Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, an abbess of the convent of Port-Royal, was a leader of the intransigent party in the Jansenist movement. A prolific author, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean translated her determined opposition to civil and ecclesiastical authorities in the Jansenist controversy into a militant version of the neo-Augustinian philosophy she shared with other Jansenists.
Often citing the works of Saint Augustine himself, the abbess defends a dualistic metaphysics where mental reason opposes the physical senses and where supernatural faith opposes a reason ravaged by strong desires. Her moral theory presents an Augustinian account of virtue: the alleged natural virtues of the classical pagans are only disguised vices; authentic moral virtue can spring only from the theological virtues, infused through God’s sovereign grace. Her epistemology criticizes the exercise of doubt in the religious domain, since such doubt often serves the interests of the civil and religious powers opposed to the Jansenist minority. Power rather than a disinterested search for truth often characterizes dialogues inviting the minority to entertain doubts which will lead the minority to surrender its convictions to the stronger partner. Strongly polemical in character, the writings of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean detail a code of ethical resistance by which an embattled minority can refuse the coercion of the majority through a politics of non-compliance, silence, and spiritual solitude.
Born on November 28, 1624 Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly belonged to a noblesse de robe family prominent at the French court. Her father Robert Arnauld d’Andilly was the superintendent of the estate of the Duc d’Orléans, the brother of Louis XIII; her mother Catherine Le Fèvre de la Broderie Arnauld d’Andilly was the daughter of an ambassador. The family was closely tied to the Parisian convent of Port-Royal and the Jansenist movement with which the convent was allied. Angélique’s aunts Angélique Arnauld and Agnès Arnauld served as Port-Royal’s abbesses during the convent’s reform in the early seventeenth century; her uncle Antoine Arnauld emerged as Jansenism’s leading philosopher and theologian; her uncle Henri Arnauld, bishop of Angers, become one of the movement’s leading defenders in the episcopate. Four other aunts and her widowed grandmother became nuns at Port-Royal; four of her sisters would follow. Her father, one brother, and three cousins would join the solitaires, a community of priests and laymen devoted to meditation and scholarship on the grounds of Port-Royal. Her father would distinguish himself by his translations of Latin Christian classics; her cousin Louis-Isaac Le Maître de Sacy would become France’s leading biblical exegete and translator. From infancy, Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly imbibed the convent’s radical Augustinian philosophy and her family’s taste for patristic literature.
Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly entered the convent school of Port-Royal in 1630. She quickly established herself as an outstanding scholar, renowned for her fluency in Greek and Latin. Madame de Sévigné praised her as a precocious genius; although hostile to Port-Royal, the Jesuit literary critic Réné Rapin praised her grasp of the works and thought of Saint Augustine. Now known as Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean, she pronounced her vows as a nun of Port-Royal in 1644. Authorities confided a series of key convent positions to her: headmistress of the convent school, novice mistress, subprioress. In the 1650s as the dispute over Jansenism intensified, the nun commissioned a series of memoirs by and on the nuns central to the convent’s reform. Apologetic works to prove the convent’s orthodoxy, the memoirs would survive as key literary documents attesting to the personalities and theories of Port-Royal. Although respected for her intellectual and managerial skill, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean did not impress all by her emotional temperament. Even her uncle Antoine Arnauld and her aunt Mère Angélique Arnauld rebuked their niece for what they perceived as an intellectual vanity that often presented itself as icy imperiousness.
When the quarrel over Jansenism turned into “the crisis of the signature,” Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean quickly imposed herself as the head of the most intransigent group of nuns at Port-Royal. In 1661 Louis XIV had declared that all priests, religious, and teacher must sign a formulary that assented to the Vatican’s condemnation of five theological errors allegedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s work Augustinus. Using the droit/fait distinction, Antoine Arnauld had argued that Jansenists could sign the formulary inasmuch as it touched on matters of droit (matters of faith and morals, in this case five theological propositions condemned by the church as heretical) but that they could not assent on matters of fait (empirical fact, in this case the church’s judgment that Jansen himself had defended the heretical propositions). In June 1661 Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean reluctantly signed the formulary but, against her uncle’s advice, added a postscript that indicated the strictly reserved nature of her assent. When the Vatican annulled the reserved signatures and demanded new signatures without any postscript, Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean cleverly added a new preface to the formulary which explained the conditional nature of the assent of the nuns. In face of the nuns’ recalcitrance, authorities took stronger measures against the convent. In 1664 Soeur Angelique was exiled to the convent of the Anonciades, where she lived under virtual house arrest. In 1665 the nun was regrouped with the other nonsigneuse nuns at Port-Royal. Deprived of the sacraments and placed under armed guard, the nuns still managed to maintain surreptitious contact with their external allies through the strategies of Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean. Throughout the period of persecution, the nun bitterly criticized moderates, such as Madame de Sablé, who sought to negotiate a compromise between the Jansenists and their opponents, as well as the minority of nuns who had signed the formularly without reservation. Only with reluctance did she accept the “Peace of the Church” (1669-79), which lifted the sanctions from Port-Royal in return for minor concessions in a modified formularly.
Elected abbess in 1678, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean delivered an extensive cycle of abbatial conferences at Port-Royal. The conferences were largely commentaries on Scripture, the Rule of Saint Benedict, and the Constitutions of Port-Royal. Her extensive correspondence, often promoting the works and theories of Saint Augustine to her spiritual directees, and writings of questions dealing with persecution received a large circulation among laity allied with Port-Royal. In 1679, the persecution of Port-Royal abruptly recommenced. Archbishop François Harlay de Champvallon ordered the closure of the convent’s school and novitiate; without the ability to accept younger members, the convent was doomed to a slow death. The convent’s chaplain and confessors were expelled. Although the nuns were free to pursue their cloistered activities, the newly imposed clerics clearly attempted to convince the nuns to renounce their alleged Jansenist heresies.
During the rest of her abbacy, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean protested the injustice of this new persecution through letters addressed to bishops, courtiers, aristocrats, and ambassadors. Her correspondence with the pope and the king shows her characteristic boldness. Her appeal to Pope Innocent XI is a thinly veiled attack on the Jesuits: “If Your Holiness could finally be informed about all we have suffered, brought about only by the jealousy and malice of certain people against some very learned and very pious theologians, some of whom have participated in the governance of this convent, I am sure that the narrative of these sufferings, which has few parallels in recent centuries, would soften the heart of Your Holiness [L; letter of May 29, 1679 to Pope Innocent XI].” Her protest to Louis XIV is a rebuke of the refusal of the throne to explain on what grounds this new persecution is justified: “Sire, it is the gravest sorrow of those who have such sentiments [of loyalty toward you] to perceive that you see us as something evil, but we have no way to leave this very painful state of affairs since we are not permitted to know what has placed us in this situation and what still keeps us here [L; letter of February 6, 1680 to King Louis XIV].” Despite her protests, the sanctions against Port-Royal remained in place and the aging convent became increasingly isolated.
Still in office as abbess, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly died on January 29, 1684.
In terms of philosophical significance the most important works of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly are the commentaries produced during her abbacy (1678-84). Discourses on the Rule of Saint Benedict gives the ancient monastic rule a radical Augustinian edge by its insistence on the absolute necessity of grace to cultivate any of the moral virtues praised by Saint Benedict. Conferences on the Constitutions of Port-Royal emphasizes the rights of nuns to limited self-government and the right of the abbess to act as the principal spiritual director and theologian of the convent. Reflections to Prepare the Nuns for Persecution, a commentary on Mère Agnès Arnauld’s earlier Counsels, stresses the opposition between the world and the disciple; it limits the moral virtues and spiritual dispositions necessary to resist persecution for the sake of personal conscience.
Other opuscules develop Mère Angélique de Saint Jean’s epistemology and political philosophy. On the Danger of Hesitation and Doubt Once We Know Our Duty analyzes the act of doubt in terms of power relationships. Never neutral, the exercise of self-doubt by a persecuted minority often serves the interests of a majority determined to vanquish the minority and coerce a change in its opinions. Three Conferences on the Duty to Defend the Church argues that authentic religious obedience is not servility; it can express itself by staunch opposition to civil and ecclesiastical authorities when the latter endorse error or illegitimately invade the sanctuary of conscience.
The extensive correspondence of the abbess also indicates how her militant brand of Augustinianism differs from the more moderate version promoted by the clerical advisers of Port-Royal. Her epistolary exchange with her uncle Antoine Arnauld details her opposition to compromise over the issue of the Augustinus and expresses the stark opposition between world and self which she considers the fate of concupiscent humanity.
The abbess’s best known-work, the autobiographical Report of Capitivity, details her house arrest at the Anonciade convent; it illustrates how Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean personally used the techniques of resistance to oppression she champions in her more theoretical works. Discourses of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Called “Miséricordes” provides a radical Augustinian framework for the Port-Royal genre of miséricorde, a type of eulogy for deceased nuns and lay benefactors given by the abbess in chapter. In Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s version, the moral virtues of the deceased are clearly the work of divine grace, not of human will; they are an earnest of the election to which God’s inscrutable sovereignty has summoned them.
Militancy is the salient trait of the philosophy developed by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean. Drawing on the general Augustinian philosophy of Port-Royal, the abbess stresses the stark opposition to the world which should characterize such a philosophy. Her virtue theory conceives the monastic vows as a species of martyrdom against a corrupt society. Her dualistic metaphysics studies the drama of the human will as a war between the opposed loves of self and of God. In her theory of knowledge, the abbess condemns the exercise of doubt as a subtle acquiescence to powerful ecclesiastical and civic authorities who seek to coerce conscience. In analyzing possible material cooperation with the persecutors of the convent, Arnauld d’Andilly insists on resistance rather than compromise as the path of authentic virtue.
In Discourses on the Rule of Saint Benedict [DRSB], Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean provides a commentary on the founding rule of Benedictine monasticism. The commentary develops a theory of virtue which indicates the radical Augustinian moral orientation of the abbess’s moral philosophy. The traditional monastic virtues assume a distinctive Jansenist coloration in the abbess’s treatment of them.
The virtue of obedience, embodied through the monastic vow of obedience to one’s superior, acquires a new necessity because of the radically disordered nature of human reason. In this Augustinian account of human concupiscence, fallen reason is no longer capable of self-governance. “In the original state of creation, there was a perfect relationship between human reason and will. At the present time, however, this is no longer the case. Reason has become an instrument in the hands of self-will, which uses it in an improper and destructive way by arming itself with the false appearances of reason to find justice in injustice itself [DRSB, 243].” The virtue of silence also serves to curb the passions generated by the concupiscent will. “In maintaining silence we mortify vanity, curiosity, self-love, and all the other poisons that use the tongue to spill outside and to encourage their impetuous, disordered movements [DRSB, 267].” Similarly, the virtue of humility, the most prized moral virtue in Benedict’s original rule, is tied by the abbess to the controversial Jansenist doctrine of the small number of the elect. “It is quite certain that only a few will be saved, since one must be saved through humility, which consists in the love of humility and abasement [DRSB, 311].”
The lack of such self-denying moral virtues in the majority of humanity indicates the depth of the depravity of the postlapsarian will. “There is something perverted in humanity: its will….Humanity is wounded because it turned on itself by acting through its own will [DRSB, 326].” In its state of weakness, humanity is utterly dependent on God’s grace to heal its concupiscence and to permit it to exercise its will on behalf of the moral good. “We need God to give us his grace and light. Without this assistance we move away from the path of salvation rather than toward it. We are only shadows by ourselves. We are mistaken about any light we seem to have if it is not God himself who lights our lamps and illumines us [DRSB, 53].” In this Augustinian perspective, all authentic moral virtue is the result of God’s grace, not of human initiative. Alleged natural virtue is an illusion of human pride.
In a distinctive recasting of the Augustinian framework of virtue, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean underscores the militant nature of the moral virtues inspired by grace. The monastic virtue of humility entails martyrdom as the nun confronts a persecutory world. “We are obliged to be in the situation of suffering martyrdom….We do not know what God will expose us to, but we do know that as Christians and as nuns we are called to follow Jesus Christ and Jesus Christ crucified, to carry our cross after him and to renounce ourselves. This cannot be done without suffering [DRSB, 381].” Rather than providing a sinecure from the warfare of a fallen world, the monastic virtues steel the nuns for a spiritual combat demanding the loss of one’s very self.
The Augustinian theory of virtue grounds Mère Angélique de Saint Jean’s ethical code of resistance, developed abundantly in Reflections to Prepare the Nuns for Persecution [RPNP]. A commentary on Mère Agnès Arnauld’s earlier Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain In the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent, the abbess systematically substitutes exhortations to militant resistance for her aunt’s earlier counsels of prudent moderation.
This militant conception of the moral life appears clearly in Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s martial transposition of the theological virtues, the source of all authentic moral virtue. The virtue of faith is no longer the simple assent of the mind to the truths revealed by God; it is a militant witness to the truth of this revelation through long-suffering combat. “It is faith that supports us in all our afflictions. Only on faith can we lean for the hope of our salvation. It obliges us to believe in the mercy of God and to have recourse to this mercy in all our difficulties [RPNP, 20].” Interpreted from a neo-Platonic dualistic perspective, this combative faith opposes the intellectual and moral inclination of the senses. “We are everywhere in our senses. If we are not careful, we follow their judgment rather than that of faith….Our faith should penetrate all the veils that fall before our eyes [RPNP, 288].” It combats the passions, which can easily induce the believer to flee her moral duties during persecution. “Faith lifts us up and makes us the master of our passions, while love for ourselves makes us slaves of an infinite number of masters, under whose domination we lose, if we are not careful, the true freedom of the children of God [RPNP, 168].” Echoing the fideism of Sant-Cyran, the abbess argues that faith must oppose reason itself, when this all too human reason rationalizes away the persecution that is the price of witness to the truth. “There is still one thing essential to make our suffering perfect: to arm ourselves against the reasoning of the human mind opposed to the principles of faith, which teaches us to find glory in disdain, riches in poverty, life in death [RPNP, 160].” In this martial recasting of the theological virtues, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean condemns fear as the most dangerous of the passions and cowardice as the gravest of the vices.
To endure persecution by the opponents of Port-Royal, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean constructs a code of resistance to the oppressive authorities which is more rigorous than the supple code proposed by her aunt earlier in the persecution. Whereas Mère Agnès had argued that nuns should largely follow the directives given by superiors in a foreign convent, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean counsels strict non-compliance. Whereas her aunt had recommended limited communications with certain appointed confessors and lecturers, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean insists on determined refusal. The abbess stresses in particular the need to refuse dialogue with all the imposed authorities. Although apparently innocent, the purpose of such dialogue is to break the convictions of the persecuted nun and coerce her into surrender. “People who find themselves removed from all occupations can easily become too preoccupied with considering only the faults and imperfections of their past life…They permit themselves to be overwhelmed by this view of things, which beats them down into mistrust and convinces them that they do not have enough proof that God was in them to persevere in that state to which he had called them. So they wanted to seek counsel and light elsewhere and consulted other persons instead of those persons whom God had removed in order to be replaced by God in all things [RPNP, 116].” In the psychological warfare imposed by the enemies of Port-Royal, isolation can easily lead to a pervasive remorse, easily exploited by one’s opponents. The natural desire to seek dialogue in such persecutory solitude must be repressed in the knowledge that such communication will only be used to shake one’s religious convictions and to destroy one’s grace-inspired willingness to bear witness to the truth in the midst of persecution.
To survive persecution and its attendant psychological solitude, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean develops a spirituality for the oppressed. The imposed solitude, in which the nuns are deprived of the sacraments and of the celebration of the divine office, should be received as a grace and not only as a punishment. The isolation imposed on the protesting nuns invites them to a more immediate communion with God, no longer accessed through the mediation of sacrament, ordained priest, and communal prayer. “We can say that God in his goodness has put us in a place where we must serve him and that he has given us many means to accomplish this which we would not have otherwise encountered. We must believe that the heavenly fire that descended apparently to steal certain goods will only turn this assistance into something of a more spiritual nature. This will teach us to belong to God in a more perfect manner through suffering and privation than through peace and abundance [PNRP, 222].” In the ecclesiastical deprivations provoked by their refusal to assent to falsehoods, the nuns have discovered a communion with God that transcends the limits of sacrament and social intercourse. The recognition of God as pure Spirit actually intensifies when the only access to God becomes the solitary prayer of the individual persecuted for the sake of justice.
Tied to the Augustinian account of virtue is a broader Augustinian metaphysical dualism. The struggle to embrace the good reflects a deeper struggle in humanity between the peccatory will, locked into the self’s vanity, and the redeemed will, freed toward the love of God. This civil war within humanity reflects a fundamental polarity between the forces of light and darkness that agitate the cosmos itself. The Conferences on the Constitutions of the Monastery of Port-Royal exhibit this pervasive metaphysical dualism, even in Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s commentary on the legal provisions of the convent’s constitution.
Often citing Saint Augustine’s City of God, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean conceives human nature primarily in terms of the orientation of its will. The moral agent turns either toward the self in sin or toward God in authentic love. “We must always arrive at the principle of Saint Augustine: love has built two cities; we are necessarily citizens of one or the other. The love of God right up to the contempt of ourselves constitutes the City of God and the kingdom of Jesus Christ. The love of ourselves right up to the contempt of God builds Babylon, which is the kingdom of the demon [CCPR, I: 321].” In Mère Angélique’s dualistic universe, there is no middle ground between the virtuous and the vicious, the divine and the demonic. The central volitional act of love turns either toward the creature or toward the Creator in an itinerary of damnation or salvation.
Only grace can free the concupiscent human will from its downward inclination. Jesus Christ is not only the unsurpassable model of moral righteousness; he is the cause of this righteousness in the will of the disciple through the redemption wrought by the cross. “Jesus Christ is not only our model; in order to become a source of grace for us, he annihilated himself. As Saint Paul says, he shed his own blood to purify us from our dead works [CCPR, I: 384].” It is the cross that frees the moral agent from the losing spiritual combat with vice into which the agent has been conceived. Grace’s instauration or restoration of the virtuous life within the will and action of the disciple is as radical as grace’s resurrection of the dead.
The ethics of resistance developed by Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean has its own epistemology. The abbess repeatedly warns her embattled subjects that the very willingness to engage in doubt concerning one’s contested religious convictions is to prepare a moral surrender to the opponents of the truth concerning grace. The opuscule On the Danger of Hesitation and Doubt Once We Know Our Duty [DHD] elaborates the abbess’s argument that rather than being a neutral exercise, the entertainment of doubt on one’s central theological beliefs constitutes a moral danger for the subject who engages in it.
When people are persecuted for their beliefs, the natural inclination of the persecuted is to seek the end of duress by negotiating with their opponents. A compromise on the disputed points is seen as a supreme good, since it would promise the end of persecution. Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean warns, however, that persecution is the normal state for the Christian. The fact that’s one witness provokes the violent opposition of the world’s powerful normally indicates that one is on the path of truth rather than that of error. “The servants of God know that they could never be in a stronger state of assurance than when they must suffer. When their enemies hold them in a state of captivity, they find themselves in a greater freedom. They are in less danger than when they are in the greatest of dangers [DHD, 290].” Rather than encouraging doubt and debilitating self-scrutiny, the taste of persecution should assure the persecuted that their witness, in this case their testimony on behalf of the sovereignty of divine grace, defends a truth which a vain self-sufficient world desires to crush. The fact of persecution should strengthen rather than weaken the certitude with which the persecuted hold their well-considered beliefs.
Another problem with the exercise of doubt is the network of power in which all acts of doubt and certitude are embedded. Any dialogue between the Port-Royal Jansenists and their opponents is based on inequality. The wealth and juridical/military power available to the persecuting members of state and church far outweigh the meager resources of the persecuted nuns. Furthermore, the political concerns of the opponents of the nuns will dominate a dialogue in which the nuns’ concerns for the faith will be marginalized. “These types [of negotiations] only open the door to purely human types of reasoning and all too carnal thoughts. In these negotiations they claim to be willing to examine everything. In such a case, one would have to be willing to disarm faith itself…We often speak without thinking through our greatest enemies, the senses, which borrow from reason what they need to plead their cause and often clothe themselves with the most beautiful verbal appearances [DHD, 291].” To engage in doubt in such a rigged dialogue is not to enter into a mutual pursuit of the truth. It is to surrender to those who will dominate the discussions through their superior power, eloquence, and emotional appeals to the interest of the persecuted in survival and freedom. The most powerful and seductive arguments, not the most truthful, will determine the course and outcome of the proposed dialogue. Moreover, the hypothetical willingness to abandon carefully developed convictions regarding grace and salvation borders on the gravely sinful. Fidelity to truth must trump the instinct for personal or corporate survival. “Our faith is worth more than a convent and our conscience should be preferred to a building that in God’s sight would only be our tomb if we ever clung to it by defiling our conscience [DHD, 294].”
Beginning with the eighteenth-century editions of her work, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean has fascinated her commentators by her combative personality and by the high-profile persecution she and her convent endured. The literary critic Sainte-Beuve and the dramatist Montherlant have continued this emphasis on the personality of the militant abbess and have provided a negative portrait of a sectarian whose stubbornness plunged her community into an isolation which more diplomatic leadership might have avoided. The problem with this emphasis on the headstrong personality of the abbess lies in its obfuscation of the philosophical and theological positions which the abbess defended in her numerous works. Drama trumps theory. The originality of Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean’s philosophy has also been obscured by its assimilation to the generic Augustinianism of the Jansenist movement. Her disagreements with the Jansenist mainstream, expressed in the stormy correspondence with her uncle Antoine Arnauld, have often been ignored.
The current philosophical retrieval of Mère Angèlique de Saint-Jean has stressed the philosophy of resistance to oppression and the radical Augustinian recasting of moral virtue which the abbess develops in her writings. Her epistemological analysis of the exercise of doubt as an expression of power imbalances between the majority and an ostracized minority constitutes one of the most contemporary traits of her philosophy of the duty to resist a peccatory and persecutory world.
The translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 25, 2010 | Originally published: