Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy


Although deconstruction has roots in Martin Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion, to deconstruct is not to destroy.  Deconstruction is always a double movement of simultaneous affirmation and undoing.  It started out as a way of reading the history of metaphysics in Heidegger and Jacques Derrida, but was soon applied to the interpretation of literary, religious, and legal texts as well as philosophical ones, and was adopted by several French feminist theorists as a way of making clearer the deep male bias embedded in the European intellectual tradition.

To deconstruct is to take a text apart along the structural “fault lines” created by the ambiguities inherent in one or more of its key concepts or themes in order to reveal the equivocations or contradictions that make the text possible.  For example, in “Plato’s Pharmacy,” Derrida deconstructs Socrates’ criticism of the written word, arguing that it not only suffers from internal inconsistencies because of the analogy Socrates himself makes between memory and writing, but also stands in stark contrast to the fact that his ideas come to us only through the written word he disparaged (D 61-171).  The double movement here is one of tracing this tension in Plato’s text, and in the traditional reading of that text, while at the same time acknowledging the fundamental ways in which our understanding of the world is dependent on Socrates’ attitude toward the written word.  Derrida points out similar contradictions in philosophical discussions of a preface (by G. W. F. Hegel, D 1-69) and a picture frame (by Immanuel Kant, TP 17-147), which are simultaneously inside and outside the respective works under consideration.

Since the distinction between what is inside the text (or painting) and what is outside can itself be deconstructed according to the same principles, deconstruction is, like Destruktion, an historicizing movement that opens texts to the conditions of their production, their con-text in a very broad sense, including not only the historical circumstances and tradition from which they arose, but also the conventions and nuances of the language in which they were written and the details of their authors’ lives.  This generates an effectively infinite complexity in texts that makes any deconstructive reading necessarily partial and preliminary.

Table of Contents

  1. Destruktion
  2. Deconstruction
    1. Early Formulations
    2. Literary Deconstruction
    3. Contentions and Confrontations
    4. Later Versions
  3. Feminist Deconstruction
  4. References and Further Readings
    1. References
    2. Additional Readings

1. Destruktion

Heidegger’s use of the word Destruktion suffers from the same problem as Edmund Husserl’s use of Intentionalität. Neither is an ordinary German word; both were borrowed from Latin almost as neologisms to express a concept their creators perceived as relatively new to the philosophical domain, only to have the words become confused with their more common cognates when translated into French or English.  The usual German word for “destruction” is “Zerstörung”, but Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion is also closely related to Abbau or dismantling.  Derrida uses the word deconstruction to capture both German terms. (EO 86-6).

In Being and Time, Heidegger says that the purpose of Destruktion is to “arrive at those primordial experiences in which we achieved our first ways of determining the nature of Being—the ways which have guided us ever since” (BT 44).  This is the double gesture referred to above, one that takes apart the European traditions and in so doing finds the basic understanding of Being beneath its surface. This goal separates Destruktion from deconstruction, not because deconstruction is purely negative, but because it has no fixed endpoint or goal.  Deconstruction is always an on-going process because the constantly shifting nature of language means that no final meaning or interpretation of a text is possible.  Subsequent ages, grounded in a different language and different ways of life, will always see something different in a text as they deconstruct it in the context of the realities with which they live.  What is meant by “the written word”, for example, has already evolved substantially since Derrida wrote “Plato’s Pharmacy” due to the explosion in electronic media.  All deconstruction can reveal are temporary and more or less adequate truths, not more primordial or deeper ones.  For Heidegger, on the other hand, the “primordial experiences” of Being revealed through Destruktion result in a single interpretation that offers a more authentic alternative to philosophy’s misunderstanding of the temporality and historicality of human existence.

Temporality and historicality are essential components of Dasein, Heidegger’s term for human existence, because it is “thrown projection”, that is, an entity necessarily oriented toward an unknown future, but always based on a past for which it is not itself fully responsible and which it can never fully know.  Time, then, is not only a category of experience (as in Kant), but the very core of our existence. As beings in a present moment are  defined in terms of a past that creates our possibilities and a future into which we project them.  On a larger scale, this temporality of Dasein (as opposed to Hegelian Spirit) is what creates history; our ability to project forward and interpret backwards not only the circumstances of our lives, but also those of the entire social world to which we belong.  For Heidegger, Destruktion of the traditions in that social world can lead us back to a past that can be re-interpreted in ways that reveal the deeper understanding of Being hidden in the earliest texts of the European tradition; it  can offer ways to project a different, more authentic future for Dasein based on the new way of seeing the past.

2. Deconstruction

a. Early Formulations

As already noted, deconstruction differs from Destruktion in that it has no fixed or expected endpoint or map, but is rather a potentially infinite process.  Although obviously a critical tool, it also lacks the sense, evident in Heidegger, that the text to be deconstructed is part of how European thought has somehow gone wrong and needs correction.  This is because deconstruction rejects both the idea that there is a fixed series of eras (ancient, medieval, modern) in European history that mark a downward path, and the idea that there is some determinate way in which that path might be reversed, by a re-interpretation of early Greek philosophy.  Rather, Derrida insists that what he deconstructs are texts that he “loves” (EO 87) and they  are vital parts of our intellectual world, with a view to revealing their underlying complexities and hidden contradictions.  He does not seek to undo Kant, for example, or interpret his writings in ways closer to Derrida’s own vision of what philosophy should be, but rather shows us the ways in which Kant both changes and continues the metaphysical tradition, as well as the ways in which Kant’s texts undo themselves along the same “fault lines” that have undermined that tradition throughout its history.

In 1967, Derrida offered this definition:

To ‘deconstruct’ philosophy, thus, would be to think—in the most faithful, interior way—the structured genealogy of philosophy’s concepts, but at the same time to determine—from a certain exterior that is unqualifiable or unnameable by philosophy—what this history has been able to dissimulate or forbid, making itself into a history by means of this. . .motivated repression (P 6).

What is outside of, or excluded from the realm dominated by the philosophical tradition, although unnamed in it, provides a vantage point and a key with which to find the flaws and lacunae that domination seeks to hide.  The opposition between the spoken and written word in Plato, the text and its introduction in Hegel, the painting and its frame in Kant belong to a series of oppositions (good/evil, mind/body, male/female, center/margin, necessary/contingent, and so forth .) that run though and in many ways structure the European philosophical tradition.  Each of these pairs is also a hierarchy meant to exclude both the non-dominant member of the pair (the body, the female, the margin, the contingent) and anything outside the opposition (the ambiguous, the borderline, the hybrid) from the philosophical realm.  These hierarchical oppositions, in turn, create the basis for political hierarchy and social domination (male/female, freeman/slave, propertied/landless, Christian/other, citizen/immigrant), power differentials that motivate the repression to which Derrida refers. This is why deconstruction denies the possibility of some pre-Socratic “primordial experience” of Being to be found through dismantling the metaphysical tradition which could then solve the problems that tradition has created, because that experience, too, would be subject to deconstruction along these same lines.

What deconstruction reveals, among other things, is that the repression that is necessary for creating a history of philosophy is in large part a repression of what philosophy itself cannot control, of what escapes the grasp of philosophy while being part of it.  The fault lines that deconstruction follows are the traces left inside philosophy by what it must define as exterior to it in order to be philosophy.  Derrida’s early work connects these fault lines to what is represented by the written word:  our inability to control or limit the meaning that might be given to our words because of the historical development of language, the ambiguity of linguistic meaning, and the ability of written text to be excerpted, reproduced and read in contexts we can neither imagine nor control (as opposed, supposedly, to the immediate and limited context of the spoken word).  This is why any text can be deconstructed (even Friedrich Nietzsche’s fragmentary message “I have forgotten my umbrella” in Spurs), but canonical texts (Plato, Kant, Hegel, later Heidegger himself) offer the richest and most productive grounds for deconstruction.  We learn more about ourselves by seeing the traces of a fear of absolute loss that motivate the Aufhebung in Hegel’s texts, than we might from finding the same anxiety in the writing of someone whose influence on European philosophy (and politics) has been less profound.

As an example of deconstruction here, however, it seems advisable to choose a text closer to Nietzsche’s umbrella, than Hegel’s phenomenology of Spirit.  The Truth in Painting takes its title from a letter in which Paul Cézanne tells Émile Bernard, “I owe you the truth in painting [la verité en peinture] and I will tell it to you.”  Derrida points out that the philosophy of language would assert that in writing this, Cézanne must have known what he meant, but in fact the sentence itself has no determinate meaning.  “The truth in painting” escapes and exceeds the boundaries philosophy wants to draw with regard to language because it has at least four meanings, none of which is reducible to any of the others:  1) the truth about truth itself to be found in or through a painting or other work of art, such as the truth Heidegger finds in Van Gogh’s painting of the shoes in “Origin of the Work of Art”; 2) the truth of the painting as painting, that is, how “true to life” it is, how well it succeeds in representing what it is meant to represent; 3) the truth about its object that can be found through the painting, such as when a portrait lays bare the character of its subject; and 4) the truth about painting in the sense of what is true in painting as a human enterprise or art form.

This ambiguity of the French sentence is compounded by the fact that Cézanne promises, not to paint the truth, but to tell or say it in language, thus linking text and painting in a complex nexus of possible meanings and realizations.  There is, and can be, no single meaning of this sentence simply because of the rather ordinary (but untranslatable) French phrase “en peinture”.  As is sometimes the case with the deconstruction of such partial and cryptic texts, Derrida’s target here is not Cézanne’s words themselves, but rather the account of truth and promises (the implicit debt in Cézanne’s “I owe you”) found in contemporary philosophy of language.  Not only does this sentence fail traditional philosophical tests for having a truth value, due to its ambiguity, it also fails to have the conditions of satisfaction, with which more recent philosophy of language hoped to replace those tests and determine whether Cézanne paid his “debt”.  By deconstructing the phrase “the truth in painting”, Derrida hopes to underscore the pragmatic reality that how language functions as a living phenomenon makes it impossible to develop purely formal criteria for identifying or cataloguing true statements.

b. Literary Deconstruction

One notable fact about the reception of deconstruction in the United States was its relatively early acceptance by departments of literature compared to departments of philosophy.  Undoubtedly , there are several reasons for this, but one may be that, as Geoffrey Hartman notes, “Deconstructive criticism does not present itself as a novel enterprise” because the ambiguity and contextuality, the interplay of the spoken and written word, that deconstruction emphasizes in philosophical texts are both more obvious and more acknowledged in literary ones.  At the same time, deconstruction, by foregrounding the fact that “Everything we thought of as spirit, or meaning separable from the letter of the text, remains within an ‘intertextual’ sphere” (DC viii), opened important channels of communication between philosophy and literary studies.

The tools of deconstruction and the sorts of truths they reveal, are similar in both spheres.  The basic strategy is still to follow the trace of a key ambiguity or blind spot through the text to illuminate hierarchical oppositions it relies on and the fault lines along which it can be undone, while still acknowledging its power and importance in European thought.  Ernest Jones’ classic psychoanalytic reading of “Hamlet”, for instance, is deconstructive in that it foregrounds the suppressed patricide in “Julius Caesar” (Shakespeare ignores the fact that Brutus was Caesar’s illegitimate son, thus implying an invariant (beloved-)father/(legitimate-)son pair), and then uses this omission as one key in tracing the Oedipal fault line in the later play.  Here deconstruction yields, not a new meaning to “Hamlet”, as one could say Derrida does in his discussion of prefaces in Hegel, but a new richness to our understanding of Shakespeare’s work.

This highlights the fact that deconstruction plays a different role in literature than in philosophy.  Deconstruction tends to be used in literary theory in arguments between and among theorists about the value of their theories, rather than about the value of the texts under discussion.  One deconstructs Kant to argue with Kant (and perhaps others), but one doesn’t deconstruct Shakespeare to argue with Shakespeare (or, as we saw above, Cézanne to argue with Cézanne).  In addition, literary deconstruction is about texts that are of a different nature than the deconstruction itself, while the deconstruction of one philosophical text results in another philosophical text.  This makes it much clearer in philosophy that deconstructive texts can themselves be, in fact must be, deconstructed.  What literary deconstruction produces, on the other hand, is not itself literature.  This doesn’t mean that literary deconstructions cannot be deconstructed, but that they are not deconstructed in the same way that they are constructed. The context in which such a deconstruction might be carried out, is quite different from the context in which the original deconstructive text was created.  Put another way, literary deconstruction assumes the possibility and reality of literature in at least some sense of the term, whereas deconstruction as a philosophical enterprise questions, at its most basic level, the possibility of philosophy itself.

c. Contentions and Confrontations

Deconstruction has always been engaged in active dialogue with other contemporary approaches to philosophical and literary texts.  The most productive of these conversations have been with those schools of thought that are closest in history and orientation to deconstruction, often sharing its roots in Heidegger’s work.  At the same time, the issues raised in those debates are often similar to those raised by more strident critics completely opposed to the deconstructive enterprise.  A brief summary of some of the most notable confrontations, across more than twenty years, offers an opportunity to consider the most powerful objections to deconstruction, from the end of the 20th century, onwards.

The 1981 conversation between deconstruction (in the person of Derrida) and hermeneutics (in the person of Hans-Georg Gadamer) raises at least two recurrent themes.  The first has already been indirectly discussed—the charge that deconstruction is a negative enterprise.  Gadamer, who speaks of the debate as one between Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and Derrida’s, calls deconstruction a “repudiation” of the “language of concepts” that is the legacy of European philosophy (DD 101).  As already noted, however, deconstruction is always a question and a double movement aware of its own debt to the texts it deconstructs, and so never a repudiation.  The second charge is that deconstruction does not allow for the possibility that a word can be redefined or used independently of its traditional metaphysical meaning.  Gadamer raises this point with regard to “understanding” in general, “self-understanding” and “dialectic”, asking why these terms must be considered part of metaphysics when used in the way he uses them.  This argument is weakened, however, by Gadamer’s own reference to “an older wisdom that speaks in living language”, thus affirming the continuing echo of the tradition even in the most carefully redefined or well-intentioned philosophical terms (DD 95-99).

Although directed at postmodernism, the 1990 exchange between major feminist theorists recorded in Feminist Contentions raises some of the same themes as the earlier debate, but also bears directly on the feminist reception of deconstruction in the United States. The feminists who argue here against postmodernism, and by extension against deconstruction, make the case that political action requires a stronger basis than either of these is capable of providing.  Seyla Benhabib, for instance, acknowledges that subjectivity is largely shaped by language and other symbolic structures, but insists that there must remain some sense in which “we are both author and character at once” in our own life histories.  She argues that, in order to be politically effective in the face of women’s sometimes tenuous sense of self and lack of autonomy, feminist philosophy requires a core of irreducible selfhood and agency that deconstruction would deny (FC 21-22).  As Judith Butler points out however, this line of argument precludes the possibility of any “political opposition” to the self as traditionally understood because it allows us no political way to move beyond the traditional metaphysical dualisms (author/character, authority/submission, self/other, autonomy/heteronomy, and back to, e.g.,  male/female) (FC 36).

In her response to Butler, Benhabib emphasizes another recurring theme in debates about deconstruction:  “how can one be constituted by discourse without being determined by it?”  That is, how does the deconstructive understanding of the self as opaque and internally divided provide a starting point for social and political critique (FC 110)?  We have seen, however, that for deconstruction discourse is neither monolithic nor unequivocal, which means that it cannot be fully determinative of the self, either.  The very lack of a permanent, substantial self in the usual sense that Benhabib and others criticize in deconstruction, is at the same time, what creates the possibility of agency outside and beyond the world of fixed essences and meanings envisioned by the philosophical tradition.  (A Cartesian self, Descartes himself tells us in the Meditations, is most free when it has no choice but to follow Reason.)  The complexities here can be seen in the way deconstructive texts themselves often grapple with these same questions about the possibility of personal and political agency (see below) but, as might be expected, come up with no final answer.

The 1993 confrontation between deconstruction and the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty raises similar points.  Rorty accuses Derrida of being a humanist in the sense of a follower of the Enlightenment, while he suggests that deconstruction itself diverts attention, at least in the United States, away from real politics (which he later defines as “a matter of pragmatic, short-term reforms and compromises”).  He embraces the deconstructive understanding of language, which he likens to Ludwig Wittgenstein’s, but denies that the consequences of a Wittgensteinian theory of language can be meaningfully applied to the natural sciences.  He argues instead for an empiricist and naturalist position in science, that he sees to be in conflict with the “transcendental” side of deconstruction, that is, its continuing concern with metaphysics and the resultant tendency to see science as a form of metaphysical materialism (DP 14-17).

In response, Derrida accepts some commonality between pragmatism and deconstruction, but defends the asking of the transcendental question and the refusal to do away with metaphysics altogether as a defense against “empiricism, positivism, and psychologism”.  He also refers to his work on the inevitability of violence in the political realm, which counters the tacit optimism in Rorty’s political views (DP 81-83).  Derrida’s argument is that the political state relies on the rule of law, and the rule of law, in turn, relies on the power to punish, that is, on violence, which is therefore the ground of the political state.  His later work on immigration also underscores the dependence of the political state on a sharp and often violent boundary between who has the full rights of  democratic citizenship (“fraternity” in the French context)–that is, the citizen, the landowner, the freeman, all always male–and who does not (aliens, peasants, slaves, women).

Philosophy in a Time of Terror (2003) is not a direct confrontation between deconstruction and Jürgen Habermas’ theory of communicative action, but illustrates the continuity of themes among those critical of deconstruction over the preceding twenty years.  In the context of 9/11, Habermas’ remarks acknowledges the structural violence that underlies the successful societies of what he terms the West. But then questions the “deconstructivist suspicion”, that the model of communication that works reasonably well in everyday situations, will no longer be adequate when we move to larger conversations between political and social groups.  He argues that insisting dialogue is “nothing but” displaced violence obscures the potential of dialogue for ending violence without creating new pretexts for it (PT 35-38).  He similarly objects to the deconstruction of the concept of tolerance as always an exercise of the power to tolerate or not, because the toleration demanded in a democracy is one between equals and thus mutual rather than paternalistic.  He also finds a certain circularity in deconstruction, since it seems to rely on the same universalism, tolerance, and so forth , it seeks to undo.

As already noted, however, this double gesture is itself the essence of deconstruction.  Derrida, for his part, points out that the “major events” that provoke the kind of communication between groups Habermas refers to are more often, if not exclusively, those that directly affect Europe and the United States and not, for instance, an equal number of deaths in Somalia or the Sudan.  What is threatened by 9/11, he goes on, is exactly a particular context of interpretation that has dominated the dialogues between “the West” and its Other, legitimating some forms of violence while disallowing others (PT 92-93).  He reasserts his reading of toleration as an exercise of paternalistic, or specifically religious, power (PT 127).  One does not ask an oppressed group to “tolerate” their oppressors; it is something asked only of those in a position to grant or deny such toleration.  He also questions the possibility of an actually existing democracy, due to the violence of power relations (PT 120), much less the possibility of a democracy in which different groups would be sufficiently equal for toleration to be genuinely mutual.

This last contestation between Habermas and Derrida, is indirect because it was in the form of separate interviews, illustrates three main points.  One, already noted, is the continuity of objections to deconstruction over an extended period of time, primarily focused around issues of the everyday vs. the transcendental (a dualism that deconstruction seeks to undermine) and the political implications of deconstruction.  The second is the lingering impression that these confrontations rely more on contradiction than on real attempts at communication, or even argument.  A method that questions everything, including itself and even the concept of method, as deconstruction does, leaves critics little concrete substance to criticize, except the circularity and the double gesture that deconstruction embraces.  At the same time, the third point to be noted is the increasing engagement of deconstruction with politics after 1989, if not directly in response to these challenges, at least in the context of their persistence.

d. Later Versions

In the 2001 interview about 9/11, Derrida makes a series of statements about the nature of deconstruction that suggest both similarities and differences from his earlier pronouncements.  He defines the deconstructive philosopher as someone “who analyzes and then draws the practical and effective consequences of the relationship between our philosophical heritage and the structure of the still dominant juridico-political system that is so clearly undergoing mutation” (PT 106).  The explicit emphasis on both politics and the pragmatic is as marked as the much more obscure references that were more common thirty years earlier.  At the same time, he emphatically repeats the double gesture of affirming his faith in and allegiance to the idea of an international law that is, like democracy, unrealizable and, again like democracy, undecidable, that is, impossible even to envision without contradiction (PT 115).  Finally, he refers back to “Plato’s Pharmacy” to suggest that the political state is, like writing for Socrates, “at once remedy and poison”, something we can live neither with, because of its inherent violence, nor without, because only the state can protect us from the violence it engenders (PT 124).

Deconstruction retains it critical edge well into the 21st century, even when directed against closely allied texts.  For instance, the 2001 address Derrida gave upon receiving the Theodor Adorno Prize turns back on Adorno himself, specifically on his privileging of the German language even as he champions globalism and a united Europe.  This deconstruction centers in the familiar manner on the untranslatably ambiguous French word fichu (n. neckerchief; adj., lost or done for).  The word appears in French in a letter to Adorno’s wife by Walter Benjamin, who uses it in describing a dream where he speaks of “changing a poem into a fichu” in the first sense (neckerchief or scarf).  This fichu is then associated in the dream with the letter “d”, which Derrida suggests might refer to a name Benjamin used in signing letters, or to his sister or his wife, both named Dora.  Derrida then goes on to point out that “dora” in Greek can mean scorched or scratched skin, hence linking it to fichu in the second sense, but also to Auschwitz and to 9/11, which was Adorno’s birthdate (PM 164-181).  In an excellent example of the deconstruction of a deconstruction, the English translator of this address inserts a footnote here to add that “dor”, meaning gift, is also part of Adorno’s given name, Theodor, “gift of the gods” (PM 203).

Clearly gender plays a central role in the deconstructive process in “Fichus”.  If the fault line or rifts in traditional philosophical texts are the result of attempts to exclude from philosophy what it cannot control, Woman (i.e., Adorno’s wife, Benjamin’s wife and sister, any woman who wears a fichu) will be one of the constant sites of deconstructive undoing.  Death also becomes of increasing importance in deconstruction, as shown in Derrida’s late works focused on the death of the father, the mother, and eventually his own.  In addition to the connection psychoanalysis makes between women and death, both these themes are revealed by deconstruction to be at the root of what the philosophical tradition has always sought to avoid.  Writing, for Socrates, can be deceptive (like a woman), or wander from the source like an illegitimate son (born to such a woman).   Socrates does not say either “woman” or “death”,  but the hatred of writing, deconstruction argues, as of all manifestations of our embodiment in Plato and the tradition he inaugurates, is fundamentally a “motivated repression” of what always exceeds philosophy, the philosopher’s body, his desires, and ultimately his death.

3. Feminist Deconstruction

The connection between deconstruction and feminist readings of the European tradition, although implicit in Derrida’s work since “Plato’s Pharmacy” (1972), was made explicit in a 1981 interview with Christie V. McDonald called “Choreographies”.  Much earlier, however, feminist theorists in France were incorporating deconstructive strategies in their work.  In their 1975 book The Newly Born Woman, for instance, Hélène Cixous and Catherine Clément underscore the series of hierarchical oppositions (good/bad, life/death, day/night, culture/nature, male/female) that provide most, if not all, of the key terms that open a text to a deconstructive reading.  The list, which carries a footnoted reference to Derrida, is not, as we have already seen, an innocent one.  In Plato the pair speech/writing is one central theme; in the ancient Greeks generally, active/passive; in religion God/man, later Christian/Jew; in René Descartes and the moderns mind/body; in colonial or racist ideology Western/Oriental, white/black.  In a further repetition of Derrida’s method, Cixous and Clément’s move is not to reverse these hierarchies, which would only create another system of power.  They seek instead to think in a third way.  This third way is called “bisexuality” here, meaning the refusal to focus on a single sexual organ in favor of undifferentiated pleasures of the flesh (NBW 84-85).  This move to rethink sexuality as part of a deconstructive strategy, drawing on psychoanalysis and anthropological texts such as Marcel Mauss’ “Essay on the Gift”, is a common theme in French feminist deconstruction, also found, for example, in the work of Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva (and in later texts by Derrida himself).

Given the importance of Sigmund Freud’s work to this strain of feminist deconstruction, Sarah Kofman’s 1980 book on Freud provides a detailed example of the potential power of this method for feminist thought.  One major fault line she examines is the concept of “penis envy”, a phenomenon that is supposedly central to the process that transforms bisexual creatures into women.  Kofman notes, however, that this process amounts to transforming into a woman “a little girl who has first been a little boy” because within psychoanalysis pre-Oedipal bisexuality affirms the “original predominance of masculinity (in both sexes)” (EW 111-122).  She draws extensively on Freud’s biography, as well as his texts, to make clear how he characterizes women as defined both by lack (their penis envy) and their excess (“her narcissistic self-sufficiency and her indifference” which leaves the male “emptied of this original narcissism in favor of the love object” [EW 52]), another classic deconstructive self-contradiction.  Ultimately, she argues that penis envy, Freud’s “idée fixe”, and indeed his whole account of femininity and female sexuality, “allows him to blame nature for the cultural injustice by which man subordinates woman’s sexual desires to his”.  She also notes Freud’s surprise that, given all this, women might be hostile to men or frigid (EW 208-209).

In The Man of Reason (1984) Genevieve Lloyd undertakes a feminist reading on a larger historical scale, deconstructing (although she does not use that term) major philosophical texts from Plato to Simone de Beauvoir along a fault line that would equate reason with the masculine.  The hierarchical dualism found in deconstruction (speech/writing, male/female, and so forth.)  in epistemologically-oriented English language philosophy take the form rational/irrational, knowledge/ignorance, and so forth.  Lloyd traces the ways in which these last two pairs maintained a powerfully gendered meaning as the concept of Reason itself evolved through the history of European philosophy.  After 1600, public/private and universal/particular became politically important additions to the list; in the twentieth century existentialism adds transcendence/embodiment.  Most important, Lloyd says, has been the underlying pair superior/inferior.  As we have already seen, whatever is on the masculine side of the dichotomy is assumed, simply from that fact, to have value; whatever is the feminine side, to have none.  Again, like Derrida, Cixous and Clément, Lloyd rejects a move to reverse this polarity because “ironically, it [would] occur in a space already prepared for it by the intellectual tradition it seeks to reject” (MR 105).  Perhaps more optimistic than her French counterparts, Lloyd ends with her own version of the deconstructive double gesture:  “Philosophy has defined ideals of Reason through exclusions of the feminine.  But it also contains within it the resources for critical reflection on those ideals and on its own aspirations” (MR 109).

4. References and Further Readings

a. References

  • Benhabib, Seyla, Judith Butler, Drucilla Cornell, and Nancy Fraser. Feminist Contentions: A Philosophical Exchange. New York: Routledge, 1995. (FC)
  • Bloom, Harold, Paul de Man, Jacques Derrida, Geoffrey Hartman, and J. Hillis Miller. Deconstruction and Criticism. New York: The Seabury Press,1979. (DC)
  • Borradori, Giovanna. Philosophy in a Time of Terror: Dialogues with Jürgen Harbermas and Jacques Derrida. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003. (PT)
  • Cixous, Hélène, and Catherine Clément. The Newly Born Woman, Betsy Wing, trans. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986. (NBW)
  • Critchley, Simon, Jacques Derrida, Ernesto Laclau, and Richard Rorty. Deconstruction and Pragmatism, Chantal Mouffe, ed. New York: Routledge, 1996. (DP)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions, Alan Bass, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (P)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination, Barbara Johnson, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (D)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Ear of the Other: Otobiography, Transference, Translation, Christie V. McDonald, ed., Peggy Kamuf, trans. NewYork: Schocken, 1985. (EO)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Truth in Painting, Geoff Bennington and Ian McLeod, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987. (TP)
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Christie V. McDonald. “Choreographies”, in Feminist Interpretations of Jacques Derrida, Nancy J. Holland, ed. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Paper Machine, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005. (PM)
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Words of Descartes, Volume I, Elizabeth S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross, trans. (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1911).
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time, John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson, trans. New York: Harper, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. “The Origin of the Work of Art” in Poetry, Language, Thought, Albert Hofstadter, trans. New York: Harper, 1971.
  • Jones, Ernest. Hamlet and Oedipus. New York: Doubleday, 1954.
  • Kofman, Sarah. The Enigma of Woman: Woman in Freud’s Writings, Catherine Porter, trans. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1985. (EW)
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984. (MR)
  • Michelfelder, Diane P., and Richard E. Palmer, eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1989. (DD)

b. Additional Readings

  • Armour, Ellen T.  Deconstruction, Feminist Theology, and the Problem of Difference. Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the political use of deconstruction.
  • Bordo, Susan R.  The Flight to Objectivity:  Essays on Cartesianism & Culture.  Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1987.
    • Excellent, accessible feminist deconstruction of Descartes.
  • Cornell, Drucilla.  Beyond Accommodation:  Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction, and the Law. Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the use of deconstruction in legal theory.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Writing and Difference, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • Early deconstructions of Foucault, Hegel, Husserl, and others.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Margins – Of Philosophy, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • Early deconstructions of Heidegger, Hegel, and J. L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Anne Dufourmantelle.  Of Hospitality, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2000.
    • Addresses issues of gender, immigration, and the political state.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Rogues:  Two Essays on Reason, Pascale-Anne Brault and Michael Naas.  Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • Excellent political and feminist late deconstruction.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Psyche:  Inventions of the Other, Volume II, Peggy Kamuf and Elizabeth Rottenber, eds.  Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Includes both “Geschlecht” articles on Heidegger and gender, plus other important papers from 1998-2003.
  • Fraser, Nancy.  Unruly Practices:  Power, Discourse and Gender in Contemporary Social Theory.  Minneapolis:  University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
    • A major feminist theorist who is critical of deconstruction.
  • Kofman, Sarah.  Selected Writings, Thomas Albrecht, ed., with Georgia Albert and Elizabeth Rotten berg.   Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2007.
  • Moi, Toril, ed.  The Kristeva Reader.  New York:  Columbia University Press, 1986.
  • Sellers, Susan, ed.  The Hélène Cixous Reader.  New York:  Routledge, 1994. (CR)
  • Silverman, Hugh J., and Gary Aylesworth, eds.   The Textual Sublime:  Deconstruction and its Differences.   Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1990.
    • Several interesting articles on deconstruction, including one by Paul DeMan.
  • Taylor, Mark C., ed.  Deconstruction in Context:  Literature and Philosophy.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1986.
    • Collection of philosophical writings from Kant onward that provides some of the historical context for deconstruction.
  • Whitford, Margaret, ed.  The Irigaray Reader.  Malden, MA:  Blackwell, 1991.

Author Information

Nancy J. Holland
Hamline University
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 14, 2012 | Originally published: