Along with Confucianism, “Daoism” (sometimes called “Taoism“) is one of the two great indigenous philosophical traditions of China. As an English term, Daoism corresponds to both Daojia (“Dao family” or “school of the Dao”), an early Han dynasty (c. 100s BCE) term which describes so-called “philosophical” texts and thinkers such as Laozi and Zhuangzi, and Daojiao (“teaching of the Dao”), which describes various so-called “religious” movements dating from the late Han dynasty (c. 100s CE) onward. Thus, “Daoism” encompasses thought and practice that sometimes are viewed as “philosophical,” as “religious,” or as a combination of both. While modern scholars, especially those in the West, have been preoccupied with classifying Daoist material as either “philosophical” or “religious,” historically Daoists themselves have been uninterested in such categories and dichotomies. Instead, they have preferred to focus on understanding the nature of reality, increasing their longevity, ordering life morally, practicing rulership, and regulating consciousness and diet. Fundamental Daoist ideas and concerns include wuwei (“effortless action”), ziran (“naturalness”), how to become a shengren (“sage”) or zhenren (“realized person”), and the ineffable, mysterious Dao (“Way”) itself.
Strictly speaking there was no Daoism before the literati of the Han dynasty (c. 200 BCE) tried to organize the writings and ideas that represented the major intellectual alternatives available. The name daojia, “Dao family” or “school of the dao” was a creation of the historian Sima Tan (d. 110 BCE) in his Shi ji (Records of the Historian) written in the 2nd century BCE and later completed by his son, Sima Qian (145-186 BCE). In his classification, the Daoists are listed as one of the Six Schools: Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, School of Names, and Daoists. So, Daoism was a retroactive grouping of ideas and writings which were already at least one to two centuries old, and which may or may not have been ancestral to various post-classical religious movements, all self-identified as daojiao (“teaching of the dao“), beginning with the reception of revelations from the deified Laozi by the Celestial Masters (Tianshi) lineage founder, Zhang Daoling, in 142 CE. This entry privileges the formative influence of early texts, such as the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, but accepts contemporary Daoists‘ assertion of continuity between classical and post-classical, “philosophical“ and “religious“ movements and texts.
Daoism does not name a tradition constituted by a founding thinker, even though the common belief is that a teacher named Laozi founded the school and wrote its major work, called the Daodejing, also sometimes known as the Laozi. The tradition is also called “Lao-Zhuang” philosophy, referring to what are commonly regarded as its two classical and most influential texts: the Daodejing or Laozi (3rd Cent. BCE) and the Zhuangzi (4th-3rd Cent BCE). However, this stream of thought existed in an oral form, passed along by the masters who developed and transmitted it before it came to be written in these texts. There are two major source issues to be considered. 1) What evidence is there for Daoist beliefs and practices prior to the two classical texts? 2) What is the best reconstruction of the classical textual tradition upon which Daoism was based?
With regard to the first question, Isabelle Robinet thinks that the classical texts are only the most lasting evidence of a movement she associates with a set of writings called the Songs of Chu (Chuci), and that she identifies as the Chuci movement. This movement reflects a culture in which male and female masters called fangshi, daoshi, or daoren practiced techniques of longevity and used diet, meditation and generated wisdom teachings. While Robinet’s interpretation is controversial, there are undeniable connections between the Songs of Chu and later Daoist ideas. Some examples include a coincidence of names of immortals (sages), a commitment to the pursuit of physical immortality, a belief in the epistemic value of stillness and quietude, abstinence from grains, breathing and sexual practices used to regulate internal energy (qi), and the use of dances that resemble those still done by Daoist masters (the step of Yu).
In addition to the controversial connection to the Songs of Chu, the Guanzi (350-250 BCE) is a text older than both the Daodejing and probably all of the Zhuangzi, except the “inner chapters” (see below). This is a very important work of 76 “chapters.” Three of the chapters of the Guanzi are called the Neiye, which can mean “inner cultivation.” The self-cultivation practices and teachings put forward in this material may be fruitfully linked to several other important works: the Daodejing; the Zhuangzi; a Han dynasty Daoist work called the Huainanzi; and an early commentary on the Daodejing called the Xiang’er. Indeed, there is a strong meditative trend in the Daoism of late imperial China known as the “inner alchemy” tradition and the views of the Neiye seem to be in the background of this movement. Two other chapters of the Guanzi are called Xin shu (Heart-mind book). The Xin shu connects the ideas of quietude and stillness found in the Daodejing to longevity practices. The idea of dao in these chapters is very much like that of the Daodejing. Its image of the sage resembles that of the Zhuangzi. It uses the same term (zheng) that Zhuangzi uses for the corrections a sage must make in his body, the pacification of the heart-mind, and the concentration and control of internal energy (qi). These practices are called “holding onto the One,” “keeping the One,” “obtaining the One,” all of which are phrases associated with the Daodejing (chs. 10, 22, 39).
As for a reasonable reconstruction of the textual tradition upon which Daoism is based, we should not try to think of this task so simply as determining the relationship between the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi as though they were not composite. Zhuangzi repeats in very similar form sayings found in the Daodejing. However, we are not certain whether this means that Zhuangzi knew the Daodejing and quoted it, or if they both drew from a common source, or even if the Daodejing in some way depended on the Zhuangzi. In fact, one theory about the mythological figure Laozi is that he was created first in the Zhuangzi and later associated with the Daodejing.
We could offer the following summary of the sources of early Daoism. Stage One: Zhuang Zhou’s “inner chapters” (chs. 1-7) of the Zhuangzi (c. 350 BCE) and some components of the Guanzi, including perhaps both the Neiye and the Xin shu. Stage Two: Some parts of the “mixed chapters” (chs. 23-33) of the Zhuangzi and the final redaction of the Daodejing. Stage Three: the Huang-Lao manuscripts from Mawangdui (see below); the “outer chapters” (8-22) of the Zhuangzi, and the Huainanzi (180-122 BCE).
In the late 1970s Western and comparative philosophers began to point out that an important dimension of the historical context of Daoism was being overlooked because the previous generation of scholars had ignored or even disparaged connections between the classical texts and Daoist religious belief and practice. We have to lay some of the responsibility for such neglect at the feet of the eminent translator and philosopher Wing-Tsit Chan, who spoke of Daoist religion as a degeneration of Daoist philosophy arising from the time of the Celestial Masters (see below) in the late Han period. He was an instrumental architect of the view that Daoist philosophy (daojia) and Daoist religion (daojiao) are entirely different traditions.
Our interest in trying to separate philosophy and religion in Daoism is more revealing of the Western frame of reference we use than of Daoism itself. Daoist ideas fermented among master teachers who had a holistic view of life. These daoshi (Daoist masters) did not compartmentalize practices by which they sought to influence the forces of reality, increase their longevity, have interaction with realities not apparent to our normal way of seeing things, and order life morally and by rulership. They offered insights we might call philosophical aphorisms. But they also practiced meditation and physical exercises, studied nature for diet and remedy, practiced rituals related to their view that reality had many layers and forms with whom/which humans could interact, led small communities, and advised rulers on all these subjects. The masters transmitted their teachings, some of them only to disciples and adepts, but gradually these became more widely available as is evidenced in the very creation of the Daodejing and Zhuangzi themselves.
The agenda that provoked Westerners to separate philosophy and religion, dating at least to the classical Greek period of philosophy was not part of the preoccupation of Daoists. Accordingly, the question whether Daoism is a philosophy or a religion is not one we can ask without imposing a set of understandings, presuppositions, and qualifications that do not apply to Daoism. But this is not a reason to discount the importance of Daoist thought. Quite to the contrary, it may be one of the most significant ideas classical Daoism can contribute to the study of philosophy in the present age.
The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) is divided into 81 “chapters” consisting of slightly over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. In its received form from Wang Bi (see below), the two major divisions of the text are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on little else than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). The text is a collection of short aphorisms that were not arranged to develop any systematic argument. The long standing tradition about the authorship of the text is that the “founder” of Daoism, known as Laozi gave it to Yin Xi, the guardian of the pass through the mountains that he used to go from China to the West. But the text is a composite of collected materials, most of which probably circulated orally perhaps even in single aphorisms or small collections. Insufficient study of the text has been done to formulate any consensus about whether the text was composed using smaller written collections.
For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.
Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called “A” and “B.” These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.
The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the “inner chapters” (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.
The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as “the Way.” This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, “the dao”) and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not “the World” or “the cosmos” in a Western sense.
The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus “obtain the dao.” Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as “nonaction” or “no action” is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of “doing nothing.” Wu wei means something like “act naturally,” “effortless action,” or “nonwillful action.” The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family’s house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life’s occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven’s (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)
A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, “Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full.” While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, “straightforward words seem paradoxical,” implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).
What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei, (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to “solve” or “figure out” life’s apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).
Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler’s work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ’s admonitions to “fill the bellies and empty the minds” to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.
The second of the two most important classical texts of Daoism is the Zhuangzi. This text is a collection of stories and imaginary conversations known for its creativity and skillful use of language. The text contains longer and shorter treatises, stories, poetry, and aphorisms. It dates to the late 4th century BCE and originally had 52 “chapters.” These were reduced to 33 by Guo Xiang in the 3rd century CE. Unlike the Daodejing which is ascribed to the mythological Laozi, the Zhuangzi may actually contain materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi himself (which is a title meaning “Master Zhuang”) and these are known as the “inner chapters.” The remaining 26 chapters had other origins and they sometimes take different points of view from the inner chapters. They are divided into the “outer chapters” (chs. 8-22) and “mixed chapters,” (chs. 23-33). The full text probably did not reach its completed form until about 130 BCE.
Zhuangzi taught that a set of practices, including meditation, helped one achieve unity with the dao and become a “true person” (zhen ren). The way to this state is not the result of a withdrawal from life. However, it does require a disengagement from conventional values and the demarcations made by society. In Chapter 23 of the Zhuangzi, a character inquiring of Laozi about the solution to his life’s worries was answered promptly: “Why did you come with all this crowd of people?” The man looked around and confirmed he was standing alone, but Laozi meant that his problems were the result of all the baggage of ideas and conventional opinions he lugged about with him. This baggage must be discarded before anyone can be zhen ren. As we see in this case, the Zhuangzi often employs apparently nonsensical remarks and questions, as well as humor to make its points.
Like the DDJ, Zhuangzi also valorizes wu wei. For his examples of such living Zhuangzi turns to analogies of craftsmen, athletes (swimmers), woodcarvers, and even butchers. One of the most famous stories in the text is that of Ding the Butcher, who learned what it means to wu wei through the perfection of his craft. When asked about his great skill, Ding says, “What I care about is dao, which goes beyond skill. When I first began cutting up oxen, all I could see was the ox itself. After three years I no longer saw the whole ox. And now—now I go at it by spirit and don’t look with my eyes. Perception and understanding have come to a stop and spirit moves where it wants. I go along with the natural makeup, strike in the big hollows, guide the knife through the big openings, and follow things as they are. So I never touch the smallest ligament or tendon, much less a main joint. A good cook changes his knife once a year—because he cuts. A mediocre cook changes his knife once a month—because he hacks. I’ve had this knife of mine for nineteen years and I’ve cut up thousands of oxen with it, and yet the blade is as good as though it had just come from the grindstone. There are spaces between the joints, and the blade of the knife has really no thickness….[I] move the knife with the greatest subtlety, until—flop! The whole thing comes apart like a clod of earth crumbling to the ground.” (Ch. 3, The Secret of Caring for Life)
Persons who exemplify such understanding are called sages, zhen ren, and immortals. Zhuangzi describes the Daoist sage in such a way as to suggest that he possesses extraordinary powers. This is the result of a way of living that cannot be dichotomized into philosophical and religious categories. Early Daoism makes no such demarcation. Being able to have union with the dao means to see from the viewpoint of the dao, and not by the limits of the conceptual and sensory apparatus that confines us (the way Ding moves his knife through the meat without looking).
Zhuangzi is drawing on a set of beliefs that were probably regarded as literal by many, although some think he meant these to be taken metaphorically. For example, when Zhuangzi says that the sage cannot be harmed or made to suffer by anything that life presents, does he mean this to be taken as saying that the zhen ren is physically invincible? Or, does he mean that the sage has so freed himself from all conventional understandings that he refuses to recognize poverty as any more or less desirable than affluence, to recognize blindness as worse than sight, to recognize death as any less desirable than life? As the Zhuangzi says in Chapter One, Free and Easy Wandering, “There is nothing that can harm this man.” This is also the theme of Chapter Two, On Making All Things Equal. In this chapter people are urged to “make all things one,” meaning that they should recognize that reality is one. It is human judgment that what happens is beautiful or ugly, right or wrong, fortunate or not. The sage knows all things are one (equal) and does not judge. Our lives are snarled and jumbled so long as we make conventional discriminations, but when we set them aside, we appear to others as extraordinary and enchanted.
An important theme in the Zhuangzi is the use of immortals to illustrate various points. Did Zhuangzi believe some persons physically lived forever? Well, many Daoists did believe this. Did Zhuangzi believe that our substance was eternal and only our form changed? Almost certainly Zhuangzi thought that we were in a constant state of process, changing from one form into another (see the exchange between Master Lai and Master Li in Ch. 6, The Great and Venerable Teacher). In Daoism, immortality is the result of what is called a wu xing transformation. Wu xing means “five phases” and it refers to the Chinese understanding of reality according to which all things are in some state of combined correlation of wood, fire, water, metal, and earth. This was not a “Daoist” physics. It underlay all Chinese “science” of the classical period, although Daoists certainly made use of it. Zhuangzi wants to teach us how to engage in transformation through meditation, breathing, and experience (see ch. 6). And yet, perhaps Zhuangzi’s teachings on immortality mean that the person who is free of discrimination makes no difference between life and death. In the words of Lady Li in Ch. 2, “How do I know that the dead do not wonder why they ever longed for life?”
Huangdi (the Yellow Emperor) is the most prominent immortal mentioned in the text. He had long been venerated as a cultural exemplar and the inventor of civilized human life. Daoism is filled with accounts designed to show that those who learn to live according to the according to the dao have long lives. Pengzu, one of the characters in the Zhuangzi, is said to have lived eight hundred years. The most prominent female immortal is Xiwangmu (Queen Mother of the West), who was believed to reign over the sacred and mysterious Mount Kunlun.
The Daoists did not think of immortality as a gift from a god, or an achievement in the religious sense commonly thought of in the West. It was a result of finding harmony with the dao, expressed through wisdom, meditation, and wu wei. Persons who had such knowledge were reputed to live in the mountains, thus the character for xian (immortal) is made up of two components, the one being shan “mountain” and the other being ren “person.” Undoubtedly, some removal to the mountains was a part of the journey to becoming a zhen ren “true person.” Because Daoists believed that nature and our own bodies were correlations of each other, they imagined their bodies as mountains inhabited by immortals. The struggle to wu wei was an effort to become immortal, to be born anew, to grow the embryo of immortality inside. A part of the disciplines of Daoism included imitation of the animals of nature, because they were thought to act without the intention and willfulness that characterized humans. Physical exercises included animal dances (wu qin xi) and movements designed to enable the unrestricted flow of the cosmic life force from which all things are made (qi). Other movements designed to channel the flow of qi are called tai qi or qi gong. Daoists practiced breathing exercises, used herbal remedies, and they employed an instruction booklet for sexual positions and intercourse, all designed to enhance the flow of qi energy. They even practiced external alchemy, using burners to modify the composition of cinnabar and mercury into potions to drink and pills to ingest for the purpose of adding longevity. Many Daoist practitioners died as a result of these alchemical substances, and even a few Emperors who followed their instructions lost their lives as well.
The attitude and practices necessary to the pursuit of immortality made this life all the more significant. Butcher Ding is a master butcher because his qi is in harmony with the dao. Daoist practices were meant for everyone, regardless of their origin, gender, social position, or wealth. However, Daoism was a complete philosophy of life and not an easy way to learn.
When superior persons learn the Dao, they practice it with zest.
When average persons learn of the Dao, they are indifferent.
When petty persons learn of the Dao, they laugh loudly.
If they did not laugh, it would not be worthy of being the Dao.
Arguably, Daoism shared some emphases with classical Confucianism such as self-cultivation and a this-worldly concern for the concrete details of life rather than on abstractions and ideals. Nevertheless, it largely represented an alternative and critical tradition divergent from that of Confucius. While many of these criticisms are controversial, some seem clear.
One of the most fundamental teachings of DDJ is that human discriminations, such as in morality (good, bad) and aesthetics (beauty, ugly) generate the troubles and problems of existence (ch. 3a). The clear implication is that the person following the dao must cease ordering his life according to human-made distinctions (ch. 19). Indeed, it is only when the dao recedes that these demarcations emerge (chs. 18; 38), because they are a form of disease (ch. 74). Daoists believe that the dao is untangling the knots of life, blunting the sharp edges of relationships and problems, and turning down the light on painful occurrences (ch. 4). So, it is best to practice wu-wei in all endeavors, to act naturally and not willfully try to oppose or tamper with how reality is moving.
Confucius and his followers wanted to change the world and be proactive in setting things straight. They wanted to tamper, orchestrate, plan, educate, develop, and propose solutions. Daoists take their hands off of life, and Confucians want their fingerprints on everything. Imagine this comparison. If the Daoist goal is to become like a piece of unhewn and natural wood, the goal of the Confucians is to become a carved sculpture. The Daoists put the piece before us just as it is found, and the Confucians polish it, shape it, and decorate it.
Confucians think they can engineer reality, understand it, name it, control it. But the Daoists think that such endeavors are the source of our frustration and fragmentation (DDJ, chs. 57, 72). They believe the Confucians create a gulf between humans and nature, that weakens and destroys us. Indeed, as far as the Daoists are concerned, the Confucian project is like a cancer that saps our very life. This is a fundamental difference in how these two great philosophical traditions think persons should approach life, and as shown above it is a consistent difference found also between the Zhuangzi and Confucianism.
The teachings that were later called Daoism were first known under the name of Huanglao Dao in the 3rd and 2nd cent. BCE. The thought world transmitted in this stream is what Sima Tan meant by Daojia. The Huanglao school was a center of Daoist practitioners in the state of Qi (modern Shandong). Huangdi was the name for the Yellow Emperor, from whom the rulers of Qi said they were descended. When Emperor Wu, the sixth sovereign of the Han dynasty (r. 140-87 BCE) elevated Confucianism to the status of the official state ideology and training in it became mandatory for all bureaucratic officials, the tension with Daoism became more evident. And yet, at court people still sought longevity. Wu continued to engage in many Daoist practices, including the use of alchemy, climbing sacred Taishan (Mt. Tai), and presenting petitions to heaven. Wu forced his Daoist relative Liu An, the Prince of Huainan to commit suicide. Liu’s death meant the end of the Daoist academy he had established and which was associated with the production of the work called the Master of Huainan (Huainanzi, 180-122 BCE). The text was an attempt to merge cosmology, Confucian ideals, and a political theory using “quotes” attributed to Huangdi, although the statements are actually from the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. All this is of added significance because in the later Han work, Laozi binahua jing (Book of the Transformations of Laozi) the Chinese physics that persons and objects change forms was employed in order to identify Laozi with Huangdi, and also with taiyi (the ultimate reality or god whose residence was in the Big Dipper). This explains also why the Han bureaucracy became identified with the Big Dipper.
Even though Emperor Wu forced Daoist practitioners from court, Daoist teachings were still able to create a discontent with the policies of the Han. Popular uprisings sprouted. The Yellow Turban movement, that tried to overthrow Han imperial authority in the name of Huangdi and promised to establish the Way of Great Peace (Tai ping). The basic moral and philosophical text of this movement was the Classic of Great Peace (Taiping jing). The present version of this work in the Daoist canon is a later and altered iteration of the original text dating about 166 CE.
Easily the most important of the Daoist trends at the end of the Han period was the wudou mi dao (Way of Five Bushels of Rice) movement, best known as the Way of the Celestial Masters (tianshi dao). This movement is traceable to a Daoist hermit named Zhang ling, or Zhang Daoling, who resided on a mountain near modern Chengdu in Sichuan. The story goes that Laozi appeared to Zhang (c. 142 CE) and gave him a commission to announce the soon end of the world and the coming age of Great Peace (taiping). The revelation said that those who followed Zhang would become part of the Orthodox One Covenant with the Powers of the Universe (Zhengyi meng wei). Zhang began the movement that culminated in a Celestial Master state. The administrators of this state were called libationers (ji jiu), because they performed religious rites, as well as political duties. They taught that personal illness and civil mishap were owing to the mismanagement of the forces of the body and nature. The libationers taught a strict form of morality and maintained registers of the moral conduct of the people. They were moral investigators, standing in for a greater celestial bureaucracy. The Celestial Master state developed against the background of the decline of the later Han dynasty. Indeed, when the empire finally decayed, the Celestial Master government was the only order in much of southern China.
When the Wei dynastic rulers became uncomfortable with the Celestial Masters’ power, they broke up the state. But this backfired because it actually served to disperse Celestial Masters followers throughout China. Many of the refugees settled near X’ian. The movement remained strong because its leaders had assembled a canon of texts [Statutory Texts of the One and Orthodox (Zhengyi fawen)]. This group of writings included philosophical, political, and ritual texts. It became a fundamental part of the later authorized Daoist canon.
The resurgence of Daoism after the Han dynasty is often known as Neo-Daoism. Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, were the most important voices in this development. Traditionally, the famous “Seven Sages of the Bamboo Grove” (Zhulin qixian) have also been associated with the new Daoist way of life that expressed itself in culture and not merely in mountain retreats. These thinkers included landscape painters, calligraphers, poets, and musicians. Among the philosophers of this period, the great representative of Daoism in southern China was Ge Hong (283-343 CE). He practiced not only philosophical reflection, but also external alchemy, manipulating mineral substances such as mercury and cinnabar. His work the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of this period. For him, longevity and immortality are not the same, the former is only the first step to the latter.
After the invasion of China by nomads from Central Asia, Daoists of the Celestial Master tradition who had been living in the north were forced to migrate into southern China, where Ge Hong’s version of Daoism was strong. The mixture of these two traditions is represented in the writings of the Xu family. The Xu family was an aristocratic group from what is today the city of Nanjing. Seeking Daoist philosophical wisdom and the long life it promised, many of them moved to Mao Shan mountain, near the city. There they claimed to receive revelations from immortals, who dictated new wisdom and morality texts to them. Yang Xi was the most prominent recipient of the Maoshan revelations (360-370 CE). These revelations came from spirits who were local heroes named the Mao brothers, but they had been transformed into deities. Yang Xi’s writings formed the basis for High Purity (Shangqing) Daoism. The writings were extraordinarily well done and even the calligraphy in which they were written was beautiful.
The importance of these texts philosophically speaking is to be found in their idealization of the quest for immortality and transference of the material practices of the alchemical science of Ge Hong into a form of reflective meditation. In fact, the Shangqing school of Daoism is the beginning of the tradition known as “inner alchemy” (neidan), an individual mystical pursuit of wisdom.
Some thirty years after the Maoshan revelations, a descendent of Ge Hong, named Ge Chaofu went into a mediumistic trance and authored a set of texts called the Lingbao teachings. These works were ritual recitation texts similar to Buddhist sutras, and indeed they borrowed heavily from Buddhism. At first, the Shangqing and Lingbao texts belonged to the general stream of the Celestial Masters and were not considered separate sects or movements within Daoism, although later lineages of masters emphasized the uniqueness of their teachings.
As the Lingbao texts illustrate, Daoism acted as a receiving structure for Buddhism. Many early translators of Buddhist texts used Daoist terms to render Indian ideas. Some Buddhists saw Laozi as an avatar of Shakyamuni (the Buddha), and some Daoists understood Shakyamuni as a manifestation of the dao, which also means he was a manifestation of Laozi. An often made generalization is that Buddhism held north China in the 4th and 5th centuries, and Daoism the south. But gradually this intellectual currency actually reversed. Daoism grew in scope and impact throughout China.
By the time of the Tang dynasty (618-906 CE) Daoism was the intellectual philosophy that underwrote the national understanding. The imperial family claimed to descend from Li (the family of Laozi). Laozi was venerated by royal decree. Officials received Daoist initiation as Masters of its philosophy, rituals, and practices. A major center for Daoist studies was created at Dragon and Tiger Mountain (long hu shan), chosen both for its feng shui and because of its strategic location at the intersection of numerous southern China trade routes. The Celestial Masters who held leadership at Dragon and Tiger mountain were later called “Daoist popes” by Christian missionaries because they had considerable political power.
In aesthetics, two great Daoist intellectuals worked during the Tang. Wu Daozi developed the rules for Daoist painting and Li Bai became its most famous poet. Interestingly, Daoist alchemists invented gunpowder during the Tang. The earliest block-print book on a scientific subject is a Daoist work entitled Xuanjie lu (850 CE). As Buddhism gradually grew stronger during the Tang, Daoist and Confucian intellectuals sought to initiate a conversation with it. The Buddhism that resulted was a reformed version known as Chan (Zen in Japan).
During the Five Dynasties (907-960 CE) and Song periods (960-1279 CE) Confucianism enjoyed a resurgence and Daoists found their place by teaching that principal thinkers of their tradition were Confucian scholars as well. Most notable among these was Lu Dongbin, a Daoist immortal that many believed was originally a Confucian teacher.
Daoism became a complete philosophy of life, reaching into religion, social action, and individual health and physical well being. A huge network of Daoist temples known by the name Dongyue Miao (also called tianqing guan) was created through the empire, with a miao in virtually every town of any size. The Daoist masters who served these temples were appointed as government officials. They also gave medical, moral, and philosophical advice, and led religious rituals, dedicated especially to the Lord of the Sacred Mountain of the East named Taishan. Daoist masters had wide authority. All this was obvious in the temple iconography. Taishan was represented as the emperor, the City God (cheng huang) was a high official, and the Earth God was portrayed as a prosperous peasant. Daoism of this period integrated the Three Teachings (sanjiao) of China: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism. This process of synthesis continued throughout the Song and into the period of the Ming Dynasty.
Such a wide dispersal of Daoist thought and practice, taken together with its interest in merging Confucianism and Buddhism, eventually created a fragmented ideology. Into this confusion came Wang Zhe (1113-1170 CE), the founder of Quanzhen (Total Truth) Daoism. It was Wang’s goal to bring the three teachings into a single great synthesis. For the first time, Daoist teachers adopted monastic forms of life, created monasteries, and organized themselves in ways they saw in Buddhism. This version of Daoist thought interpreted the classical texts of the DDJ and the Zhuangzi to call for a rejection of the body and material world. The Quanzhen order became powerful as the main partner of the Mongols (Yuan dynasty), who gave their patronage to its expansion. Frequently the Mongol emperors favored the Celestial Masters and their leader at Dragon and Tiger mountain in an effort to undermine the power of the Quanzhen leaders. For example, the Zhengyi (Celestial Master) master of Beijing in the 1220s was Zhang Liusun. Under patronage he was allowed to build a Dongyue Miao in the city in 1223 and make it the unofficial town hall of the capital. But by the time of Khubilai Khan (r. 1260-1294) the Buddhists were used against all Daoists. The Khan ordered all Daoist books except the DDJ to be destroyed in 1281, and he closed the Quanzhen monastery in the city known as Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery).
When the Ming (1368-1644) dynasty emerged, the Mongols were expulsed, and Chinese rule was restored. The emperors sponsored the creation of the first complete Daoist Canon (Daozang), which was edited between 1408 and 1445. This was an eclectic collection, including many Buddhist and Confucian related texts. Daoist influence reached its zenith.
The Manchurian tribes that became rulers of China in 1644 and founded the Qing dynasty were already under the influence of conservative Confucian exiles. They stripped the Celestial Master of Dragon Tiger Mountain of his power at court. Only Quanzhen was tolerated. Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery) was reopened, and a new lineage of thinkers was organized. They called themselves the Dragon Gate lineage (Long men pai). In the 1780s, the Western traders arrived, and so did Christian missionaries. In 1849, the Hakka people of Guangxi province, among China’s poorest citizens, rose in revolt. They followed Hong Xiuquan, who claimed to be Jesus’ younger brother. This millennial movement built on a strange version of Chinese Christianity sought to establish the Heavenly Kingdom of Peace (taping). As the Taiping swept throughout southern China, they destroyed Buddhist and Daoist temples and texts wherever they found them. The Taiping army completely raised the Daoist complexes on Dragon Tiger Mountain. During most of the 20th century the drive to eradicate Daoist influence has continued. In the 1920s, the “New Life” movement drafted students to go out on Sundays to destroy Daoist statues and texts. In the year 1926 only two copies of the Daoist Canon (Daozang) existed and Daoist philosophical heritage was in great jeopardy. But permission was granted to copy the canon kept at the White Cloud Monastery, and so the texts were preserved for the world. There are 1120 titles in this collection in 5,305 volumes. Much of this material has yet to receive scholarly attention and very little of it has been translated into any Western language.
The Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) attempted to complete the destruction of Daoism. Masters were killed or “re-educated.” Entire lineages were broken up and their texts were destroyed. The miaos were closed, burned, and turned into military barracks. At one time, there were 300 Daoist sites in Beijing alone, now there are only a handful. However, Daoism is not dead. It survives as a vibrant philosophical system and way of life as its evidenced by the revival of its practice and study in several new University institutes in the People’s Republic.
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Last updated: July 12, 2005 | Originally published: