkeley: Ph.D. dissertation in history, 1990.
    • Includes the strongest of the available English translations of Dai’s Evidential Study.
  • Feng Youlan [Fung Yu-lan]. A History of Chinese Philosophy,volume II. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • An English translation of this well-known scholar’s monumental survey of history of Chinese philosophy. The portion devoted to Dai Zhen is replete with ample quotations from Dai’s works.
  • Hu Shi. Dai Dongyuan de zhexue (The Philosophy of Dai Dongyuan). Reprinted in Taipei: Taiwan Shangwu, 1996.
    • An important and thorough if somewhat dated introduction to Dai Zhen’s philosophy and his place in Qing dynasty academics. This edition also includes the full texts of Dai’s On the Goodand Evidential Study,as well as several of his letters.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Dai Zhen.” In Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, 2nd ed. (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2000): 89-99.
    • The best introduction to Dai Zhen’s moral thought in the English language. This work also exhibits the rare virtue (in Dai Zhen studies) of being accessible to those less familiar with classical Chinese language and Neo-Confucianism.
  • Lao Siguang. Xin bian zhong guo zhe xue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy, new edition). Taipei : San min shu ju, 1981.
    • A view of Dai Zhen from one of his more strident critics, presented as the final chapter of a survey of Chinese philosophy. Lao uses little charity in attempting to understand Dai, but his is one of the very few lengthy studies that focuses primarily on the philosophical content of Dai’s views.
  • Nivison, David S. “Two Kinds of ‘Naturalism’: Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng.” In The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy, ed. Bryan Van Norden (Chicago: Open Court, 1996): 261-82.
    • Nivison’s contribution to the academic “cottage industry” in studies of Dai’s influence on Zhang. Like most such studies, this piece is primarily an exercise in intellectual history, but Nivison’s passing summaries of Dai’s views are careful and insightful.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. “Mencius, Xunzi, and Dai Zhen: A Study of the Mengzi ziyi shuzheng.” In Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002): 216-241.
    • An overview of Dai Zhen’s masterwork. This piece is particularly helpful in sorting out Dai’s several ways of understanding the doctrine that human nature is good.
  • Tiwald, Justin. “Dai Zhen on Human Nature and Moral Cultivation.” In the Dao Companion to Neo-Confucian Philosophy, ed. John Makeham (Dordrecht [Netherlands]: Springer, 2009): Ch. 20.
    • An extended overview and analysis of Dai’s ethics.
  • Yu Yingshi. Lun Dai Zhen yu Zhang Xuecheng (On Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng). Taipei: Dong da tu shu gu fen you xian gong si, 1996.
    • Originally published in 1976, this is one of the best Chinese language works on Dai Zhen’s philosophical life and writings, although the focus is on Dai’s influence on Zhang Xuecheng and Qing dynasty academics.

Author Information

Justin Tiwald
Email: jtiwald@sfsu.edu
San Francisco State University
U. S. A.




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