Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Deductive and Inductive Arguments

deductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be (deductively) valid, that is, to provide a guarantee of the truth of the conclusion provided that the argument’s premises (assumptions) are true. This point can be expressed also by saying that, in a deductive argument, the premises are intended to provide such strong support for the conclusion that, if the premises are true, then it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false. An argument in which the premises do succeed in guaranteeing the conclusion is called a (deductively) valid argument. If a valid argument has true premises, then the argument is said to be sound.

Here is a valid deductive argument: It’s sunny in Singapore. If it’s sunny in Singapore, he won’t be carrying an umbrella. So, he won’t be carrying an umbrella.

Here is a mildly strong inductive argument: Every time I’ve walked by that dog, he hasn’t tried to bite me. So, the next time I walk by that dog he won’t try to bite me.

An inductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer merely to establish or increase the probability of its conclusion. In an inductive argument, the premises are intended only to be so strong that, if they were true, then it would be unlikely that the conclusion is false. There is no standard term for a successful inductive argument. But its success or strength is a matter of degree, unlike with deductive arguments. A deductive argument is valid or else invalid.

The difference between the two kinds of arguments does not lie solely in the words used; it comes from the relationship the author or expositor of the argument takes there to be between the premises and the conclusion. If the author of the argument believes that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion (due to definition, logical entailment, logical structure, or mathematical necessity), then the argument is deductive. If the author of the argument does not think that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion, but nonetheless believes that their truth provides good reason to believe the conclusion true, then the argument is inductive.

Some analysts prefer to distinguish inductive arguments from conductive arguments; the latter are arguments giving explicit reasons for and against a conclusion, and requiring the evaluator of the argument to weigh these considerations, i.e., to consider the pros and cons. This article considers conductive arguments to be a kind of inductive argument.

The noun “deduction” refers to the process of advancing or establishing a deductive argument, or going through a process of reasoning that can be reconstructed as a deductive argument. “Induction” refers to the process of advancing an inductive argument, or making use of reasoning that can be reconstructed as an inductive argument.

Because deductive arguments are those in which the truth of the conclusion is thought to be completely guaranteed and not just made probable by the truth of the premises, if the argument is a sound one, then the truth of the conclusion is said to be “contained within” the truth of the premises; that is, the conclusion does not go beyond what the truth of the premises implicitly requires. For this reason, deductive arguments are usually limited to inferences that follow from definitions, mathematics and rules of formal logic. Here is a deductive argument:

John is ill. If John is ill, then he won’t be able to attend our meeting today. Therefore, John won’t be able to attend our meeting today.

That argument is valid due to its logical structure. If ‘ill’ were replaced with ‘happy’, the argument would still be valid because it would retain its special logical structure (called modus ponens). Here is the form of any argument having the structure of modus ponens:

P

If P then Q

So, Q

The capital letters stand for declarative sentences, or statements, or propositions. The investigation of these logical forms is called Propositional Logic.

The question of whether all, or merely most, valid deductive arguments are valid because of their structure is still controversial in the field of the philosophy of logic, but that question will not be explored further in this article.

Inductive arguments can take very wide ranging forms. Inductive arguments might conclude with some claim about a group based only on information from a sample of that group. Other inductive arguments draw conclusions by appeal to evidence or authority or causal relationships. Here is a somewhat strong inductive argument based on authority:

The police said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is an inductive argument based on evidence:

The witness said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is a stronger inductive argument based on better evidence:

Two independent witnesses claimed John committed the murder. John’s fingerprints are the only ones on the murder weapon. John confessed to the crime. So, John committed the murder.

This last argument is no doubt good enough for a jury to convict John, but none of these three arguments about John committing the murder is strong enough to be called valid. At least itt is not valid in the technical sense of ‘deductively valid’. However, some lawyers will tell their juries that these are valid arguments, so we critical thinkers need to be on the alert as to how people around us are using the term.

It is worth noting that some dictionaries and texts improperly define “deduction” as reasoning from the general to specific and define “induction” as reasoning from the specific to the general. These definitions are outdated and inaccurate. For example, according to the more modern definitions given above, the following argument from the specific to general is deductive, not inductive, because the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion:

The members of the Williams family are Susan, Nathan and Alexander.
Susan wears glasses.
Nathan wears glasses.
Alexander wears glasses.
Therefore, all members of the Williams family wear glasses.

Moreover, the following argument, even though it reasons from the general to specific, is inductive:

It has snowed in Massachusetts every December in recorded history.
Therefore, it will snow in Massachusetts this coming December.

It is worth noting that the proof technique used in mathematics called “mathematical induction”, is deductive and not inductive. Proofs that make use of mathematical induction typically take the following form:

Property P is true of the number 0.
For all natural numbers n, if P holds of n then P also holds of n + 1.
Therefore, P is true of all natural numbers.

When such a proof is given by a mathematician, it is thought that if the premises are true, then the conclusion follows necessarily. Therefore, such an argument is deductive by contemporary standards.

Because the difference between inductive and deductive arguments involves the strength of evidence which the author believes the premises to provide for the conclusion, inductive and deductive arguments differ with regard to the standards of evaluation that are applicable to them. The difference does not have to do with the content or subject matter of the argument. Indeed, the same utterance may be used to present either a deductive or an inductive argument, depening on the intentions of the person advancing it. Consider as an example.

Dom Perignon is a champagne, so it must be made in France.

It might be clear from context that the speaker believes that having been made in the Champagne area of France is part of the defining feature of “champagne” and so the conclusion follows from the premise by definition. If it is the intention of the speaker that the evidence is of this sort, then the argument is deductive. However, it may be that no such thought is in the speaker’s mind. He or she may merely believe that nearly all champagne is made in France, and may be reasoning probabilistically. If this is his or her intention, then the argument is inductive.

It is also worth noting that, at its core, the distinction between deductive and inductive  has to do with the strength of the justification that the author or expositor of the argument intends that the premises provide for the conclusion. If the argument is logically fallacious, it may be that the premises actually do not provide justification of that strength, or even any justification at all. Consider, the following argument:

All odd numbers are integers.
All even numbers are integers.
Therefore, all odd numbers are even numbers.

This argument is logically fallacious because it is invalid. In actuality, the premises provide no support whatever for the conclusion. However, if this argument were ever seriously advanced, we must assume that the author would believe that the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. Therefore, this argument is still deductive. A bad deductive argument is not an inductive argument.

See also the articles on “Argument” and “Validity and Soundness” in this encyclopedia.

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Last updated: May 11, 2013 | Originally published: