French Deism

With other English influences Deism entered France, where, however, only its materialistic and revolutionary phases were seized upon, to the exclusion of that religiosity which had never been lost in England. French Deism stood outside of theology. The English writers who came to exercise the greatest influence were Hobbes, Locke, Shaftesbury, Pope, Bolingbroke, and Hume. Of the true Deists only Collins, the most critical and the least theological, became prominent.

Table of Contents

  1. Voltaire
  2. Encyclopedists
  3. Rousseau

1. Voltaire

Voltaire (d. 1778) embraced the conception of natural religion with ardor, and entered into a polemics against intolerance in Church and State relations as well as against the philosophy of the Church and the prevailing religious Cartesianism (Essai sur les mmurs et l’esprit des nations, 1754-58; Dictionnaire philosophique, 1764). He derived his natural philosophy from Newton and Clarke, his theory of knowledge and his ideas on toleration from Locke, the main principles of his ethics from Shaftesbury, his critical method and the conception of natural religion from the Deists. All phenomena are explained historically by the interaction between man and his environment, and all things are governed by God acting only in accordance with natural laws. Natural morality and religion are not entirely innate ideas, but rather simple and universally prevalent conditions standing in need of development and following a course that leads through errors arising from ignorance and fear to an ultimate standard truth which is characterized as the “fruit of the cultivated reason.” Deism is thereby emptied of all religious content and restricted to the field of morals and rational metaphysics.

All that is essentially characteristic of human nature is the same everywhere; all that depends on custom varies. The chief influences for changes in the human mind are climate, government, religion, and in opposition to these one should seek to arrive at the underlying, undiversified unity. “Dogma leads to fanaticism and strife; morality everywhere inspires harmony.” The rise of positive religions may be studied psychologically in children and savages. Fear and ignorance of the law of nature are the primary causes; the parallel growth of social groups and the need of authority cooperate. In China alone natural religion has escaped this pernicious development. India be came the home of theological speculation, and influenced the religions of the West, of which the most important was Judaism as the parent of Christianity and Islam. Moses was a shrewd politician; the prophets were enthusiasts like the dervishes, or else epileptics; Jesus was a visionary like the founder of the Quakers, and his religion received life only through its union with Platonism. Voltaire’s conception of the evolution of history entered deep into European thought. By the side of the party of the juste milieu and of good sense,” of which Voltaire is the most prominent representative, there arose a school which carried the doctrines of mechanism and sensualism to their furthest consequences. and evolved a philosophy of materialism.

2. Encyclopedists

The Encyclopedists removed from Deism the great factor of natural religion, retaining only its critical method as applied to the history of religion. The head of this school was Denis Diderot (d. 1784), and its great organ of expression was theEncyclopedie. The state censorship, however, compelled the projectors to call to their aid a number of contributors of conservative views and to bring their skeptical method to the task of defending the compromise between reason and revelation. In this spirit the main religious topics were treated, but by a subtle infusion of the spirit of Bayle and the expedient of cross-references from these articles to topics which might be handled with greater freedom, Diderot succeeded in supplying the desired corrective. It was the circle of Holbach (d. 1789) that dared to apply the most extreme consequences of materialism to religious questions. Helvetius (d. 1771) prepared the way with his De l’esprit (17,58), in which he expounded a materialistic psychology and ethics. Their moral theories, deriving though they did from Hobbes and Hume, lost all connection with the position of Deism, which became for them a mere armory of weapons for the destruction of all religion with its consequences, intolerance and moral corruption. Holbach is undoubtedly the author of the Systeme de la nature, which appeared in 1770 as the work of Mirabaud. The Systeme is not original in ascribing the beginnings of religion to human hope and fear and to ignorance of the laws of nature. Fraud, ambition, and unhealthy enthusiasm have made use of it as a means of political and social influence and have succeeded in crystallizing its primitive emotions into positive creeds, within which animistic tendencies have been developed and subtilized into systems of metaphysics and theology — the sources of irrational intolerance. From Holbach and his circle, and from the cognate group of the Encyclopedists, proceeded the so-called ideological school, who held the main problem of philosophy to be the analysis of the mental conceptions aroused by sensations from the material world (Condorcet, Naigeon, Garat, Volney, Dupuis, Saint-Lambert, Laplace, Cabinis, De Tracy, J. B. Say, Benjamin Constant, Bichat, Lamarck, Saint-Simon, Thurot, Stendhal). Out of this school, in turn, developed the positivism of Comte.

3. Rousseau

J. J. Rousseau (d. 1778) gave quite a different tendency to Deism. Accepting in the main the sensualism of Locke and the metaphysics of Clarke and Newton, he maintains after the manner of Shaftesbury and Diderot a belief in inborn moral instincts which he distinguishes as ” sentiments ” from mere acquired ideas; he is true to the position of Deism in connecting this moral “sentiment ” with a belief in God, and he protests against the separation between the two which the skepticism of Diderot had brought about. He was influenced by Richardson, as well as by Locke. “Sentiment ” becomes the basis of a metaphysical system built up out of the data of experience under the influence of the Deistic philosophy, but redeemed from formalism by constant reference to sentimentality and emotion as the principal sources of religion. The nature of religion is not dogmatic but moralistic, practical, and emotional. Rousseau, therefore, finds the essence of religion, not (like Voltaire) in the cultivated intellect, but in the naive and disinterested understanding of the uncultured. Conscious, rational progress in civilization, no less than supernaturalism in Church and State, is an outcome of the fall, when the will chose intellectual progress in preference to simple felicity. With Rousseau natural religion takes on a new meaning; “nature” is no longer universality or rationality in the cosmic order, in contrast to special supernatural and positive phenomena, but primitive simplicity and sincerity, in contrast to artificiality and studied reflection. In his scheme of the rise of religions he gets out from the common standpoint of the discrepancies and contradictions prevailing among historic creeds. Yet positive religion to him is not so much the product of ignorance and fear as the corruption of the original instinct through the selfishness of man, who has erected rigid creeds that he might arrogate to himself unwarranted privilege or escape the obligations of natural morality., Something of the true religion is to be found in every faith, and of all creeds Christianity has retained the greatest measure of the original truth, and the purest morality. So sublime and yet so simple does Rousseau find the Gospel that he can scarcely believe it the work of men. Its irrational elements he attributes to misconception on the part of the followers of Jesus and especially of Paul, who had no personal communication with him. It was natural that between the advocate of such views and the party of the materialists strife should rise, and in fact Rousseau’s religious influence in France was slight. On the rising German idealism, however, he exercised a great influence.

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