Descartes, Rene: Mind-Body Distinction

René Descartes:
The Mind-Body Distinction

descarteOne of the deepest and most lasting legacies of Descartes’ philosophy is his thesis that mind and body are really distinct—a thesis now called "mind-body dualism." He reaches this conclusion by arguing that the nature of the mind (that is, a thinking, non-extended thing) is completely different from that of the body (that is, an extended, non-thinking thing), and therefore it is possible for one to exist without the other. This argument gives rise to the famous problem of mind-body causal interaction still debated today: how can the mind cause some of our bodily limbs to move (for example, raising one's hand to ask a question), and how can the body’s sense organs cause sensations in the mind when their natures are completely different? This article examines these issues as well as Descartes’ own response to this problem through his brief remarks on how the mind is united with the body to form a human being. This will show how these issues arise because of a misconception about Descartes’ theory of mind-body union, and how the correct conception of their union avoids this version of the problem. The article begins with an examination of the term “real distinction” and of Descartes’ probable motivations for maintaining his dualist thesis.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Real Distinction?
  2. Why a Real Distinction?
    1. The Religious Motivation
    2. The Scientific Motivation
  3. The Real Distinction Argument
    1. The First Version
    2. The Second Version
  4. The Mind-Body Problem
  5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. What is a Real Distinction?

It is important to note that for Descartes “real distinction” is a technical term denoting the distinction between two or more substances (see Principles, part I, section 60). A substance is something that does not require any other creature to exist—it can exist with only the help of God’s concurrence—whereas, a mode is a quality or affection of that substance (see Principles part I, section 5). Accordingly, a mode requires a substance to exist and not just the concurrence of God. Being sphere shaped is a mode of an extended substance. For example, a sphere requires an object extended in three dimensions in order to exist: an unextended sphere cannot be conceived without contradiction. But a substance can be understood to exist alone without requiring any other creature to exist. For example, a stone can exist all by itself. That is, its existence is not dependent upon the existence of minds or other bodies; and, a stone can exist without being any particular size or shape. This indicates for Descartes that God, if he chose, could create a world constituted by this stone all by itself, showing further that it is a substance “really distinct” from everything else except God. Hence, the thesis that mind and body are really distinct just means that each could exist all by itself without any other creature, including each other, if God chose to do it. However, this does not mean that these substances do exist separately. Whether or not they actually exist apart is another issue entirely.

2. Why a Real Distinction?

A question one might ask is: what's the point of arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other? What’s the payoff for going through all the trouble and enduring all the problems to which it gives rise? For Descartes the payoff is twofold. The first is religious in nature in that it provides a rational basis for a hope in the soul’s immortality [because Descartes presumes that the mind and soul are more or less the same thing]. The second is more scientifically oriented, for the complete absence of mentality from the nature of physical things is central to making way for Descartes’ version of the new, mechanistic physics. This section investigates both of these motivating factors.

a. The Religious Motivation

In his Letter to the Sorbonne published at the beginning of his seminal work, Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes states that his purpose in showing that the human mind or soul is really distinct from the body is to refute those “irreligious people” who only have faith in mathematics and will not believe in the soul's immortality without a mathematical demonstration of it. Descartes goes on to explain how, because of this, these people will not pursue moral virtue without the prospect of an afterlife with rewards for virtue and punishments for vice. But, since all the arguments in the Meditations—including the real distinction arguments— are for Descartes absolutely certain on a par with geometrical demonstrations, he believes that these people will be obliged to accept them. Hence, irreligious people will be forced to believe in the prospect of an afterlife. However, recall that Descartes’ conclusion is only that the mind or soul can exist without the body. He stops short of demonstrating that the soul is actually immortal. Indeed, in the Synopsis to the Mediations, Descartes claims only to have shown that the decay of the body does not logically or metaphysically imply the destruction of the mind: further argumentation is required for the conclusion that the mind actually survives the body's destruction. This would involve both “an account of the whole of physics” and an argument showing that God cannot annihilate the mind. Yet, even though the real distinction argument does not go this far, it does, according to Descartes, provide a sufficient foundation for religion, since the hope for an afterlife now has a rational basis and is no longer a mere article of faith.

b. The Scientific Motivation

The other motive for arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other is more scientifically oriented, stemming from Descartes’ intended replacement of final causal explanations in physics thought to be favored by late scholastic-Aristotelian philosophers with mechanistic explanations based on the model of geometry. Although the credit for setting the stage for this scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy dominant at Descartes’ time should go to Thomas Aquinas (because of his initial, thorough interpretation and appropriation of Aristotle’s philosophy), it is also important to bear in mind that other thinkers working within this Aristotelian framework such as Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, and Francisco Suarez, diverged from the Thomistic position on a variety of important issues. Indeed, by Descartes’ time, scholastic positions divergent from Thomism became so widespread and subtle in their differences that sorting them out was quite difficult. Notwithstanding this convoluted array of positions, Descartes understood one thesis to stand at the heart of the entire tradition: the doctrine that everything ultimately behaved for the sake of some end or goal. Though these “final causes,” as they were called, were not the only sorts of causes recognized by scholastic thinkers, it is sufficient for present purposes to recognize that Descartes believed scholastic natural philosophers used them as principles for physical explanations. For this reason, a brief look at how final causes were supposed to work is in order.

Descartes understood all scholastics to maintain that everything was thought to have a final cause that is the ultimate end or goal for the sake of which the rest of the organism was organized. This principle of organization became known as a thing’s “substantial form,” because it was this principle that explained why some hunk of matter was arranged in such and such a way so as to be some species of substance. For example, in the case of a bird, say, the swallow, the substantial form of swallowness was thought to organize matter for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. Accordingly, any dispositions a swallow might have, such as the disposition for making nests, would then also be explained by means of this ultimate goal of being a swallow; that is, swallows are disposed for making nests for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. This explanatory scheme was also thought to work for plants and inanimate natural objects.

A criticism of the traditional employment of substantial forms and their concomitant final causes in physics is found in the Sixth Replies where Descartes examines how the quality of gravity was used to explain a body’s downward motion:

But what makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I had of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies toward the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself (AT VII 442: CSM II 298).

On this pre-Newtonian account, a characteristic goal of all bodies was to reach its proper place, namely, the center of the earth. So, the answer to the question, “Why do stones fall downward?” would be, “Because they are striving to achieve their goal of reaching the center of the earth.” According to Descartes, this implies that the stone must have knowledge of this goal, know the means to attain it, and know where the center of the earth is located. But, how can a stone know anything? Surely only minds can have knowledge. Yet, since stones are inanimate bodies without minds, it follows that they cannot know anything at all—let alone anything about the center of the earth.

Descartes continues on to make the following point:

But later on I made the observations which led me to make a careful distinction between the idea of the mind and the ideas of body and corporeal motion; and I found that all those other ideas of . . . 'substantial forms' which I had previously held were ones which I had put together or constructed from those basic ideas (AT VII 442-3: CSM II 298).

Here, Descartes is claiming that the concept of a substantial form as part of the entirely physical world stems from a confusion of the ideas of mind and body. This confusion led people to mistakenly ascribe mental properties like knowledge to entirely non-mental things like stones, plants, and, yes, even non-human animals. The real distinction of mind and body can then also be used to alleviate this confusion and its resultant mistakes by showing that bodies exist and move as they do without mentality, and as such principles of mental causation such as goals, purposes (that is, final causes), and knowledge have no role to play in the explanation of physical phenomena. So the real distinction of mind and body also serves the more scientifically oriented end of eliminating any element of mentality from the idea of body. In this way, a clear understanding of the geometrical nature of bodies can be achieved and better explanations obtained.

3. The Real Distinction Argument

Descartes formulates this argument in many different ways, which has led many scholars to believe there are several different real distinction arguments. However, it is more accurate to consider these formulations as different versions of one and the same argument. The fundamental premise of each is identical: each has the fundamental premise that the natures of mind and body are completely different from one another.

The First Version

The first version is found in this excerpt from the Sixth Meditation:

[O]n the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing [that is, a mind], and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing. And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT VII 78: CSM II 54).

Notice that the argument is given from the first person perspective (as are the entire Meditations). This “I” is, of course, Descartes insofar as he is a thinking thing or mind, and the argument is intended to work for any “I” or mind. So, for present purposes, it is safe to generalize the argument by replacing “I” with “mind” in the relevant places:

  1. I have a clear and distinct idea of the mind as a thinking, non-extended thing.
  2. I have a clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing.
  3. Therefore, the mind is really distinct from the body and can exist without it.

At first glance it may seem that, without justification, Descartes is bluntly asserting that he conceives of mind and body as two completely different things, and that from his conception, he is inferring that he (or any mind) can exist without the body. But this is no blunt, unjustified assertion. Much more is at work here: most notably what is at work is his doctrine of clear and distinct ideas and their veridical guarantee. Indeed the truth of his intellectual perception of the natures of mind and body is supposed to be guaranteed by the fact that this perception is “clear and distinct.” Since the justification for these two premises rests squarely on the veridical guarantee of whatever is “clearly and distinctly” perceived, a brief side trip explaining this doctrine is in order.

Descartes explains what he means by a “clear and distinct idea” in his work Principles of Philosophy at part I, section 45. Here he likens a clear intellectual perception to a clear visual perception. So, just as someone might have a sharply focused visual perception of something, an idea is clear when it is in sharp intellectual focus. Moreover, an idea is distinct when, in addition to being clear, all other ideas not belonging to it are completely excluded from it. Hence, Descartes is claiming in both premises that his idea of the mind and his idea of the body exclude all other ideas that do not belong to them, including each other, and all that remains is what can be clearly understood of each. As a result, he clearly and distinctly understands the mind all by itself, separately from the body, and the body all by itself, separately from the mind.

According to Descartes, his ability to clearly and distinctly understand them separately from one another implies that each can exist alone without the other. This is because “[e]xistence is contained in the idea or concept of every single thing, since we cannot conceive of anything except as existing. Possible or contingent existence is contained in the concept of a limited thing...” (AT VII 166: CSM II 117). Descartes, then, clearly and distinctly perceives the mind as possibly existing all by itself, and the body as possibly existing all by itself. But couldn't Descartes somehow be mistaken about his clear and distinct ideas? Given the existence of so many non-thinking bodies like stones, there is no question that bodies can exist without minds. So, even if he could be mistaken about what he clearly and distinctly understands, there is other evidence in support of premise 2. But can minds exist without bodies? Can thinking occur without a brain? If the answer to this question is “no,” the first premise would be false and, therefore, Descartes would be mistaken about one of his clear and distinct perceptions. Indeed, since we have no experience of minds actually existing without bodies as we do of bodies actually existing without minds, the argument will stand only if Descartes’ clear and distinct understanding of the mind’s nature somehow guarantees the truth of premise 1; but, at this point, it is not evident whether Descartes’ “clear and distinct” perception guarantees the truth of anything.

However, in the Fourth Meditation, Descartes goes to great lengths to guarantee the truth of whatever is clearly and distinctly understood. This veridical guarantee is based on the theses that God exists and that he cannot be a deceiver. These arguments, though very interesting, are numerous and complex, and so they will not be discussed here. Suffice it to say that since Descartes believes he has established God’s inability to deceive with absolute, geometrical certainty, he would have to consider anything contradicting this conclusion to be false. Moreover, Descartes claims that he cannot help but believe clear and distinct ideas to be true. However, if God put a clear and distinct idea in him that was false, then he could not help but believe a falsehood to be true and, to make matters worse, he would never be able to discover the mistake. Since God would be the author of this false clear and distinct idea, he would be the source of the error and would, therefore, be a deceiver, which must be false. Hence, all clear and distinct ideas must be true, because it is impossible for them to be false given God’s non-deceiving nature.

That said, the clarity and distinctness of Descartes’ understanding of mind and body guarantees the truth of premise 1. Hence, both “clear and distinct” premises are not blunt, unjustified assertions of what he believes but have very strong rational support from within Descartes’ system. However, if it turns out that God does not exist or that he can be a deceiver, then all bets are off. There would then no longer be any veridical guarantee of what is clearly and distinctly understood and, as a result, the first premise could be false. Consequently, premise 1 would not bar the possibility of minds requiring brains to exist and, therefore, this premise would not be absolutely certain as Descartes supposed. In the end, the conclusion is established with absolute certainty only when considered from within Descartes’ own epistemological framework but loses its force if that framework turns out to be false or when evaluated from outside of it.

These guaranteed truths express some very important points about Descartes’ conception of mind and body. Notice that mind and body are defined as complete opposites. This means that the ideas of mind and body represent two natures that have absolutely nothing in common. And, it is this complete diversity that establishes the possibility of their independent existence. But, how can Descartes make a legitimate inference from his independent understanding of mind and body as completely different things to their independent existence? To answer this question, recall that every idea of limited or finite things contains the idea of possible or contingent existence, and so Descartes is conceiving mind and body as possibly existing all by themselves without any other creature. Since there is no doubt about this possibility for Descartes and given the fact that God is all powerful, it follows that God could bring into existence a mind without a body and vice versa just as Descartes clearly and distinctly understands them. Hence, the power of God makes Descartes’ perceived logical possibility of minds existing without bodies into a metaphysical possibility. As a result, minds without bodies and bodies without minds would require nothing besides God’s concurrence to exist and, therefore, they are two really distinct substances.

The Second Version

The argument just examined is formulated in a different way later in the Sixth Meditation:

[T]here is a great difference between the mind and the body, inasmuch as the body is by its very nature always divisible, while the mind is utterly indivisible. For when I consider the mind, or myself in so far as I am merely a thinking thing, I am unable to distinguish any parts within myself; I understand myself to be something quite single and complete….By contrast, there is no corporeal or extended thing that I can think of which in my thought I cannot easily divide into parts; and this very fact makes me understand that it is divisible. This one argument would be enough to show me that the mind is completely different from the body…. (AT VII 86-87: CSM II 59).

This argument can be reformulated as follows, replacing “mind” for “I” as in the first version:

  1. I understand the mind to be indivisible by its very nature.
  2. I understand body to be divisible by its very nature.
  3. Therefore, the mind is completely different from the body.

Notice the conclusion that mind and body are really distinct is not explicitly stated but can be inferred from 3. What is interesting about this formulation is how Descartes reaches his conclusion. He does not assert a clear and distinct understanding of these two natures as completely different but instead makes his point based on a particular property of each. However, this is not just any property but a property each has “by its very nature.” Something’s nature is just what it is to be that kind of thing, and so the term “nature” is here being used as synonymous with “essence.” On this account, extension constitutes the nature or essence of bodily kinds of things; while thinking constitutes the nature or essence of mental kinds of things. So, here Descartes is arguing that a property of what it is to be a body, or extended thing, is to be divisible, while a property of what it is to be a mind or thinking thing is to be indivisible.

Descartes’ line of reasoning in support of these claims about the respective natures of mind and body runs as follows. First, it is easy to see that bodies are divisible. Just take any body, say a pencil or a piece of paper, and break it or cut it in half. Now you have two bodies instead of one. Second, based on this line of reasoning, it is easy to see why Descartes believed his nature or mind to be indivisible: if a mind or an “I” could be divided, then two minds or “I’s” would result; but since this “I” just is my self, this would be the same as claiming that the division of my mind results in two selves, which is absurd. Therefore, the body is essentially divisible and the mind is essentially indivisible: but how does this lead to the conclusion that they are completely different?

Here it should be noted that a difference in just any non-essential property would have only shown that mind and body are not exactly the same. But this is a much weaker claim than Descartes’ conclusion that they are completely different. For two things could have the same nature, for example, extension, but have other, changeable properties or modes distinguishing them. Hence, these two things would be different in some respect, for example, in shape, but not completely different, since both would still be extended kinds of things. Consequently, Descartes needs their complete diversity to claim that he has completely independent conceptions of each and, in turn, that mind and body can exist independently of one another.

Descartes can reach this stronger conclusion because these essential properties are contradictories. On the one hand, Descartes argues that the mind is indivisible because he cannot perceive himself as having any parts. On the other hand, the body is divisible because he cannot think of a body except as having parts. Hence, if mind and body had the same nature, it would be a nature both with and without parts. Yet such a thing is unintelligible: how could something both be separable into parts and yet not separable into parts? The answer is that it can’t, and so mind and body cannot be one and the same but two completely different natures. Notice that, as with the first version, mind and body are here being defined as opposites. This implies that divisible body can be understood without indivisible mind and vice versa. Accordingly each can be understood as existing all by itself: they are two really distinct substances.

However, unlike the first version, Descartes does not invoke the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas to justify his premises. If he had, this version, like the first, would be absolutely certain from within Descartes’ own epistemological system. But if removed from this apparatus, it is possible that Descartes is mistaken about the indivisibility of the mind, because the possibility of the mind requiring a brain to exist would still be viable. This would mean that, since extension is part of the nature of mind, it would, being an extended thing, be composed of parts and, therefore, it would be divisible. As a result, Descartes could not legitimately reach the conclusion that mind and body are completely different. This would also mean that the further, implicit conclusion that mind and body are really distinct could not be reached either. In the end, the main difficulty with Descartes’ real distinction argument is that he has not adequately eliminated the possibility of minds being extended things like brains.

4. The Mind-Body Problem

The real distinction of mind and body based on their completely diverse natures is the root of the famous mind-body problem: how can these two substances with completely different natures causally interact so as to give rise to a human being capable of having voluntary bodily motions and sensations? Although several versions of this problem have arisen over the years, this section will be exclusively devoted to the version of it Descartes confronted as expressed by Pierre Gassendi, the author of the Fifth Objections, and Descartes’ correspondent, Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia. Their concern arises from the claim at the heart of the real distinction argument that mind and body are completely different or opposite things.

The complete diversity of their respective natures has serious consequences for the kinds of modes each can possess. For instance, in the Second Meditation, Descartes argues that he is nothing but a thinking thing or mind, that is, Descartes argues that he is a “thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, is willing, is unwilling, and also imagines and has sensory perceptions” (AT VII 28: CSM II 19). It makes no sense to ascribe such modes to entirely extended, non-thinking things like stones, and therefore, only minds can have these kinds of modes. Conversely, it makes no sense to ascribe modes of size, shape, quantity and motion to non-extended, thinking things. For example, the concept of an unextended shape is unintelligible. Therefore, a mind cannot be understood to be shaped or in motion, nor can a body understand or sense anything. Human beings, however, are supposed to be combinations of mind and body such that the mind’s choices can cause modes of motion in the body, and motions in certain bodily organs, such as the eye, cause modes of sensation in the mind.

The mind’s ability to cause motion in the body will be addressed first. Take for example a voluntary choice, or willing, to raise one’s hand in class to ask a question. The arm moving upward is the effect while the choice to raise it is the cause. But willing is a mode of the non-extended mind alone, whereas the arm’s motion is a mode of the extended body alone: how can the non-extended mind bring about this extended effect? It is this problem of voluntary bodily motion or the so-called problem of “mind to body causation” that so troubled Gassendi and Elizabeth. The crux of their concern was that in order for one thing to cause motion in another, they must come into contact with one another as, for example, in the game of pool the cue ball must be in motion and come into contact with the eight-ball in order for the latter to be set in motion. The problem is that, in the case of voluntarily bodily movements, contact between mind and body would be impossible given the mind’s non-extended nature. This is because contact must be between two surfaces, but surface is a mode of body, as stated at Principles of Philosophy part II, section 15. Accordingly, the mind does not have a surface that can come into contact with the body and cause it to move. So, it seems that if mind and body are completely different, there is no intelligible explanation of voluntary bodily movement.

Although Gassendi and Elizabeth limited themselves to the problem of voluntary bodily movement, a similar problem arises for sensations, or the so-called problem of “body to mind causation.” For instance, a visual sensation of a tree is a mode of the mind alone. The cause of this mode would be explained by the motion of various imperceptible bodies causing parts of the eye to move, then movements in the optic nerve, which in turn cause various “animal spirits” to move in the brain and finally result in the sensory idea of the tree in the mind. But how can the movement of the “animal spirits,” which were thought to be very fine bodies, bring about the existence of a sensory idea when the mind is incapable of receiving modes of motion given its non-extended nature? Again, since the mind is incapable of having motion and a surface, no intelligible explanation of sensations seems possible either. Therefore, the completely different natures of mind and body seem to render their causal interaction impossible.

The consequences of this problem are very serious for Descartes, because it undermines his claim to have a clear and distinct understanding of the mind without the body. For humans do have sensations and voluntarily move some of their bodily limbs and, if Gassendi and Elizabeth are correct, this requires a surface and contact. Since the mind must have a surface and a capacity for motion, the mind must also be extended and, therefore, mind and body are not completely different. This means the “clear and distinct” ideas of mind and body, as mutually exclusive natures, must be false in order for mind-body causal interaction to occur. Hence, Descartes has not adequately established that mind and body are two really distinct substances.

5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem

Despite the obviousness of this problem, and the amount of attention given to it, Descartes himself never took this issue very seriously. His response to Gassendi is a telling example:

These questions presuppose amongst other things an explanation of the union between the soul and the body, which I have not yet dealt with at all. But I will say, for your benefit at least, that the whole problem contained in such questions arises simply from a supposition that is false and cannot in any way be proved, namely that, if the soul and the body are two substances whose nature is different, this prevents them from being able to act on each other (AT VII 213: CSM II 275).

So, Descartes’ response to the mind-body problem is twofold. First, Descartes contends that a response to this question presupposes an explanation of the union between the mind (or soul) and the body. Second, Descartes claims that the question itself stems from the false presupposition that two substances with completely different natures cannot act on each other. Further examination of these two points will occur in reverse order.

Descartes’ principles of causation put forward in the Third Meditation lie at the heart of this second presupposition. The relevant portion of this discussion is when Descartes argues that the less real cannot cause something that is more real, because the less real does not have enough reality to bring about something more real than itself. This principle applies on the general level of substances and modes. On this account, an infinite substance, that is, God, is the most real thing because only he requires nothing else in order to exist; created, finite substances are next most real, because they require only God’s creative and conservative activity in order to exist; and finally, modes are the least real, because they require a created substance and an infinite substance in order to exist. So, on this principle, a mode cannot cause the existence of a substance since modes are less real than finite substances. Similarly, a created, finite substance cannot cause the existence of an infinite substance. But a finite substance can cause the existence of another finite substance or a mode (since modes are less real than substances). Hence, Descartes’ point could be that the completely diverse natures of mind and body do not violate this causal principle, since both are finite substances causing modes to exist in some other finite substance. This indicates further that the “activity” of the mind on the body does not require contact and motion, thereby suggesting that mind and body do not bear a mechanistic causal relation to each other. More will be said about this below.

The first presupposition concerns an explanation of how the mind is united with the body. Descartes’ remarks about this issue are scattered across both his published works and his private correspondence. These texts indicate that Descartes did not maintain that voluntary bodily movements and sensation arise because of the causal interaction of mind and body by contact and motion. Rather, he maintains a version of the form-matter theory of soul-body union endorsed by some of his scholastic-Aristotelian predecessors and contemporaries. Although a close analysis of the texts in question cannot be conducted here, a brief summary of how this theory works for Descartes can be provided.

Before providing this summary, however, it is important to disclaim that this scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is a minority position amongst Descartes scholars. The traditional view maintains that Descartes’ human being is composed of two substances that causally interact in a mechanistic fashion. This traditional view led some of Descartes’ successors, such as Malebranche and Leibniz (who also believed in the real distinction of mind and body), to devise metaphysical systems wherein mind and body do not causally interact despite appearances to the contrary. Other philosophers considered the mind-body problem to be insurmountable, thereby denying their real distinction: they claim that everything is either extended (as is common nowadays) or mental (as George Berkeley argued in the 18th century). Indeed, this traditional, mechanistic interpretation of Descartes is so deeply ingrained in the minds of philosophers today, that most do not even bother to argue for it. However, a notable exception is Marleen Rozemond, who argues for the incompatibility of Descartes’ metaphysics with any scholastic-Aristotelian version of mind or soul-body union. Those interested in closely examining her arguments should consult her book Descartes’s Dualism. A book arguing in favor of the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is entitled Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature; Chapter 5 specifically addresses Rozemond’s concerns.

Two major stumbling blocks Rozemond raises for the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation concern the mind’s status as a substantial form and the extent to which Descartes can maintain a form of the human body. However, recall that Descartes rejects substantial forms because of their final causal component. Descartes’ argument was based on the fact (as he understood it) that the scholastics were ascribing mental properties to entirely non-mental things like stones. Since the mind is an entirely mental thing, these arguments just do not apply to it. Hence, Descartes’ particular rejection of substantial forms does not necessarily imply that Descartes did not view the mind as a substantial form. Indeed, as Paul Hoffman noted:

Descartes really rejects the attempt to use the human soul as a model for explanations in the entirely physical world. This makes it possible that Descartes considered the human mind to be the only substantial form. At first glance this may seem ad hoc but it is also important to notice that rejecting the existence of substantial forms with the exception of the mind or rational soul was not uncommon amongst Descartes’ contemporaries.

Although the mind’s status as a substantial form may seem at risk because of its meager explicit textual support, Descartes suggests that the mind a “substantial form” twice in a draft of open letter to his enemy Voetius:

Yet, if the soul is recognized as merely a substantial form, while other such forms consist in the configuration and motion of parts, this very privileged status it has compared with other forms shows that its nature is quite different from theirs (AT III 503: CSMK 207-208).

Descartes then remarks “this is confirmed by the example of the soul, which is the true substantial form of man” (AT III 508: CSMK 208). Although other passages do not make this claim explicitly, they do imply (in some sense) that the mind is a substantial form. For instance, Descartes claims in a letter to Mesland dated 9 February 1645, that the soul is “substantially united” with the human body (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). This “substantial union” was a technical term amongst the scholastics denoting the union between a substantial form and matter to form a complete substance. Consequently, there is some reason for believing that the human mind is the only substantial form left standing in Descartes’ metaphysics.

Another major stumbling block recognized by Rozemond is the extent to which, if any, Descartes’ metaphysics can maintain a principle for organizing extension into a human body. This was a point of some controversy amongst the scholastics themselves. Philosophers maintaining a Thomistic position argued that the human soul is the human body’s principle of organization. While others, maintaining a basically Scotistic position, argued that some other form besides the human soul is the form of the body. This “form of corporeity” organizes matter for the sake of being a human body but does not result in a full-fledged human being. Rather it makes a body with the potential for union with the human soul. The soul then actualizes this potential resulting in a complete human being. If Descartes did hold a fundamentally scholastic theory of mind-body union, then is it more Thomistic or Scotistic? Since intellect and will are the only faculties of the mind, it does not have the faculty for organizing matter for being a human body. So, if Descartes’ theory is scholastic, it must be most in line with some version of the Scotistic theory. Rozemond argues that Descartes’ rejection of all other substantial forms (except the human mind or soul) precludes this kind of theory since he cannot appeal to the doctrine of substantial forms like the Scotists.

Although Descartes argues that bodies, in the general sense, are constituted by extension, he also maintains that species of bodies are determined by the configuration and motion of their parts. This doctrine of “configuration and motion of parts” serves the same purpose as the doctrine of substantial forms with regards to entirely physical things. But the main difference between the two is that Descartes’ doctrine does not employ final causes. Recall that substantial forms organize matter for the purpose of being a species of thing. The purpose of a human body endowed with only the form of corporeity is union with the soul. Hence, the organization of matter into a human body is an effect that is explained by the final cause or purpose of being disposed for union. But, on Descartes’ account, the explanatory order would be reversed: a human body’s disposition for union is an effect resulting from the configuration and motion of parts. So, even though Descartes does not have recourse to substantial forms, he still has recourse to the configuration of matter and to the dispositions to which it gives rise, including “all the dispositions required to preserve that union” (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). Hence, on this account, Descartes gets what he needs, namely, Descartes gets a body properly configured for potential union with the mind, but without recourse to the scholastic notion of substantial forms with their final causal component.

Another feature of this basically Scotistic position is that the soul and the body were considered incomplete substances themselves, while their union results in one, complete substance. Surely Descartes maintains that mind and body are two substances but in what sense, if any, can they be considered incomplete? Descartes answers this question in the Fourth Replies. He argues that a substance may be complete insofar as it is a substance but incomplete insofar as it is referred to some other substance together with which it forms yet some third substance. This can be applied to mind and body as follows: the mind insofar as it is a thinking thing is a complete substance, while the body insofar as it is an extended thing is a complete substance, but each taken individually is only an incomplete human being.

This account is repeated in the following excerpt from a letter to Regius dated December 1641:

For there you said that the body and the soul, in relation to the whole human being, are incomplete substances; and it follows from their being incomplete that what they constitute is a being through itself (that is, an ens per se; AT III 460: CSMK 200).

The technical sense of the term “being through itself” was intended to capture the fact that human beings do not require any other creature but only God’s concurrence to exist. Accordingly, a being through itself, or ens per se, is a substance. Also notice that the claim in the letter to Regius that two incomplete substances together constitute a being through itself is reminiscent of Descartes’ remarks in the Fourth Replies. This affinity between the two texts indicates that the union of mind and body results in one complete substance or being through itself. This just means that mind and body are the metaphysical parts (mind and body are incomplete substances in this respect) that constitute one, whole human being, which is a complete substance in its own right. Hence, a human being is not the result of two substances causally interacting by means of contact and motion, as Gassendi and Elizabeth supposed, but rather they bear a relation of act and potency that results in one, whole and complete substantial human being.

This sheds some light on why Descartes thought that an account of mind-body union would put Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s concerns to rest: they misconceived the union of mind and body as a mechanical relation when in fact it is a relation of act and potency. This avoids Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s version of this problem. This aversion is accomplished by the fact that modes of voluntary motion (and sensations, by extrapolation) should be ascribed to a whole human being and not to the mind or the body taken individually. This is made apparent in a 21 May 1643 letter to Elizabeth where Descartes distinguishes between various “primitive notions.” The most general are the notions of being, number, duration, and so on, which apply to all conceivable things. He then goes on to distinguish the notions of mind and body:

Then, as regards body in particular, we have only the notion of extension, which entails the notions of shape and motion; and as regards the soul on its own, we have only the notion of thought, which includes the perceptions of the intellect and the inclinations of the will (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

Here body and soul (or mind) are primitive notions and the notions of their respective modes are the notions “entailed by” or “included in” these primitives. Descartes then discusses the primitive notion of mind-body union:

Lastly, as regards the soul and the body together, we have only the notion of their union, on which depends our notion of the soul’s power to move the body, and the body’s power to act on the soul and cause its sensations and passions (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

In light of the immediately preceding lines, this indicates that voluntary bodily movements and sensations are not modes of the body alone, or the mind alone, but rather are modes of “the soul and the body together.” This is at least partially confirmed in the following lines from Principles, part I, article 48:

But we also experience within ourselves certain other things, which must not be referred either to the mind alone or to the body alone. These arises, as will be made clear in the appropriate place, from the close and intimate union of our mind with the body. This list includes, first, appetites like hunger and thirds; secondly, the emotions or passions . . . (AT VIIIA 23: CSM I 209).

These texts indicate that the mind or soul is united with the body so as to give rise to another whole complete substance composed of these two metaphysical parts. And, moreover, this composite substance now has the capacity for having modes of its own, namely, modes of voluntary bodily movement and sensation, which neither the mind nor the body can have individually. So, voluntary bodily movements are not modes of the body alone caused by the mind, nor are sensations modes of the mind alone caused by the body. Rather, both are modes of a whole and complete human being. On this account, it makes no sense to ask how the non-extended mind can come into contact with the body to cause these modes. To ask this would be to get off on the wrong foot entirely, since contact between these two completely diverse substances is not required for these modes to exist. Rather all that is necessary is for the mind to actualize the potential in a properly disposed human body to form one, whole, human being to whom is attributed modes of voluntary movement and sensation.

Although the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation avoids the traditional causal interaction problem based on the requirements of contact and motion, it does run up against another version of that problem, namely, a problem of formal causation. This is a problem facing any scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind or soul-body union where the soul is understood to be an immaterial substantial form. Recall that the immaterial mind or soul as substantial form is suppose to act on a properly disposed human body in order to result in a full-fledged human being. The problem of formal causal interaction is: how can an immaterial soul assubstantial form act on the potential in a material thing? Can any sense be made of the claim that a non-extended or immaterial things acts on anything? Descartes noticed in a letter to Regius (AT III 493: CSMK 206) that the scholastics did not try to answer this question and so he and Regius need not either. The likely explanation of their silence is that the act-potency relation was considered absolutely fundamental to scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy and, therefore, it required no further explanation. So, in the end, even if Descartes’ theory is as described here, it does not evade all the causal problems associated with uniting immaterial souls or mind to their respective bodies. , However, if this proposed account is true, it helps to cast Descartes’ philosophy in a new light and to redirect the attention of scholars to the formal causal problems involved.

6. References and Further Reading

Primary Sources

  • Descartes, Rene, Ouevres de Descartes, 11 vols., eds. Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Vrin, 1974-1989.
    • This is still the standard edition of all of Descartes’ works and correspondence in their original languages. Cited in the text as AT, volume, page.
  • Descartes, Rene, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch and Anthony Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991
    • This is the standard English translation of Descartes philosophical works and correspondence. Cited in the text as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.

Secondary Sources

  • Broughton, Janet and Mattern, Ruth, “Reinterpreting Descartes on the Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 16 (1978), 23-32.
    • A reinterpretation of the notion of mind-body union in the correspondence with Elizabeth, which addresses Radner’s interpretation of it. See below.
  • Garber, Daniel, “Understanding Interaction: What Descartes Should Have Told Elizabeth,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, Supp. 21 (1983), 15-32.
    • Article addressing the issues of the primitive notions and how this theory should be used to explain mind-body causal interaction to Elizabeth.
  • Hoffman, Paul, “The Unity of Descartes’ Man,” The Philosophical Review 95 (1986), 339-369.
    • Article arguing that Descartes’ theory of mind-body union is more in line with scholastic-Aristotelian theories of soul-body union than previously supposed.
  • Kenny, Anthony, Descartes: A Study of His Philosophy, New York: Random House, 1968. See especially chapters 4 and 10.
    • These chapters provide classic interpretations of the real distinction between mind and body and the mind-body problem.
  • Mattern, Ruth, “Descartes’ Correspondence with Elizabeth Concerning both the Union and Distinction of Mind and Body” in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, ed. Michael Hooker, Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press, 1978, 212-222.
    • Short essay examining Descartes’ correspondence with Elizabeth on this issue and how it was supposed to direct her to a correct understanding of mind-body causal interaction.
  • Radner, Daisie, “Descartes’ Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 9 (1971), 159-170.
    • This is the first article in Anglo-American scholarship to address the issue of mind-body union. It addresses several texts, including the letter to Elizabeth enumerating the primitive notions.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998.
    • This book argues for a particular understanding of the real distinction between mind and body that would preclude Hoffman’s scholastic-Aristotelian account of their union.
  • Skirry, Justin, Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature, London and New York: Thoemmes-Continuum Press, 2005.
    • This book takes issue with Rozemond’s account of the mind-body union through a close re-examination of fundamental features of Descartes’ metaphysics and by building on certain features of Hoffman’s account.
  • Voss, Stephen, “Descartes: The End of Anthropology” in Reason, Will and Sensation, ed. John Cottingham, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
    • This essay provides a close textual analysis of Descartes’ account of the union of mind and body on the supposition that he maintained a Platonic rather than scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind-body union.
  • Williams, Bernard, Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1978. See especially chapter 4.
    • This is another classic account of the mind-body relation in Descartes.
  • Wilson, Margaret, Descartes, London and Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978.
    • Provides classic accounts of the real distinction argument and issues concerning mind-body causal interaction.

Author Information

Justin Skirry
Email: jskirry@yahoo.com
U. S. A.