Demonax was a philosopher of the second century CE. who tried to revive the philosophy of the Cynic School. Born in Cyprus, Demonax went to Athens, where he became so popular that people vied with on another in presenting him with food, and even the young children gave him great quantities of fruit. Much less austere than Diogenes, whom he took as his philosophic model, he nevertheless rebuked vice unsparingly, and was charged with neglecting the Eleusinian Mysteries, to which he replied: “If the mysteries are bad, no one should be initiated; and if they are good, they ought to be open to everyone.” He was fried of Epictetus, who once rebuked him for not marrying, but was silenced by Demonax, who said, “Very well; give me one of your daughters for a wife” — Epictetus being himself a bachelor. Demonax lived to be nearly a hundred, and on his death was buried with great magnificence. See the Demonax of Lucian, in which the character of the philosopher is painted in glowing colors.
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Last updated: April 25, 2001 | Originally published: April/25/2001
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