Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Damon (5th C. BCE)

Damon was a Pythagorean philosopher of Syracuse. Damon was a close friend to Phintias the Pythagorean. Dionysius, the tyrant, having condemned Phintias to death for conspiring against him, Phintias begged that leave might be allowed him to go for a short period to a neighboring place, in order to arrange some family affairs, and offered to leave one of his friends in the hands of Dionysius as a pledge for his return by an appointed time, and who would be willing, in case Phintias broke his word, to die in his stead. Dionysius, skeptical as to the existence of such friendship, and prompted by curiosity, assented to the arrangement, and Damon took the place of Phintias. The day appointed for the return of Phintias arrived, and the public expectation was highly excited as to the probable issue of this singular affair. The day drew to a close; no Phintias came; and Damon was in the act of being led to execution, when, of a sudden, the absent friend, who had been detained by unforeseen and unavoidable obstacles, presented imself to the eyes of the admiring crowd and saved the life of Damon. Dionysius was so much struck by this instance of true attachment that he pardoned Phintias, and entreated the two to allow him to share their friendship (Val. Max. iv. 7; Plut. De Amic Mult.).

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