Democritus was born at Abdera, about 460 BCE, although according to some 490. His father was from a noble family and of great wealth, and contributed largely towards the entertainment of the army of Xerxes on his return to Asia. As a reward for this service the Persian monarch gave and other Abderites presents and left among them several Magi. Democritus, according to Diogenes Laertius, was instructed by these Magi in astronomy and theology. After the death of his father he traveled in search of wisdom, and devoted his inheritance to this purpose, amounting to one hundred talents. He is said to have visited Egypt, Ethiopia, Persia, and India. Whether, in the course of his travels, he visited Athens or studied under Anaxagoras is uncertain. During some part of his life he was instructed in Pythagoreanism, and was a disciple of Leucippus. After several years of traveling, Democritus returned to Abdera, with no means of subsistence. His brother Damosis, however, took him in. According to the law of Abdera, whoever wasted his patrimony would be deprived of the rites of burial. Democritus, hoping to avoid this disgrace, gave public lectures. Petronius relates that he was acquainted with the virtues of herbs, plants, and stones, and that he spent his life in making experiments upon natural bodies. He acquired fame with his knowledge of natural phenomena, and predicted changes in the weather. He used this ability to make people believe that he could predict future events. They not only viewed him as something more than mortal, but even proposed to put him in control of their public affairs. He preferred a contemplative to an active life, and therefore declined these public honors and passed the remainder of his days in solitude.
Credit cannot be given to the tale that Democritus spent his leisure hours in chemical researches after the philosopher’s stone — the dream of a later age; or to the story of his conversation with Hippocrates concerning Democritus’s supposed madness, as based on spurious letters. Democritus has been commonly known as “The Laughing Philosopher,” and it is gravely related by Seneca that he never appeared in public with out expressing his contempt of human follies while laughing. Accordingly, we find that among his fellow-citizens he had the name of “the mocker”. He died at more than a hundred years of age. It is said that from then on he spent his days and nights in caverns and sepulchers, and that, in order to master his intellectual faculties, he blinded himself with burning glass. This story, however, is discredited by the writers who mention it insofar as they say he wrote books and dissected animals, neither of which could be done well without eyes.
Democritus expanded the atomic theory of Leucippus. He maintained the impossibility of dividing things ad infinitum. From the difficulty of assigning a beginning of time, he argued the eternity of existing nature, of void space, and of motion. He supposed the atoms, which are originally similar, to be impenetrable and have a density proportionate to their volume. All motions are the result of active and passive affection. He drew a distinction between primary motion and its secondary effects, that is, impulse and reaction. This is the basis of the law of necessity, by which all things in nature are ruled. The worlds which we see — with all their properties of immensity, resemblance, and dissimilitude — result from the endless multiplicity of falling atoms. The human soul consists of globular atoms of fire, which impart movement to the body. Maintaining his atomic theory throughout, Democritus introduced the hypothesis of images or idols (eidola), a kind of emanation from external objects, which make an impression on our senses, and from the influence of which he deduced sensation (aesthesis) and thought (noesis). He distinguished between a rude, imperfect, and therefore false perception and a true one. In the same manner, consistent with this theory, he accounted for the popular notions of Deity; partly through our incapacity to understand fully the phenomena of which we are witnesses, and partly from the impressions communicated by certain beings (eidola) of enormous stature and resembling the human figure which inhabit the air. We know these from dreams and the causes of divination. He carried his theory into practical philosophy also, laying down that happiness consisted in an even temperament. From this he deduced his moral principles and prudential maxims. It was from Democritus that Epicurus borrowed the principal features of his philosophy.
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Last updated: April 25, 2001 | Originally published: April/25/2001
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