Jacques Derrida was one of the most well known twentieth century philosophers. He was also one of the most prolific. Distancing himself from the various philosophical movements and traditions that preceded him on the French intellectual scene (phenomenology, existentialism, and structuralism), he developed a strategy called “deconstruction” in the mid 1960s. Although not purely negative, deconstruction is primarily concerned with something tantamount to a critique of the Western philosophical tradition. Deconstruction is generally presented via an analysis of specific texts. It seeks to expose, and then to subvert, the various binary oppositions that undergird our dominant ways of thinking—presence/absence, speech/writing, and so forth.
Deconstruction has at least two aspects: literary and philosophical. The literary aspect concerns the textual interpretation, where invention is essential to finding hidden alternative meanings in the text. The philosophical aspect concerns the main target of deconstruction: the “metaphysics of presence,” or simply metaphysics. Starting from an Heideggerian point of view, Derrida argues that metaphysics affects the whole of philosophy from Plato onwards. Metaphysics creates dualistic oppositions and installs a hierarchy that unfortunately privileges one term of each dichotomy (presence before absence, speech before writing, and so on).
The deconstructive strategy is to unmask these too-sedimented ways of thinking, and it operates on them especially through two steps—reversing dichotomies and attempting to corrupt the dichotomies themselves. The strategy also aims to show that there are undecidables, that is, something that cannot conform to either side of a dichotomy or opposition. Undecidability returns in later period of Derrida’s reflection, when it is applied to reveal paradoxes involved in notions such as gift giving or hospitality, whose conditions of possibility are at the same time their conditions of impossibility. Because of this, it is undecidable whether authentic giving or hospitality are either possible or impossible.
In this period, the founder of deconstruction turns his attention to ethical themes. In particular, the theme of responsibility to the other (for example, God or a beloved person) leads Derrida to leave the idea that responsibility is associated with a behavior publicly and rationally justifiable by general principles. Reflecting upon tales of Jewish tradition, he highlights the absolute singularity of responsibility to the other.
Deconstruction has had an enormous influence in psychology, literary theory, cultural studies, linguistics, feminism, sociology and anthropology. Poised in the interstices between philosophy and non-philosophy (or philosophy and literature), it is not difficult to see why this is the case. What follows in this article, however, is an attempt to bring out the philosophical significance of Derrida’s thought.
In 1930, Derrida was born into a Jewish family in Algiers. He was also born into an environment of some discrimination. In fact, he either withdrew from, or was forced out of at least two schools during his childhood simply on account of being Jewish. He was expelled from one school because there was a 7% limit on the Jewish population, and he later withdrew from another school on account of the anti-semitism. While Derrida would resist any reductive understanding of his work based upon his biographical life, it could be argued that these kind of experiences played a large role in his insistence upon the importance of the marginal, and the other, in his later thought.
Derrida was twice refused a position in the prestigious Ecole Normale Superieure (where Sartre, Simone de Beauvoir and the majority of French intellectuals and academics began their careers), but he was eventually accepted to the institution at the age of 19. He hence moved from Algiers to France, and soon after he also began to play a major role in the leftist journal Tel Quel. Derrida’s initial work in philosophy was largely phenomenological, and his early training as a philosopher was done largely through the lens of Husserl. Other important inspirations on his early thought include Nietzsche, Heidegger, Saussure, Levinas and Freud. Derrida acknowledges his indebtedness to all of these thinkers in the development of his approach to texts, which has come to be known as ‘deconstruction’.
It was in 1967 that Derrida really arrived as a philosopher of world importance. He published three momentous texts (Of Grammatology, Writing and Difference, and Speech and Phenomena). All of these works have been influential for different reasons, but it is Of Grammatology that remains his most famous work (it is analysed in some detail in this article). In Of Grammatology, Derrida reveals and then undermines the speech-writing opposition that he argues has been such an influential factor in Western thought. His preoccupation with language in this text is typical of much of his early work, and since the publication of these and other major texts (including Dissemination, Glas, The Postcard, Spectres of Marx, The Gift of Death, and Politics of Friendship), deconstruction has gradually moved from occupying a major role in continental Europe, to also becoming a significant player in the Anglo-American philosophical context. This is particularly so in the areas of literary criticism, and cultural studies, where deconstruction’s method of textual analysis has inspired theorists like Paul de Man. He has also had lecturing positions at various universities, the world over. Derrida died in 2004.
Deconstruction has frequently been the subject of some controversy. When Derrida was awarded an honorary doctorate at Cambridge in 1992, there were howls of protest from many ‘analytic’ philosophers. Since then, Derrida has also had many dialogues with philosophers like John Searle (see Limited Inc.), in which deconstruction has been roundly criticised, although perhaps unfairly at times. However, what is clear from the antipathy of such thinkers is that deconstruction challenges traditional philosophy in several important ways, and the remainder of this article will highlight why this is so.
Derrida, like many other contemporary European theorists, is preoccupied with undermining the oppositional tendencies that have befallen much of the Western philosophical tradition. In fact, dualisms are the staple diet of deconstruction, for without these hierarchies and orders of subordination it would be left with nowhere to intervene. Deconstruction is parasitic in that rather than espousing yet another grand narrative, or theory about the nature of the world in which we partake, it restricts itself to distorting already existing narratives, and to revealing the dualistic hierarchies they conceal. While Derrida’s claims to being someone who speaks solely in the margins of philosophy can be contested, it is important to take these claims into account. Deconstruction is, somewhat infamously, the philosophy that says nothing. To the extent that it can be suggested that Derrida’s concerns are often philosophical, they are clearly not phenomenological (he assures us that his work is to be read specifically against Husserl, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty) and nor are they ontological.
Deconstruction, and particularly early deconstruction, functions by engaging in sustained analyses of particular texts. It is committed to the rigorous analysis of the literal meaning of a text, and yet also to finding within that meaning, perhaps in the neglected corners of the text (including the footnotes), internal problems that actually point towards alternative meanings. Deconstruction must hence establish a methodology that pays close attention to these apparently contradictory imperatives (sameness and difference) and a reading of any Derridean text can only reaffirm this dual aspect. Derrida speaks of the first aspect of this deconstructive strategy as being akin to a fidelity and a “desire to be faithful to the themes and audacities of a thinking” (WD 84). At the same time, however, deconstruction also famously borrows from Martin Heidegger’s conception of a ‘destructive retrieve’ and seeks to open texts up to alternative and usually repressed meanings that reside at least partly outside of the metaphysical tradition (although always also partly betrothed to it). This more violent and transgressive aspect of deconstruction is illustrated by Derrida’s consistent exhortation to “invent in your own language if you can or want to hear mine; invent if you can or want to give my language to be understood” (MO 57). In suggesting that a faithful interpretation of him is one that goes beyond him, Derrida installs invention as a vitally important aspect of any deconstructive reading. He is prone to making enigmatic suggestions like “go there where you cannot go, to the impossible, it is indeed the only way of coming or going” (ON 75), and ultimately, the merit of a deconstructive reading consists in this creative contact with another text that cannot be characterised as either mere fidelity or as an absolute transgression, but rather which oscillates between these dual demands. The intriguing thing about deconstruction, however, is that despite the fact that Derrida’s own interpretations of specific texts are quite radical, it is often difficult to pinpoint where the explanatory exegesis of a text ends and where the more violent aspect of deconstruction begins. Derrida is always reluctant to impose ‘my text’, ‘your text’ designations too conspicuously in his texts. This is partly because it is even problematic to speak of a ‘work’ of deconstruction, since deconstruction only highlights what was already revealed in the text itself. All of the elements of a deconstructive intervention reside in the “neglected cornerstones” of an already existing system (MDM 72), and this equation is not altered in any significant way whether that ‘system’ be conceived of as metaphysics generally, which must contain its non-metaphysical track, or the writings of a specific thinker, which must also always testify to that which they are attempting to exclude (MDM 73).
These are, of course, themes reflected upon at length by Derrida, and they have an immediate consequence on the meta-theoretical level. To the minimal extent that we can refer to Derrida’s own arguments, it must be recognised that they are always intertwined with the arguments of whomever, or whatever, he seeks to deconstruct. For example, Derrida argues that his critique of the Husserlian ‘now’ moment is actually based upon resources within Husserl’s own text which elide the self-presence that he was attempting to secure (SP 64-66). If Derrida’s point is simply that Husserl’s phenomenology holds within itself conclusions that Husserl failed to recognise, Derrida seems to be able to disavow any transcendental or ontological position. This is why he argues that his work occupies a place in the margins of philosophy, rather than simply being philosophy per se.
Deconstruction contends that in any text, there are inevitably points of equivocation and ‘undecidability’ that betray any stable meaning that an author might seek to impose upon his or her text. The process of writing always reveals that which has been suppressed, covers over that which has been disclosed, and more generally breaches the very oppositions that are thought to sustain it. This is why Derrida’s ‘philosophy’ is so textually based and it is also why his key terms are always changing, because depending upon who or what he is seeking to deconstruct, that point of equivocation will always be located in a different place.
This also ensures that any attempt to describe what deconstruction is, must be careful. Nothing would be more antithetical to deconstruction’s stated intent than this attempt at defining it through the decidedly metaphysical question “what is deconstruction?” There is a paradoxicality involved in trying to restrict deconstruction to one particular and overarching purpose (OG 19) when it is predicated upon the desire to expose us to that which is wholly other (tout autre) and to open us up to alternative possibilities. At times, this exegesis will run the risk of ignoring the many meanings of Derridean deconstruction, and the widely acknowledged difference between Derrida’s early and late work is merely the most obvious example of the difficulties involved in suggesting “deconstruction says this”, or “deconstruction prohibits that”.
That said, certain defining features of deconstruction can be noticed. For example, Derrida’s entire enterprise is predicated upon the conviction that dualisms are irrevocably present in the various philosophers and artisans that he considers. While some philosophers argue that he is a little reductive when he talks about the Western philosophical tradition, it is his understanding of this tradition that informs and provides the tools for a deconstructive response. Because of this, it is worth briefly considering the target of Derridean deconstruction – the metaphysics of presence, or somewhat synonymously, logocentrism.
There are many different terms that Derrida employs to describe what he considers to be the fundamental way(s) of thinking of the Western philosophical tradition. These include: logocentrism, phallogocentrism, and perhaps most famously, the metaphysics of presence, but also often simply ‘metaphysics’. These terms all have slightly different meanings. Logocentrism emphasises the privileged role that logos, or speech, has been accorded in the Western tradition (see Section 3). Phallogocentrism points towards the patriarchal significance of this privileging. Derrida’s enduring references to the metaphysics of presence borrows heavily from the work of Heidegger. Heidegger insists that Western philosophy has consistently privileged that which is, or that which appears, and has forgotten to pay any attention to the condition for that appearance. In other words, presence itself is privileged, rather than that which allows presence to be possible at all – and also impossible, for Derrida (see Section 4, for more on the metaphysics of presence). All of these terms of denigration, however, are united under the broad rubric of the term ‘metaphysics’. What, then, does Derrida mean by metaphysics?
In the ‘Afterword’ to Limited Inc., Derrida suggests that metaphysics can be defined as:
“The enterprise of returning ‘strategically’, ‘ideally’, to an origin or to a priority thought to be simple, intact, normal, pure, standard, self-identical, in order then to think in terms of derivation, complication, deterioration, accident, etc. All metaphysicians, from Plato to Rousseau, Descartes to Husserl, have proceeded in this way, conceiving good to be before evil, the positive before the negative, the pure before the impure, the simple before the complex, the essential before the accidental, the imitated before the imitation, etc. And this is not just one metaphysical gesture among others, it is the metaphysical exigency, that which has been the most constant, most profound and most potent” (LI 236).
According to Derrida then, metaphysics involves installing hierarchies and orders of subordination in the various dualisms that it encounters (M 195). Moreover, metaphysical thought prioritises presence and purity at the expense of the contingent and the complicated, which are considered to be merely aberrations that are not important for philosophical analysis. Basically then, metaphysical thought always privileges one side of an opposition, and ignores or marginalises the alternative term of that opposition.
In another attempt to explain deconstruction’s treatment of, and interest in oppositions, Derrida has suggested that: “An opposition of metaphysical concepts (speech/writing, presence/absence, etc.) is never the face-to-face of two terms, but a hierarchy and an order of subordination. Deconstruction cannot limit itself or proceed immediately to neutralisation: it must, by means of a double gesture, a double science, a double writing, practise an overturning of the classical opposition, and a general displacement of the system. It is on that condition alone that deconstruction will provide the means of intervening in the field of oppositions it criticises” (M 195). In order to better understand this dual ‘methodology’ – that is also the deconstruction of the notion of a methodology because it no longer believes in the possibility of an observer being absolutely exterior to the object/text being examined – it is helpful to consider an example of this deconstruction at work (See Speech/Writing below).
Derrida’s terms change in every text that he writes. This is part of his deconstructive strategy. He focuses on particular themes or words in a text, which on account of their ambiguity undermine the more explicit intention of that text. It is not possible for all of these to be addressed (Derrida has published in the vicinity of 60 texts in English), so this article focused on some of the most pivotal terms and neologisms from his early thought. It addresses aspects of his later, more theme-based thought, in Sections 6 & 7.
The most prominent opposition with which Derrida’s earlier work is concerned is that between speech and writing. According to Derrida, thinkers as different as Plato, Rousseau, Saussure, and Levi-Strauss, have all denigrated the written word and valorised speech, by contrast, as some type of pure conduit of meaning. Their argument is that while spoken words are the symbols of mental experience, written words are the symbols of that already existing symbol. As representations of speech, they are doubly derivative and doubly far from a unity with one’s own thought. Without going into detail regarding the ways in which these thinkers have set about justifying this type of hierarchical opposition, it is important to remember that the first strategy of deconstruction is to reverse existing oppositions. In Of Grammatology (perhaps his most famous work), Derrida hence attempts to illustrate that the structure of writing and grammatology are more important and even ‘older’ than the supposedly pure structure of presence-to-self that is characterised as typical of speech.
For example, in an entire chapter of his Course in General Linguistics, Ferdinand de Saussure tries to restrict the science of linguistics to the phonetic and audible word only (24). In the course of his inquiry, Saussure goes as far as to argue that “language and writing are two distinct systems of signs: the second exists for the sole purpose of representing the first”. Language, Saussure insists, has an oral tradition that is independent of writing, and it is this independence that makes a pure science of speech possible. Derrida vehemently disagrees with this hierarchy and instead argues that all that can be claimed of writing – eg. that it is derivative and merely refers to other signs – is equally true of speech. But as well as criticising such a position for certain unjustifiable presuppositions, including the idea that we are self-identical with ourselves in ‘hearing’ ourselves think, Derrida also makes explicit the manner in which such a hierarchy is rendered untenable from within Saussure’s own text. Most famously, Saussure is the proponent of the thesis that is commonly referred to as “the arbitrariness of the sign”, and this asserts, to simplify matters considerably, that the signifier bears no necessary relationship to that which is signified. Saussure derives numerous consequences from this position, but as Derrida points out, this notion of arbitrariness and of “unmotivated institutions” of signs, would seem to deny the possibility of any natural attachment (OG 44). After all, if the sign is arbitrary and eschews any foundational reference to reality, it would seem that a certain type of sign (ie. the spoken) could not be more natural than another (ie. the written). However, it is precisely this idea of a natural attachment that Saussure relies upon to argue for our “natural bond” with sound (25), and his suggestion that sounds are more intimately related to our thoughts than the written word hence runs counter to his fundamental principle regarding the arbitrariness of the sign.
In Of Grammatology and elsewhere, Derrida argues that signification, broadly conceived, always refers to other signs, and that one can never reach a sign that refers only to itself. He suggests that “writing is not a sign of a sign, except if one says it of all signs, which would be more profoundly true” (OG 43), and this process of infinite referral, of never arriving at meaning itself, is the notion of ‘writing’ that he wants to emphasise. This is not writing narrowly conceived, as in a literal inscription upon a page, but what he terms ‘arche-writing’. Arche-writing refers to a more generalised notion of writing that insists that the breach that the written introduces between what is intended to be conveyed and what is actually conveyed, is typical of an originary breach that afflicts everything one might wish to keep sacrosanct, including the notion of self-presence.
This originary breach that arche-writing refers to can be separated out to reveal two claims regarding spatial differing and temporal deferring. To explicate the first of these claims, Derrida’s emphasis upon how writing differs from itself is simply to suggest that writing, and by extension all repetition, is split (differed) by the absence that makes it necessary. One example of this might be that we write something down because we may soon forget it, or to communicate something to someone who is not with us. According to Derrida, all writing, in order to be what it is, must be able to function in the absence of every empirically determined addressee (M 375). Derrida also considers deferral to be typical of the written and this is to reinforce that the meaning of a certain text is never present, never entirely captured by a critic’s attempt to pin it down. The meaning of a text is constantly subject to the whims of the future, but when that so-called future is itself ‘present’ (if we try and circumscribe the future by reference to a specific date or event) its meaning is equally not realised, but subject to yet another future that can also never be present. The key to a text is never even present to the author themselves, for the written always defers its meaning. As a consequence we cannot simply ask Derrida to explain exactly what he meant by propounding that enigmatic sentiment that has been translated as “there is nothing outside of the text” (OG 158). Any explanatory words that Derrida may offer would themselves require further explanation. [That said, it needs to be emphasised that Derrida's point is not so much that everything is simply semiotic or linguistic - as this is something that he explicitly denies - but that the processes of differing and deferring found within linguistic representation are symptomatic of a more general situation that afflicts everything, including the body and the perceptual]. So, Derrida’s more generalised notion of writing, arche-writing, refers to the way in which the written is possible only on account of this ‘originary’ deferral of meaning that ensures that meaning can never be definitively present. In conjunction with the differing aspect that we have already seen him associate with, and then extend beyond the traditional confines of writing, he will come to describe these two overlapping processes via that most famous of neologisms: différance.
Différance is an attempt to conjoin the differing and deferring aspects involved in arche-writing in a term that itself plays upon the distinction between the audible and the written. After all, what differentiates différance and différence is inaudible, and this means that distinguishing between them actually requires the written. This problematises efforts like Saussure’s, which as well as attempting to keep speech and writing apart, also suggest that writing is an almost unnecessary addition to speech. In response to such a claim, Derrida can simply point out that there is often, and perhaps even always, this type of ambiguity in the spoken word – différence as compared to différance – that demands reference to the written. If the spoken word requires the written to function properly, then the spoken is itself always at a distance from any supposed clarity of consciousness. It is this originary breach that Derrida associates with the terms arche-writing and différance.
Of course, différance cannot be exhaustively defined, and this is largely because of Derrida’s insistence that it is “neither a word, nor a concept”, as well as the fact that the meaning of the term changes depending upon the particular context in which it is being employed. For the moment, however, it suffices to suggest that according to Derrida, différance is typical of what is involved in arche-writing and this generalised notion of writing that breaks down the entire logic of the sign (OG 7). The widespread conviction that the sign literally represents something, which even if not actually present, could be potentially present, is rendered impossible by arche-writing, which insists that signs always refer to yet more signs ad infinitum, and that there is no ultimate referent or foundation. This reversal of the subordinated term of an opposition accomplishes the first of deconstruction’s dual strategic intents. Rather than being criticised for being derivative or secondary, for Derrida, writing, or at least the processes that characterise writing (ie. différance and arche-writing), are ubiquitous. Just as a piece of writing has no self-present subject to explain what every particular word means (and this ensures that what is written must partly elude any individual’s attempt to control it), this is equally typical of the spoken. Utilising the same structure of repetition, nothing guarantees that another person will endow the words I use with the particular meaning that I attribute to them. Even the conception of an internal monologue and the idea that we can intimately ‘hear’ our own thoughts in a non-contingent way is misguided, as it ignores the way that arche-writing privileges difference and a non-coincidence with oneself (SP 60-70).
In this respect, it needs to be pointed out that all of deconstruction’s reversals (arche-writing included) are partly captured by the edifice that they seek to overthrow. For Derrida, “one always inhabits, and all the more when one does not suspect it” (OG 24), and it is important to recognise that the mere reversal of an existing metaphysical opposition might not also challenge the governing framework and presuppositions that are attempting to be reversed (WD 280). Deconstruction hence cannot rest content with merely prioritising writing over speech, but must also accomplish the second major aspect of deconstruction’s dual strategies, that being to corrupt and contaminate the opposition itself.
Derrida must highlight that the categories that sustain and safeguard any dualism are always already disrupted and displaced. To effect this second aspect of deconstruction’s strategic intents, Derrida usually coins a new term, or reworks an old one, to permanently disrupt the structure into which he has intervened – examples of this include his discussion of the pharmakon in Plato (drug or tincture, salutary or maleficent), and the supplement in Rousseau, which will be considered towards the end of this section. To phrase the problem in slightly different terms, Derrida’s argument is that in examining a binary opposition, deconstruction manages to expose a trace. This is not a trace of the oppositions that have since been deconstructed – on the contrary, the trace is a rupture within metaphysics, a pattern of incongruities where the metaphysical rubs up against the non-metaphysical, that it is deconstruction’s job to juxtapose as best as it can. The trace does not appear as such (OG 65), but the logic of its path in a text can be mimed by a deconstructive intervention and hence brought to the fore.
The logic of the supplement is also an important aspect of Of Grammatology. A supplement is something that, allegedly secondarily, comes to serve as an aid to something ‘original’ or ‘natural’. Writing is itself an example of this structure, for as Derrida points out, “if supplementarity is a necessarily indefinite process, writing is the supplement par excellence since it proposes itself as the supplement of the supplement, sign of a sign, taking the place of a speech already significant” (OG 281). Another example of the supplement might be masturbation, as Derrida suggests (OG 153), or even the use of birth control precautions. What is notable about both of these examples is an ambiguity that ensures that what is supplementary can always be interpreted in two ways. For example, our society’s use of birth control precautions might be interpreted as suggesting that our natural way is lacking and that the contraceptive pill, or condom, etc., hence replaces a fault in nature. On the other hand, it might also be argued that such precautions merely add on to, and enrich our natural way. It is always ambiguous, or more accurately ‘undecidable’, whether the supplement adds itself and “is a plenitude enriching another plenitude, the fullest measure of presence”, or whether “the supplement supplements… adds only to replace… represents and makes an image… its place is assigned in the structure by the mark of an emptiness” (OG 144). Ultimately, Derrida suggests that the supplement is both of these things, accretion and substitution (OG 200), which means that the supplement is “not a signified more than a signifier, a representer than a presence, a writing than a speech” (OG 315). It comes before all such modalities.
This is not just some rhetorical suggestion that has no concrete significance in deconstruction. Indeed, while Rousseau consistently laments the frequency of his masturbation in his book, The Confessions, Derrida argues that “it has never been possible to desire the presence ‘in person’, before this play of substitution and the symbolic experience of auto-affection” (OG 154). By this, Derrida means that this supplementary masturbation that ‘plays’ between presence and absence (eg. the image of the absent Therese that is evoked by Rousseau) is that which allows us to conceive of being present and fulfilled in sexual relations with another at all. In a sense, masturbation is ‘originary’, and according to Derrida, this situation applies to all sexual relations. All erotic relations have their own supplementary aspect in which we are never present to some ephemeral ‘meaning’ of sexual relations, but always involved in some form of representation. Even if this does not literally take the form of imagining another in the place of, or supplementing the ‘presence’ that is currently with us, and even if we are not always acting out a certain role, or faking certain pleasures, for Derrida, such representations and images are the very conditions of desire and of enjoyment (OG 156).
Derrida has had a long and complicated association with phenomenology for his entire career, including ambiguous relationships with Husserl and Heidegger, and something closer to a sustained allegiance with Lévinas. Despite this complexity, two main aspects of Derrida’s thinking regarding phenomenology remain clear. Firstly, he thinks that the phenomenological emphasis upon the immediacy of experience is the new transcendental illusion, and secondly, he argues that despite its best intents, phenomenology cannot be anything other than a metaphysics (SP 75, 104). In this context, Derrida defines metaphysics as the science of presence, as for him (as for Heidegger), all metaphysics privileges presence, or that which is. While they are presented schematically here, these inter-related claims constitute Derrida’s major arguments against phenomenology.
According to Derrida, phenomenology is a metaphysics of presence because it unwittingly relies upon the notion of an indivisible self-presence, or in the case of Husserl, the possibility of an exact internal adequation with oneself (SP 66-8). In various texts, Derrida contests this valorisation of an undivided subjectivity, as well as the primacy that such a position accords to the ‘now’, or to some other kind of temporal immediacy. For instance, in Speech and Phenomena, Derrida argues that if a ‘now’ moment is conceived of as exhausting itself in that experience, it could not actually be experienced, for there would be nothing to juxtapose itself against in order to illuminate that very ‘now’. Instead, Derrida wants to reveal that every so-called ‘present’, or ‘now’ point, is always already compromised by a trace, or a residue of a previous experience, that precludes us ever being in a self-contained ‘now’ moment (SP 68). Phenomenology is hence envisaged as nostalgically seeking the impossible: that is, coinciding with oneself in an immediate and pre-reflective spontaneity. Following this refutation of Husserlian temporality, Derrida remarks that “in the last analysis, what is at stake is… the privilege of the actual present, the now” (SP 62-3). Instead of emphasising the presence of a subject to themselves (ie. the so-called living-present), Derrida strategically utilises a conception of time that emphasises deferral. John Caputo expresses Derrida’s point succinctly when he claims that Derrida’s criticisms of Husserlian temporality in Speech and Phenomena involve an attempt to convey that: “What is really going on in things, what is really happening, is always “to come”. Every time you try to stabilise the meaning of a thing, try to fix it in its missionary position, the thing itself, if there is anything at all to it, slips away” (cf. SP 104, Caputo DN 31). To put Derrida’s point simplistically, it might be suggested that the meaning of a particular object, or a particular word, is never stable, but always in the process of change (eg. the dissemination of meaning for which deconstruction has become notorious). Moreover, the significance of that past change can only be appreciated from the future and, of course, that ‘future’ is itself implicated in a similar process of transformation were it ever to be capable of becoming ‘present’. The future that Derrida is referring to is hence not just a future that will become present, but the future that makes all ‘presence’ possible and also impossible. For Derrida, there can be no presence-to-self, or self-contained identity, because the ‘nature’ of our temporal existence is for this type of experience to elude us. Our predominant mode of being is what he will eventually term the messianic (see Section 6), in that experience is about the wait, or more aptly, experience is only when it is deferred. Derrida’s work offers many important temporal contributions of this quasi-transcendental variety.
In its first and most famous instantiation, undecidability is one of Derrida’s most important attempts to trouble dualisms, or more accurately, to reveal how they are always already troubled. An undecidable, and there are many of them in deconstruction (eg. ghost, pharmakon, hymen, etc.), is something that cannot conform to either polarity of a dichotomy (eg. present/absent, cure/poison, and inside/outside in the above examples). For example, the figure of a ghost seems to neither present or absent, or alternatively it is both present and absent at the same time (SM).
However, Derrida has a recurring tendency to resuscitate terms in different contexts, and the term undecidability also returns in later deconstruction. Indeed, to complicate matters, undecidability returns in two discernible forms. In his recent work, Derrida often insists that the condition of the possibility of mourning, giving, forgiving, and hospitality, to cite some of his most famous examples, is at once also the condition of their impossibility (see section 7). In his explorations of these “possible-impossible” aporias, it becomes undecidable whether genuine giving, for example, is either a possible or an impossible ideal.
Derrida’s later philosophy is also united by his analysis of a similar type of undecidability that is involved in the concept of the decision itself. In this respect, Derrida regularly suggests that a decision cannot be wise, or posed even more provocatively, that the instant of the decision must actually be mad (DPJ 26, GD 65). Drawing on Kierkegaard, Derrida tells us that a decision requires an undecidable leap beyond all prior preparations for that decision (GD 77), and according to him, this applies to all decisions and not just those regarding the conversion to religious faith that preoccupies Kierkegaard. To pose the problem in inverse fashion, it might be suggested that for Derrida, all decisions are a faith and a tenuous faith at that, since were faith and the decision not tenuous, they would cease to be a faith or a decision at all (cf. GD 80). This description of the decision as a moment of madness that must move beyond rationality and calculative reasoning may seem paradoxical, but it might nevertheless be agreed that a decision requires a ‘leap of faith’ beyond the sum total of the facts. Many of us are undoubtedly stifled by the difficulty of decision-making, and this psychological fact aids and, for his detractors, also abets Derrida’s discussion of the decision as it appears in texts like The Gift of Death, Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, Adieu to Emmanuel Lévinas, and Politics of Friendship.
In Adieu to Emmanuel Lévinas, Derrida argues that a decision must always come back to the other, even if it is the other ‘inside’ the subject, and he disputes that an initiative which remained purely and simply “mine” would still be a decision (AEL 23-4). A theory of the subject is incapable of accounting for the slightest decision (PF 68-9), because, as he rhetorically asks, “would we not be justified in seeing here the unfolding of an egological immanence, the autonomic and automatic deployment of predicates or possibilities proper to a subject, without the tearing rupture that should occur in every decision we call free?” (AEL 24). In other words, if a decision is envisaged as simply following from certain character attributes, then it would not genuinely be a decision. Derrida is hence once more insisting upon the necessity of a leap beyond calculative reasoning, and beyond the resources of some self-contained subject reflecting upon the matter at hand. A decision must invoke that which is outside of the subject’s control. If a decision is an example of a concept that is simultaneously impossible within its own internal logic and yet nevertheless necessary, then not only is our reticence to decide rendered philosophically cogent, but it is perhaps even privileged. Indeed, Derrida’s work has been described as a “philosophy of hesitation”, and his most famous neologism, différance, explicitly emphasises deferring, with all of the procrastination that this term implies. Moreover, in his early essay “Violence and Metaphysics”, Derrida also suggests that a successful deconstructive reading is conditional upon the suspension of choice: on hesitating between the ethical opening and the logocentric totality (WD 84). Even though Derrida has suggested that he is reluctant to use the term ‘ethics’ because of logocentric associations, one is led to conclude that ‘ethical’ behaviour (for want of a better word) is a product of deferring, and of being forever open to possibilities rather than taking a definitive position. The problem of undecidability is also evident in more recent texts including The Gift of Death. In this text, Derrida seems to support the sacrificing of a certain notion of ethics and universality for a conception of radical singularity not unlike that evinced by the “hyper-ethical” sacrifice that Abraham makes of his son upon Mt Moriah, according to both the Judaic and Christian religions alike (GD 71). To represent Derrida’s position more precisely, true responsibility consists in oscillating between the demands of that which is wholly other (in Abraham’s case, God, but also any particular other) and the more general demands of a community (see Section 6). Responsibility is enduring this trial of the undecidable decision, where attending to the call of a particular other will inevitably demand an estrangement from the “other others” and their communal needs. Whatever decision one may take, according to Derrida, it can never be wholly justified (GD 70). Of course, Derrida’s emphasis upon the undecidability inherent in all decision-making does not want to convey inactivity or a quietism of despair, and he has insisted that the madness of the decision also demands urgency and precipitation (DPJ 25-8). Nevertheless, what is undergone is described as the “trial of undecidability” (LI 210) and what is involved in enduring this trial would seem to be a relatively anguished being. In an interview with Richard Beardsworth, Derrida characterises the problem of undecidability as follows: “However careful one is in the theoretical preparation of a decision, the instant of the decision, if there is to be a decision, must be heterogeneous to the accumulation of knowledge. Otherwise, there is no responsibility. In this sense not only must the person taking the decision not know everything… the decision, if there is to be one, must advance towards a future which is not known, which cannot be anticipated” (NM 37). This suggestion that the decision cannot anticipate the future is undoubtedly somewhat counter-intuitive, but Derrida’s rejection of anticipation is not only a rejection of the traditional idea of deciding on the basis of weighing-up and internally representing certain options. By suggesting that anticipation is not possible, he means to make the more general point that no matter how we may anticipate any decision must always rupture those anticipatory frameworks. A decision must be fundamentally different from any prior preparations for it. As Derrida suggests in Politics of Friendship, the decision must “surprise the very subjectivity of the subject” (PF 68), and it is in making this leap away from calculative reasoning that Derrida argues that responsibility consists (PF 69).
Perhaps the most obvious aspect of Derrida’s later philosophy is his advocation of the tout autre, the wholly other, and The Gift of Death will be our main focus in explaining what this exaltation of the wholly other might mean. Any attempt to sum up this short but difficult text would have to involve the recognition of a certain incommensurability between the particular and the universal, and the dual demands placed upon anybody intending to behave responsibly. For Derrida, the paradox of responsible behaviour means that there is always a question of being responsible before a singular other (eg. a loved one, God, etc.), and yet we are also always referred to our responsibility towards others generally and to what we share with them. Derrida insists that this type of aporia, or problem, is too often ignored by the “knights of responsibility” who presume that accountability and responsibility in all aspects of life – whether that be guilt before the human law, or even before the divine will of God – is quite easily established (GD 85). These are the same people who insist that concrete ethical guidelines should be provided by any philosopher worth his or her ‘salt’ (GD 67) and who ignore the difficulties involved in a notion like responsibility, which demands something importantly different from merely behaving dutifully (GD 63).
Derrida’s exploration of Abraham’s strange and paradoxical responsibility before the demands of God, which consists in sacrificing his only son Isaac, but also in betraying the ethical order through his silence about this act (GD 57-60), is designed to problematise this type of ethical concern that exclusively locates responsibility in the realm of generality. In places, Derrida even verges on suggesting that this more common notion of responsibility, which insists that one should behave according to a general principle that is capable of being rationally validated and justified in the public realm (GD 60), should be replaced with something closer to an Abrahamian individuality where the demands of a singular other (eg. God) are importantly distinct from the ethical demands of our society (GD 61, 66). Derrida equivocates regarding just how far he wants to endorse such a conception of responsibility, and also on the entire issue of whether Abraham’s willingness to murder is an act of faith, or simply an unforgivable transgression. As he says, “Abraham is at the same time, the most moral and the most immoral, the most responsible and the most irresponsible” (GD 72). This equivocation is, of course, a defining trait of deconstruction, which has been variously pilloried and praised for this refusal to propound anything that the tradition could deem to be a thesis. Nevertheless, it is relatively clear that in The Gift of Death, Derrida intends to free us from the common assumption that responsibility is to be associated with behaviour that accords with general principles capable of justification in the public realm (ie. liberalism). In opposition to such an account, he emphasises the “radical singularity” of the demands placed upon Abraham by God (GD 60, 68, 79) and those that might be placed on us by our own loved ones. Ethics, with its dependence upon generality, must be continually sacrificed as an inevitable aspect of the human condition and its aporetic demand to decide (GD 70). As Derrida points out, in writing about one particular cause rather than another, in pursuing one profession over another, in spending time with one’s family rather than at work, one inevitably ignores the “other others” (GD 69), and this is a condition of any and every existence. He argues that: “I cannot respond to the call, the request, the obligation, or even the love of another, without sacrificing the other other, the other others” (GD 68). For Derrida, it seems that the Buddhist desire to have attachment to nobody and equal compassion for everybody is an unattainable ideal. He does, in fact, suggest that a universal community that excludes no one is a contradiction in terms. According to him, this is because: “I am responsible to anyone (that is to say, to any other) only by failing in my responsibility to all the others, to the ethical or political generality. And I can never justify this sacrifice; I must always hold my peace about it… What binds me to this one or that one, remains finally unjustifiable” (GD 70). Derrida hence implies that responsibility to any particular individual is only possible by being irresponsible to the “other others”, that is, to the other people and possibilities that haunt any and every existence.
This brings us to a term that Derrida has resuscitated from its association with Walter Benjamin and the Judaic tradition more generally. That term is the messianic and it relies upon a distinction with messianism.
According to Derrida, the term messianism refers predominantly to the religions of the Messiahs – ie. the Muslim, Judaic and Christian religions. These religions proffer a Messiah of known characteristics, and often one who is expected to arrive at a particular time or place. The Messiah is inscribed in their respective religious texts and in an oral tradition that dictates that only if the other conforms to such and such a description is that person actually the Messiah. The most obvious of numerous necessary characteristics for the Messiah, it seems, is that they must invariably be male. Sexuality might seem to be a strange prerequisite to tether to that which is beyond this world, wholly other, but it is only one of many. Now, Derrida is not simplistically disparaging religion and the messianisms they propound. In an important respect, the messianic depends upon the various messianisms and Derrida admits that he cannot say which is the more originary. The messianism of Abraham in his singular responsibility before God, for Derrida, reveals the messianic structure of existence more generally, in that we all share a similar relationship to alterity even if we have not named and circumscribed that experience according to the template provided by a particular religion. However, Derrida’s call to the wholly other, his invocation for the wholly other “to come”, is not a call for a fixed or identifiable other of known characteristics, as is arguably the case in the average religious experience. His wholly other is indeterminable and can never actually arrive. Derrida more than once recounts a story of Maurice Blanchot’s where the Messiah was actually at the gates to a city, disguised in rags. After some time, the Messiah was finally recognised by a beggar, but the beggar could think of nothing more relevant to ask than: “when will you come?”(DN 24). Even when the Messiah is ‘there’, he or she must still be yet to come, and this brings us back to the distinction between the messianic and the various historical messianisms. The messianic structure of existence is open to the coming of an entirely ungraspable and unknown other, but the concrete, historical messianisms are open to the coming of a specific other of known characteristics. The messianic refers predominantly to a structure of our existence that involves waiting – waiting even in activity – and a ceaseless openness towards a future that can never be circumscribed by the horizons of significance that we inevitably bring to bear upon that possible future. In other words, Derrida is not referring to a future that will one day become present (or a particular conception of the saviour who will arrive), but to an openness towards an unknown futurity that is necessarily involved in what we take to be ‘presence’ and hence also renders it ‘impossible’. A deconstruction that entertained any type of grand prophetic narrative, like a Marxist story about the movement of history toward a pre-determined future which, once attained, would make notions like history and progress obsolete, would be yet another vestige of logocentrism and susceptible to deconstruction (SM). Precisely in order to avoid the problems that such messianisms engender – eg. killing in the name of progress, mutilating on account of knowing the will of God better than others, etc. – Derrida suggests that: “I am careful to say ‘let it come’ because if the other is precisely what is not invented, the initiative or deconstructive inventiveness can consist only in opening, in uncloseting, in destabilising foreclusionary structures, so as to allow for the passage toward the other” (RDR 60).
Derrida has recently become more and more preoccupied with what has come to be termed “possible-impossible aporias” – aporia was originally a Greek term meaning puzzle, but it has come to mean something more like an impasse or paradox. In particular, Derrida has described the paradoxes that afflict notions like giving, hospitality, forgiving and mourning. He argues that the condition of their possibility is also, and at once, the condition of their impossibility. In this section, I will attempt to reveal the shared logic upon which these aporias rely.
The aporia that surrounds the gift revolves around the paradoxical thought that a genuine gift cannot actually be understood to be a gift. In his text, Given Time, Derrida suggests that the notion of the gift contains an implicit demand that the genuine gift must reside outside of the oppositional demands of giving and taking, and beyond any mere self-interest or calculative reasoning (GT 30). According to him, however, a gift is also something that cannot appear as such (GD 29), as it is destroyed by anything that proposes equivalence or recompense, as well as by anything that even proposes to know of, or acknowledge it. This may sound counter-intuitive, but even a simple ‘thank-you’ for instance, which both acknowledges the presence of a gift and also proposes some form of equivalence with that gift, can be seen to annul the gift (cf. MDM 149). By politely responding with a ‘thank-you’, there is often, and perhaps even always, a presumption that because of this acknowledgement one is no longer indebted to the other who has given, and that nothing more can be expected of an individual who has so responded. Significantly, the gift is hence drawn into the cycle of giving and taking, where a good deed must be accompanied by a suitably just response. As the gift is associated with a command to respond, it becomes an imposition for the receiver, and it even becomes an opportunity to take for the ‘giver’, who might give just to receive the acknowledgement from the other that they have in fact given. There are undoubtedly many other examples of how the ‘gift’ can be deployed, and not necessarily deliberately, to gain advantage. Of course, it might be objected that even if it is psychologically difficult to give without also receiving (and in a manner that is tantamount to taking) this does not in-itself constitute a refutation of the logic of genuine giving. According to Derrida, however, his discussion does not amount merely to an empirical or psychological claim about the difficulty of transcending an immature and egocentric conception of giving. On the contrary, he wants to problematise the very possibility of a giving that can be unequivocally disassociated from receiving and taking.
The important point is that, for Derrida, a genuine gift requires an anonymity of the giver, such that there is no accrued benefit in giving. The giver cannot even recognise that they are giving, for that would be to reabsorb their gift to the other person as some kind of testimony to the worth of the self – ie. the kind of self-congratulatory logic that rhetorically poses the question “how wonderful I am to give this person that which they have always desired, and without even letting them know that I am responsible?”. This is an extreme example, but Derrida claims that such a predicament afflicts all giving in more or less obvious ways. For him, the logic of a genuine gift actually requires that self and other be radically disparate, and have no obligations or claims upon each other of any kind. He argues that a genuine gift must involve neither an apprehension of a good deed done, nor the recognition by the other party that they have received, and this seems to render the actuality of any gift an impossibility. Significantly, however, according to Derrida, the existential force of this demand for an absolute altruism can never be assuaged, and yet equally clearly it can also never be fulfilled, and this ensures that the condition of the possibility of the gift is inextricably associated with its impossibility. For Derrida, there is no solution to this type of problem, and no hint of a dialectic that might unify the apparent incommensurability in which possibility implies impossibility and vice versa. At the same time, however, he does not intend simply to vacillate in hyperbolic and self-referential paradoxes. There is a sense in which deconstruction actually seeks genuine giving, hospitality, forgiving and mourning, even where it acknowledges that these concepts are forever elusive and can never actually be fulfilled.
It is also worth considering the aporia that Derrida associates with hospitality. According to Derrida, genuine hospitality before any number of unknown others is not, strictly speaking, a possible scenario (OH 135, GD 70, AEL 50, OCF 16). If we contemplate giving up everything that we seek to possess and call our own, then most of us can empathise with just how difficult enacting any absolute hospitality would be. Despite this, however, Derrida insists that the whole idea of hospitality depends upon such an altruistic concept and is inconceivable without it (OCF 22). In fact, he argues that it is this internal tension that keeps the concept alive.
As Derrida makes explicit, there is a more existential example of this tension, in that the notion of hospitality requires one to be the ‘master’ of the house, country or nation (and hence controlling). His point is relatively simple here; to be hospitable, it is first necessary that one must have the power to host. Hospitality hence makes claims to property ownership and it also partakes in the desire to establish a form of self-identity. Secondly, there is the further point that in order to be hospitable, the host must also have some kind of control over the people who are being hosted. This is because if the guests take over a house through force, then the host is no longer being hospitable towards them precisely because they are no longer in control of the situation. This means, for Derrida, that any attempt to behave hospitably is also always partly betrothed to the keeping of guests under control, to the closing of boundaries, to nationalism, and even to the exclusion of particular groups or ethnicities (OH 151-5). This is Derrida’s ‘possible’ conception of hospitality, in which our most well-intentioned conceptions of hospitality render the “other others” as strangers and refugees (cf. OH 135, GD 68). Whether one invokes the current international preoccupation with border control, or simply the ubiquitous suburban fence and alarm system, it seems that hospitality always posits some kind of limit upon where the other can trespass, and hence has a tendency to be rather inhospitable. On the other hand, as well as demanding some kind of mastery of house, country or nation, there is a sense in which the notion of hospitality demands a welcoming of whomever, or whatever, may be in need of that hospitality. It follows from this that unconditional hospitality, or we might say ‘impossible’ hospitality, hence involves a relinquishing of judgement and control in regard to who will receive that hospitality. In other words, hospitality also requires non-mastery, and the abandoning of all claims to property, or ownership. If that is the case, however, the ongoing possibility of hospitality thereby becomes circumvented, as there is no longer the possibility of hosting anyone, as again, there is no ownership or control.
Derrida discerns another aporia in regard to whether or not to forgive somebody who has caused us significant suffering or pain. This particular paradox revolves around the premise that if one forgives something that is actually forgivable, then one simply engages in calculative reasoning and hence does not really forgive. Most commonly in interviews, but also in his recent text On Cosmopolitanism and Forgiveness, Derrida argues that according to its own internal logic, genuine forgiving must involve the impossible: that is, the forgiving of an ‘unforgivable’ transgression – eg. a ‘mortal sin’ (OCF 32, cf. OH 39). There is hence a sense in which forgiving must be ‘mad’ and ‘unconscious’ (OCF 39, 49), and it must also remain outside of, or heterogenous to, political and juridical rationality. This unconditional ‘forgiveness’ explicitly precludes the necessity of an apology or repentance by the guilty party, although Derrida acknowledges that this pure notion of forgiveness must always exist in tension with a more conditional forgiveness where apologies are actually demanded. However, he argues that this conditional forgiveness amounts more to amnesty and reconciliation than to genuine forgiveness (OCF 51). The pattern of this discussion is undoubtedly beginning to become familiar. Derrida’s discussions of forgiving are orientated around revealing a fundamental paradox that ensures that forgiving can never be finished or concluded – it must always be open, like a permanent rupture, or a wound that refuses to heal.
This forgiveness paradox depends, in one of its dual aspects, upon a radical disjunction between self and other. Derrida explicitly states that “genuine forgiveness must engage two singularities: the guilty and the victim. As soon as a third party intervenes, one can again speak of amnesty, reconciliation, reparation, etc., but certainly not of forgiveness in the strict sense” (OCF 42). Given that he also acknowledges that it is difficult to conceive of any such face-to-face encounter without a third party – as language itself must serve such a mediating function (OCF 48) – forgiveness is caught in an aporia that ensures that its empirical actuality looks to be decidedly unlikely. To recapitulate, the reason that Derrida’s notion of forgiveness is caught in such an inextricable paradox is because absolute forgiveness requires a radically singular confrontation between self and other, while conditional forgiveness requires the breaching of categories such as self and other, either by a mediating party, or simply by the recognition of the ways in which we are always already intertwined with the other. Indeed, Derrida explicitly argues that when we know anything of the other, or even understand their motivation in however minimal a way, this absolute forgiveness can no longer take place (OCF 49). Derrida can offer no resolution in regard to the impasse that obtains between these two notions (between possible and impossible forgiving, between an amnesty where apologies are asked for and a more absolute forgiveness). He will only insist that an oscillation between both sides of the aporia is necessary for responsibility (OCF 51).
In Memoires: for Paul de Man, which was written almost immediately following de Man’s death in 1983, Derrida reflects upon the political significance of his colleague’s apparent Nazi affiliation in his youth, and he also discusses the pain of losing his friend. Derrida’s argument about mourning adheres to a similarly paradoxical logic to that which has been associated with him throughout this article. He suggests that the so-called ‘successful’ mourning of the deceased other actually fails – or at least is an unfaithful fidelity – because the other person becomes a part of us, and in this interiorisation their genuine alterity is no longer respected. On the other hand, failure to mourn the other’s death paradoxically appears to succeed, because the presence of the other person in their exteriority is prolonged (MDM 6). As Derrida suggests, there is a sense in which “an aborted interiorisation is at the same time a respect for the other as other” (MDM 35). Hence the possibility of an impossible bereavement, where the only possible way to mourn, is to be unable to do so. However, even though this is how he initially presents the problem, Derrida also problematises this “success fails, failure succeeds” formulation (MDM 35).
In his essay “Fors: The Anglish Words of Nicolas Abraham and Maria Torok”, Derrida again considers two models of the type of encroachment between self and other that is regularly associated with mourning. Borrowing from post-Freudian theories of mourning, he posits (although later undermines) a difference between introjection, which is love for the other in me, and incorporation, which involves retaining the other as a pocket, or a foreign body within one’s own body. For Freud, as well as for the psychologists Abraham and Torok whose work Derrida considers, successful mourning is primarily about the introjection of the other. The preservation of a discrete and separate other person inside the self (psychologically speaking), as is the case in incorporation, is considered to be where mourning ceases to be a ‘normal’ response and instead becomes pathological. Typically, Derrida reverses this hierarchy by highlighting that there is a sense in which the supposedly pathological condition of incorporation is actually more respectful of the other person’s alterity. After all, incorporation means that one has not totally assimilated the other, as there is still a difference and a heterogeneity (EO 57). On the other hand, Abraham and Torok’s so-called ‘normal’ mourning can be accused of interiorising the other person to such a degree that they have become assimilated and even metaphorically cannibalised. Derrida considers this introjection to be an infidelity to the other. However, Derrida’s account is not so simple as to unreservedly valorise the incorporation of the other person, even if he emphasises this paradigm in an effort to refute the canonical interpretation of successful mourning. He also acknowledges that the more the self “keeps the foreign element inside itself, the more it excludes it” (Fors xvii). If we refuse to engage with the dead other, we also exclude their foreignness from ourselves and hence prevent any transformative interaction with them. When fetishised in their externality in such a manner, the dead other really is lifeless and it is significant that Derrida describes the death of de Man in terms of the loss of exchange and of the transformational opportunities that he presented (MDM xvi, cf WM). Derrida’s point hence seems to be that in mourning, the ‘otherness of the other’ person resists both the process of incorporation as well as the process of introjection. The other can neither be preserved as a foreign entity, nor introjected fully within. Towards the end of Memoires: for Paul de Man, Derrida suggests that responsibility towards the other is about respecting and even emphasising this resistance (MDM 160, 238).
La Trobe University
Last updated: January 12, 2010 | Originally published: