Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Dynamic Epistemic Logic

This article tells the story of the rise of dynamic epistemic logic, which began with epistemic logic, the logic of knowledge, in the 1960s. Then, in the late 1980s, came dynamic epistemic logic, the logic of change of knowledge. Much of it was motivated by puzzles and paradoxes. The number of active researchers in these logics grows significantly every year, possibly because there are so many relations and applications to computer science, to multi-agent systems, to philosophy, and to cognitive science. The modal knowledge operators in epistemic logic are formally interpreted by employing binary accessibility relations in multi-agent Kripke models (relational structures), where these relations should be equivalence relations to respect the properties of knowledge.

The operators for change of knowledge correspond to another sort of modality, more akin to a dynamic modality. A peculiarity of this dynamic modality is that it is interpreted by transforming the Kripke structures used to interpret knowledge, and not, at least not on first sight, by an accessibility relation given with a Kripke model. Although called dynamic epistemic logic, this two-sorted modal logic applies to more general settings than the logic of merely S5 knowledge. The present article discusses in depth the early history of dynamic epistemic logic. It then mentions briefly a number of more recent developments involving factual change, one (of several) standard translations to temporal epistemic logic, and a relation to situation calculus (a well-known framework in artificial intelligence to represent change). Special attention is then given to the relevance of dynamic epistemic logic for belief revision, for speech act theory, and for philosophical logic. The part on philosophical logic pays attention to Moore sentences, the Fitch paradox, and the Surprise Examination.

For the main body of this article, go to Dynamic Epistemic Logic.

Author Information

Hans van Ditmarsch, LORIA, CNRS – University of Lorraine, France
Wiebe van der Hoek, The University of Liverpool, United Kingdom
Barteld Kooi, University of Groningen, Netherlands


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