The beginnings of English Deism appear in the seventeenth century. Its main principles are to be found in the writings of Lord Herbert of Cherbury (d. 1648), who devoted the latter part of a life spent in a military and diplomatic career to a search for a standard and a guide in the conflicts of creeds and systems. He was a friend of Grotius, Casaubon, and Gassendi, and during a long sojourn in France made himself acquainted with the thought of Montaigne, of Bodin, and especially of Charron. His works are: De Veritate (Paris, 1624); Cherbury. De religions Gentilium errorumque apud eos causes (London, 1645); and two minor treatises, De cause errorum and De religions laici. The first work advances a theory of knowledge based upon the recognition of innate universal characteristics on the object perceived, and rigidly opposed to knowledge supernatural in its origin and determinable in only by strife and conflict. The second work lays down the common marks by which religious truth is recognized. These are (1) a belief in the existence of the Deity, (2) the obligation to reverence such a power, (3) the identification of worship with practical morality, (4) the obligation to repent of sin and to abandon it, and, (5) divine recompense in this world and the next. These five essentials (the so-called “Five Articles” of the English Deists) constitute the nucleus of all religions and of Christianity in its primitive, uncorrupted form. The variations between positive religions are explained as due partly to the allegorization of nature, partly to self-deception, the workings of imagination, and priestly guile.
Rejection of theological supernaturalism stands out as the most conspicuous characteristic in Hobbes’s philosophical writings (d. 1679), which were inspired by the teachings of the new mathematical and natural sciences. The different religions are explained as the product of human fear interpreting natural phenomena in anthropomorphic form, or, in their higher aspects, as the outcome of reflection on causal relation in the universe. Miracles and revelations are in themselves improbable, and may be most easily explained as the imaginings of the ignorant. Positive religion is the creation of the State, and the sovereign justly possesses unconditional power to enforce its prescriptions, for only in this way can religious strife be avoided. Between religion thus naturally explained and a prophetic and Christian revelation Hobbes, nevertheless, attempted to mediate; he mentions as the means that might lead to such a reconciliation the rational interpretation of miracles, the differentiation between the inner moral sense of Scripture and mere figurative expression, and the historical criticisms of Biblical sources. The entire apparatus of Rationalism is here to be found, limited only in its application. Further, Spinoza’s Tractatus theologico-politicus (1670) and Bayle’s Dictionnaire (1695-97) were effective in shaping the character of Deism. Of no small importance, also, was the rise of a literature of comparative religion and the publication of ethnographical studies and works of travel. China, Arabia, Egypt, Persia, India, and primal regions, were brought within the horizon of religious investigation. Philosophy, beginning with Locke’s theory of knowledge, and natural science, with Newton’s theory of gravitation, contributed to the opposition with which theological dogma was confronted. Yet their attitude was not one of hostility to religions which they sought rather to utilize for the purpose of establishing the desired universal standard of truth. Newton and Boyle succeeded in reconciling the creed of the Church with their mechanical metaphysics; and this union remained characteristic of England, so that even men like Priestley and Hartley did not shrink from supporting their materialistic theories by theological arguments. We have here the blending of a sensualistic epistemology, a mechanical-teleological metaphysics, a historical criticism, and an a prioristic ethics whose product in the shape of natural religion was destined first to undermine Christianity, then to compete with it, and finally to supplant it.
These various tendencies could not show themselves fully under the ecclesiastical restraint of the Restoration, yet they appear clearly enough in the writings of Charles Blount (d. 1693), usually placed second to Herbert in the lists of Deists. Like his predecessor, Blount dwells on the conflict between rival religions, and finds a standard of adjustment in a fusion of Herbert’s theory of universal characteristics with Hobbes’s prescription by the State. Like Hobbes and Spinoza, he touches serious problems of Biblical criticism at this early date. Freedom from prejudice is his boast; he asserts the supernatural character of Christianity on the basis of its miracles, after he has already rendered them dubious by parallels with non-Christian miracles. His works were: Anima mundi (London, 1679), Great is Diana of the Ephesians (1680), and The Two First Books of Philostratus concerning the Life of Apollonius Tyaneus, published in English with notes (1680).
The Revolution of 1688, the establishment of the freedom of the press in 1694, the political favor that was bestowed on the new tendencies in theology, in opposition to the stricter Anglicanism which was tainted with Stuart partizanship, were conditions favorable to the development of the seed that had already been planted. Parallel with the liberalization of orthodox dogma, there ran a more radical development with the attainment of a standard for the testing of the contents of revelation. Of surpassing importance in this direction was the influence and work of John Locke (d. 1704), who, in the field of theology, found his starting point, like most prominent thinkers of the age, in the conflict of systems, doctrines, and practices. Out of his reflections on the data of experience he developed a mechanical-teleological metaphysics and an empirical-utilitarian ethics, the latter agreeing, with the old idea of lex naturae in that ethical experience merely confirms the connection established by a teleological government of the universe between certain acts and their consequences. In spite of his supernaturalist tendencies, Locke nevertheless maintained, in his Letters on Toleration (1689-92), that only rational demonstration, and not compulsion or mere assertion, can establish the validity of revelation. In the Essay concerning Human Understanding (1690) he had investigated the conception of revelation from the epistemological standpoint, and laid down the criteria by which the true revelation is to be distinguished from other doctrines which claim such authority. Strict proof of the formal character of revelation must be adduced; the tradition which communicates it to us must be fully accredited by both external and internal evidence; and its content must be shown to correspond with rational metaphysics and ethics. Revelation is revelation; but, after it is once given, it may be shown a posteriori to be rational, i.e., capable of being deduced from the premises of our reason. Only where this is possible is there a presumption in favor of the purely mysterious parts of revelation. Where these criteria are disregarded the way is open to the excesses of sects and priesthoods by which religion, the differentia of reasoning man, has often made him appear less rational than the beasts. Locke advances therefore the remarkable conception of a revelation that reveals only the reasonable and the universally cognizable. The practical consequences of the thesis are deduced in his Reasonableness of Christianity as Delivered in the Scriptures(1695), which aims at the termination of religious strife through the recovery of the truths of primitive, rational Christianity. From the Gospels and the Acts, as distinguished from the Epistles, he elicits as the fundamental Christian truths the doctrine of the messiahship of Jesus and that of the kingdom of God. Inseparably connected with these are the recognition of Jesus as ruler of this kingdom, forgiveness of sins, and subjection to the moral law of the. kingdom. This law is identical with the ethical portion of the law of Moses, which in its turn corresponds to the lex naturae or rationis. The Gospel is but the divine summary and exposition of the law of nature, and it is the advantage of Christianity over pagan creeds and philosophies that it offers this law of nature intelligibly, with divine authority, and free from merely ceremonial sacerdotalism. To do this it requires the aid of a supernatural revelation, whose message is attainable through reason also, but only in an imperfect way.
Deducing the full consequences of Locke’s theory, John Toland (d. 1722), in his Christianity not Mysterious (1696), maintained that the content of revelation must neither contradict nor transcend the dictates of reason. Revelation is not the basis of truth, but only a ” means of information ” by which man may arrive at knowledge, the sanction for which must be found in reason. Primitive Christianity knew nothing of mystery, whose sources are Judaic and Greek, and the original Christian use of the word mysterium conveyed no idea of that which transcended reason. The basis is thus laid for the critical study of early Christianity. Further problems of Biblical criticism and the distinction between the diverse parties in primitive Christianity are advanced in Toland’s Amyntor (1699) and Nazarenus ; or Jewish, Gentile and illahometan Christianity (1718). In like manner, Anthony Collins (d. 1729), in his Discourse of Freethinking (1713), developed the consequences of Locke’s propositions. Revelation depends for its sanction upon its agreement with reason, and what is contrary to reason is not revelation. Practical morality is independent of dogma, which, on the contrary, has been the cause of much evil in the history of the world. Christ and the Apostles, the prototypes. of the freethinkers, never made use of supernatural authority, but confined themselves to simple, rational demonstration. Collins’s work elicited numerous replies; but none really made answer to his main thesis. After remaining silent for eleven years, Collins renewed the contest with a contribution on prophecy and miracles. Setting out from Locke’s proposition that revelation was truth sanctioned by reason, he found it a simple step to reject prophecy and miracles as non-essential characteristics of religion, amounting at most to mere didactic devices. The mathematician William Whiston (d. 1752) gave a new impulse to the controversy by the publication of The True Text (1722), in which the lack of real concordance between the New Testament interpretation of Old Testament prophecies is pointed out, and the prevailing allegorical method of reconciling such differences summarily rejected. The present form of the Old Testament is characterized as a forgery perpetrated by the Jews, and an attempt is made by Whiston to restore the original text. Collins, in his Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion (1724), agreed with Whiston as to the discrepancies between the two Testaments, but defended the allegorical method of interpretation. Thomas Woolston (d. 1733) came to the support of Collins in this controversy over the Biblical prophecies; and when his opponents shifted their appeal from the prophecies to the miraculous acts of Jesus he applied his destructive allegorical method to those also, in his Discourses on the Miracles of our Saviour (1727-30).
Matthew Tindal (d. 1733), in his dialogue Christianity as Old as the Creation, or the Gospel a Republication of the Religion of Nature (1730), produced the standard text-book of Deism. Proceeding from Locke’s proposition of the identity of the truths of revelation with those of reason, he adduces a new array of arguments in support of that position. The goodness of God, the vast extent of the earth, the long duration of human life on earth render it improbable that only to Jews and Christians was vouchsafed the favor of perceiving truth. We now have brought in the classic example of the three hundred million Chinese who surely could not all be excluded from the truth, and Confucianism begins to be extolled against much that is repugnant and harsh in the Mosaic law. Christianity, to be the truth, must find the substance in all religions; it must be as old as creation. The doctrines of the fall and of original sin can not stand, since it is irrational to believe in the exclusion from the truth of the vast majority of humanity. Tindal’s position is orthodox to the extent that Judaism and Christianity are acknowledged as revelations, though revelations only of the lex naturae, which is identified with natural religion, the primitive, uncorrupted faith, consisting in “the practise of morality in obedience to the will of God.” An echo of the teachings of Tindal is found in Thomas Chubb (d. 1747), whoseTrue Gospel of Jesus Christ (1738) attempts to prove that what Jesus sought to teach his followers was but natural morality, or the law of nature.
Thomas Morgan (d. 1743) continued Tindal’s argument on its historical side in The Moral Philosopher (1737-40),displaying much originality in tracing the development of heathen religions, as well as of Judaism and Christianity. Abandoning the old method of deriving specific religions from priestly deception, he explains their rise through the gradual supplanting of the one God of the law of nature by a crowd of divinities connected with definite natural phenomena. The legislation of Moses, under Egyptian influences, imposed a rigid and nationally restricted form upon the lex naturae, and the Jewish ritual and ceremonial is in essence a purely political institution. Full revelation of the law of nature came with Christ, who gave to the world in concentrated form the truth that had already been revealed to Confucius, Zoroaster, Socrates, and Plato. The protagonist of this divinely revealed truth after Christ was Paul, who, in his form of expression, indeed, was compelled to make concessions to the influence of Judaism, and in whom, therefore, much is to be taken figuratively. Peter, on the other hand, and the author of the Apocalypse misunderstood the import of the revelation of Christ and corrupted it in the spirit of Messianic Judaism. Persecution forced the two tendencies into union in the Catholic Church, and the Reformation has only partially succeeded in separating them. Morgan’s argument results, therefore, in the rejection of the formerly assumed identity between the law of Moses and the lex naturm, and the restriction of the latter, in the fullness of revelation, to Christianity. His conclusions were denied by William Warburton in The Divine Legation of Moses (1738-41). When the Christian apologists substituted for the argument from miracles the argument from personal witness and the credibility of Biblical evidence, Peter Annet (d. 1769), in his Resurrection of Jesus (1744), assailed the validity of such evidence, and first advanced the hypothesis of the illusory. death of Jesus, suggesting also that possibly Paul should be regarded as the founder of a new religion. In Supernaturals Examined (1747) Annet roundly denies the possibility of miracles. Conyers Middleton (d. 1750) in his later writings sought to bridge over the gulf between sacred and profane history, and to test them equally by the same method. His Inquiry into the Miraculous Powers (1748) demonstrates that the belief in miracles is common to primitive Christianity and heathen creeds, and that it developed to great proportions in the later life of the Church,, so that one is then confronted with an endless succession of miracle to which belongs the same degree of credibility that the apologists attributed to the miracles of the Bible. Though special reference to the New Testament was omitted, Middleton propounded a question to answer which no serious attempt was mad when he asked why credence should be granted to one faith that is denied to another.
The Deistic controversy died out in England about the middle of the eighteenth century. The Deistic literature had exhausted its stock of materials, while its tenets had never obtained a strong hold on the people. The cold, inflexible, rational supernaturalism of Paley (d. 1805) was considered as the final settlement of these long conflicts. From the beginning, however, there had been a class of critics, representatives of the old Renaissance spirit, and inimical, therefore, to the Stoic and Christian ethics, who had only partially shared the views of the Deists, and in some ways had advanced to a position far beyond them. Shaftesbury (d. 1713), in opposition to the utilitarian and supernaturalist ethics of Locke and Clarke, developed the conception of a strictly autonomous moral code having its basis in a moral instinct in man whose end is to bring individual and society to harmonious self-perfection. Bernard Mandeville (1733) adopted the Epicureanism of Hobbes and Gassendi, studied moral problems in the skeptical spirit of Montaigne and La Rochefoucauld, gave the preference to Bayle over the Deists, and developed empiricism into a sort of Agnosticism. He criticized the prevailing morality as a more conventional lie. Christianity-which the Deists had wished, while reforming, to maintain-he declared impossible, not only as a religion, but as a system of morality. His Free Thought on Religion (1720) has caused him to be included in the ranks of the Deists; but his real position is brought out in the Fable of the Bees (1714). Henry Dodwell (d. 1711), in Christianity not Founded on Argument(1742), attempted to demonstrate the invalidity of the rationalistic basis for Christian truth constructed by the Deists, from the very nature of the religious impulse, which, being opposed to rational argumentation, calls for the support of tradition and mystery, and finds fascination in the attitude of credo quia absurdum. The only proof proceeds from a mystic inner enlightenment; logical demonstrations like those of Clarke or the Boyle lectures are only destructive of religion. Bolingbroke (d. 1751) voices the French influence in a capricious and dilettante manner. Despising all religions as the product of enthusiasm, fraud, and superstition, he nevertheless concedes to real Christianity the possession of moral and rational truth; an advocate of freedom of thought, he supports an established church in the interest of the State and of public morals (Letters on the Study and Use of History 1752; Essays, 1753).
Far greater is the influence of David Hume (d. 1776), who summarized the Deistic criticism and raised it to the level of modern scientific method by emancipating it from the conception of a deity conceived through the reason and by abandoning its characteristic interpretation of history. He separates Locke’s theory of knowledge from its connection with a scheme of mechanical teleology and confines the human mind within the realm of sense perception. Beginning then with the crudest factors of experience and not with a religious and ethical norm, he traces the development of systems of religion, ethics, and philosophy in an ascending course through the ages. He thus overthrow the Deistic philosophy of religion while he developed their critical method to the extent of making it the starting-point for the English positivist philosophy of religion. Distinguishing between the metaphysical problem of the idea of God and the historical problem of the rise of religions, he denied the possibility of attaining a knowledge of deity through the reason, and explained religion as arising from the misconception or arbitrary misinterpretation of experience (Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, written in 1751, but not published till 1779; Natural History of Religion, 1757). Against the justification of religion by other means than rational Hume directs his celebrated critique of miracles, in which to the possibility of miraculous occurrences he opposes the possibility of error on the part of the observer or historian. Human experience, affected by ignorance, fancy, and the imaginings of fear and hope, explains sufficiently the growth of religion. Hume’s contemporaries failed to recognize the portentous transformation which he had effected in the character of Deism. The Scottish “common-sense school ” saved for a time the old natural theology and the theological argument from miracles to revelation; but in reality Hume’s skeptical method, continued by Hamilton and united to French Positivism by Mill and Browne, became, in connection with modern ethnology and anthropology, the basis of a psychological philosophy of religion in which the data of outward experience are the main factors (Evolutionism, Positivism, Agnosticism, Tylor, Spencer, Lubbock, Andrew Lang). In so far as Hume’s influence prevailed among his contemporaries, it may be said to have amalgamated with that of Voltaire; the “infidels,” as they were now called, were Voltairians. Most prominent among them was Gibbon (d. 1794), whose Decline and Fall offers the first dignified pragmatic treatment of the rise of Christianity. The fundamental principles of Deism became tinged in the nineteenth century with skepticism, pessimism, or pantheism, but the conceptions of natural religion retained largely their old character.
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Last updated: April 25, 2001 | Originally published: April/25/2001
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