Desert is a normative concept that is used in day-to-day life.  Many believe that being treated as one deserves to be treated is a matter of justice, fairness, or rightness.  Although desert claims come in a variety of forms, generally they are claims about some positive or negative treatment that someone or something ought to receive.  One might claim that a hard-working employee deserves a raise, an exceptional student deserves an academic scholarship, a dishonest politician deserves to lose an election, or a thief deserves to be imprisoned.  But while such appeals to desert are common, there are a number of unsettled issues regarding the concept of desert itself and its relevance to justice.  For example, it is common for people to claim that things other than humans, such as nonhuman animals or inanimate objects, can be deserving.  How should we assess such claims?  Some argue that desert presupposes responsibility.  But must this be the case?  According to some theories, desert is an important component of justice.  Yet according to other theories, it has little or no role in justice.  Some even question whether desert itself is a defensible concept.  This article is designed to capture the scholarly agreement about these and other issues regarding desert.  Where there is not such agreement, overviews of some of the competing accounts are presented.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structure of Desert
    1. Deserving Subjects
    2. Deserved Modes of Treatment
    3. Desert Bases
      1. Desert and Responsibility
      2. Desert and Time
  2. Desert and Some Related Concepts
    1. Merit
    2. Entitlement
  3. The Role of Desert in Justice
    1. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice
    2. Desert, Institutions, and Justice
  4. Meritocracy
  5. Some Arguments against Desert
    1. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument
    2. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments
    3. Libertarian Arguments
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Structure of Desert

It is widely held that desert is a relation among three elements: a subject, a mode of treatment or state of affairs deserved by the subject, and some fact or facts about the subject, which are often referred to as desert base or desert bases (McLeod 1999a, 61-62; Pojman 2006, 21; Sher 1987, 7).  This relation is shown in the formula:

S deserves M in virtue of B,

where S is the subject, M is the mode of treatment, and B is the desert base or bases. Each of these elements will be examined in greater detail.

a. Deserving Subjects

One’s view about who or what are the appropriate subjects of desert is going to be influenced by one’s view about what desert requires on the part of a subject.  If one thinks that merely having a quality or feature is sufficient to establish desert, then one will place few restrictions on the kinds of things that can be deserving.  If one thinks that having some baseline self-awareness is sufficient to make one the appropriate subject of desert, then nonhuman animals such as bottlenose dolphins and chimpanzees can be appropriate bearers of desert.  If one thinks that desert requires a certain level of responsibility, then one will advocate for a conception that places stricter limits on who or what qualify as deserving subjects.  While there is some disagreement in the literature, most who theorize about desert view human beings, or at least some subset of human beings, as appropriate subjects of desert  A very broad conception of desert might seek to extend the concept to apply to certain or all sentient creatures, living things in general, or even inanimate objects.  In fact, common language usage seems to support such a broad understanding.  One might claim that Gone with the Wind deserves its reputation as one of the greatest movies ever made or that K2 deserves its reputation as one of the most difficult mountains to climb.  But such a broad understanding of desert might involve problematic conflations of desert with other concepts.  For example, while one might think Gone with the Wind’s lofty reputation is appropriate, one might argue that, strictly speaking, its reputation is not deserved.  Instead, one might argue that in the cases of movies, mountains, and the like, the proposed desert claims are best understood as nothing more than general claims about how something should be judged or about what something should have or receive.  So, in an effort to maintain conceptual clarity, it might be best to attribute some common uses of the term ‘desert’ to inexact language usage.  A survey of the literature suggests some support for both broader (Schmidtz 2002, 777) and narrower uses of the term (Miller 1999, 137-138).

b. Deserved Modes of Treatment

Subjects are said to deserve a wide variety of things.  The modes of treatment or states of affairs that one can deserve can be classified as positive or negative outcomes, harms or benefits, or gains or losses (Kristjánsson 2003, 41).  Positive modes of treatment include such things as awards, compensation, good luck, jobs, praise, prizes, remuneration, rewards, and success.  Negative modes of treatment include such things as bad luck, blame, censure, failure, fines, and punishment.  Oftentimes, a deserved mode of treatment will incorporate a source or supplier of that treatment.  For example, one might argue that an athlete deserves praise from his manager.  But such a source need not be specified in all cases since legitimate desert claims need not be directed toward any source.  This is, in part, because legitimate desert claims need not be enforceable or even prescribe any action.  Consider the claim that certain hardworking people deserve good fortune.  While this is a legitimate desert claim, it need not be directed toward any source and it need not result in a call for any corrective action in cases in which particular hardworking people have not had good fortune (Kekes 1997, 124).

c. Desert Bases

There are a variety of ways in which desert bases can be categorized.  Two categories that are commonly used in the philosophical literature are desert based on effort and desert based on performance.  Some accounts of desert focus primarily on one’s effort toward achieving some goal.  Usually the goal has to be viewed as worthwhile, since quixotic effort is rarely considered to be a basis for desert.  Some argue that desert is not based solely, or even primarily, on effort, but also on one’s performance in a given context.  The performance can be any number of activities that give rise to positive or negative evaluation, such as the winning of a race or performing poorly in a music competition.  In some contexts, the performance can be assessed in terms of the contribution that one makes as a part of some group, such as a family, company, community, or even a society as a whole.  Depending on the context, this contribution can be measured in terms of productivity, success, or some other similar measure. Michael Boylan presents a thought experiment that raises questions concerning how one’s effort and performance often are, and how they should be weighed as factors in determining one’s desert.  We are presented with two puzzle makers.  The first puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is 80 percent complete, and he finishes the puzzle by completing the remaining 20 percent.  The second puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is totally incomplete.  He manages to complete 80 percent of the puzzle, and therefore does not finish it (2004, p. 139 ff). Boylan notes that, according to a common interpretation, the first puzzle maker would be the one who deserves the credit, and the resultant spoils, for completing the puzzle.  But why should this puzzle maker get more credit when he completed significantly less of the puzzle?  He cannot claim credit for, and therefore cannot claim to deserve, receiving the puzzle in a more advanced stage of completion, since he did nothing to bring the puzzle to that stage of completion. The puzzle maker example highlights important issues regarding the nature and use of desert.  First, there is the question of what basis or bases one should use to determine desert.  Should effort, performance, or some combination of the two be used?  Are there other criteria that ought to be used?  Second, even if one determines that effort and performance are the relevant desert bases, then one must still determine how to correctly weigh the two in a given situation.

i. Desert and Responsibility

As noted above, one’s view about who or what can qualify as a deserving subject will be influenced by one’s view of the role of responsibility in establishing desert.  Some have argued that at least some type of responsibility is a necessary condition for all desert (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b), whereas others have argued that, in at least some cases, one can deserve some mode of treatment without anyone being responsible for the desert base that gives rise to that mode of treatment (Feldman 1995, 1996).  An example of responsibility without desert could be cases in which a victim of theft is said to deserve compensation even though he was not responsible for having his money stolen.  In such a case, however, there is still someone, namely the thief, who is responsible for the desert base.  Others might offer desert claims based on suffering that people endure at the hands of beings with dubious levels of responsibility, such as children, mentally handicapped or emotionally disturbed adults, and nonhuman animals.  Some argue that there can be desert in cases in which the suffering is not caused by any being, such as when people suffer as the result of a natural phenomenon.  One who supports this view might argue that a tornado victim can deserve financial support as a result of his suffering through that natural disaster. So, one can argue that while certain cases of desert require responsibility, not all do.  In at least some cases, one can attempt to maintain a connection between desert and responsibility by appealing to a notion of negative responsibility.  That is, one can argue that if someone suffers a misfortune for which she is not responsible, and this misfortune causes her to fall below some baseline condition, then she can deserve some treatment as a result of her suffering (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b).  Alternatively, one could argue that cases like those of the crime and tornado victims are not cases of genuine desert.  One might argue that in situations in which a person suffers through no fault of her own she might be due compensation, and while it is a matter of justice whether she receives compensation, strictly speaking she does not deserve compensation.

ii. Desert and Time

Most desert theorists argue that desert is strictly a backward-looking concept.  According to this standard view, a person’s desert is based strictly on past and present facts about him (Rachels 1997, 176; Feinberg 1970, 72; Miller 1976, 93).  The view that desert must be backward looking has been challenged, however.  According to these alternative, forward-looking accounts, certain legitimate desert claims can be based on future performances (Feldman 1995, Schmidtz 2002).  This forward-looking view has been questioned based in part on a concern that it relies on instances of desert without legitimately grounded desert bases.  The argument is that in order for a person to deserve something at a given time there must be some relevant fact about the person at that time that gives rise to his desert.  The concern is that a desert base with sufficient grounding conditions that lie in the future cannot be such a fact, for it is metaphysically dubious (Celello 2009, 156).

2. Desert and Some Related Concepts

Desert is one of many concepts that are used to assess the appropriateness of what one does or should have.  Prior to discussing the role of desert in justice, it is worthwhile to consider a couple of these other concepts.

a. Merit

There is not a consensus on how to understand the relationship between desert and merit.  Some argue that the terms ‘desert’ and ‘merit’ do not identify separate concepts.  And, in ordinary language, the two are often used interchangeably (McLeod 1999a, 67).  But many scholars have offered important distinctions between the two concepts.  One way to distinguish between the two is to claim that merit should understood more broadly than desert, since merit results from any quality or feature of a subject that serves as a basis for the positive or negative treatment of that subject even if that treatment is not strictly speaking deserved.  On this account, desert is a species of the genus merit (Pojman 1997, 22-23).  Although scholars discuss other distinguishing factors, e.g. effort and intention, a main factor used to distinguish desert from merit is responsibility.  David Miller claims that a distinction between desert and merit is supported by the ways in which the two are discussed in contemporary discourse (1999, 125).  He notes that ‘merit’ is used to refer to a person’s admirable qualities whereas ‘desert’ is used in cases in which someone is responsible for a particular result.  One who supports such a distinction might claim that a person can merit treatment based on factors over which he has little or no control, based on characteristics that he did little to develop, and based on performances that required very little effort.  For example, a man can merit, but not deserve, admiration for his native good looks.  In addition, since merit does not require responsibility, it can apply to a wide variety of things, including nonhuman animals and even inanimate objects.

b. Entitlement

Understood in one way, entitlement claims are specific to particular associations, organizations, or institutions.  Entitlement results from a subject having a claim or right to some treatment as a result of following the rules or meeting some explicit criterion or criteria of an association, organization, or institution.  Although certain entitlements might be related to or give rise to desert (McLeod 1999b, 192), it is important to keep the two concepts distinct.  There are many situations in which one deserves some treatment without being entitled to that treatment or in which one is entitled to something that one does not also deserve.  Consider an automobile race in which the leading driver is caused to wreck by debris on the track.  As a result, he crashes just prior to crossing the finish line.  In such races, crossing the finish line first is the criterion used to establish the winner.  If the crash prevented the driver from winning, one could reasonably argue that, although the driver is not entitled to win, he deserved to win because he had made the requisite effort, performed better than all of the other drivers for the entire race leading up to the crash, and was clearly going to win before he crashed.  In addition to the fact that one can deserve something that one is not entitled to, one can be entitled to something that one does not deserve.  Based on the laws of his country, an evil dictator could be entitled to a subject’s property that the dictator seized on a whim, but this does not mean that the dictator deserves the property.  To use another common example, a son might be entitled to an inheritance left to him by his father, but he might not have done anything to deserve that inheritance.

3. The Role of Desert in Justice

In a general sense, justice can be understood to consist in persons getting what is appropriate or fitting for them.  This idea of justice can be traced back to ancient times.  Plato discussed justice in general, and distributive justice in particular, as involving a type of appropriateness or fittingness of treatment (Republic 1.332bc).  According to some translations of Laws, Plato suggested that justice involves treating people as they deserve to be treated (6.757cd). Although there are many important differences between their theories, Aristotle joined Plato by arguing that justice involves a type of equality.  In Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle maintained that distributive justice involves judging people according to certain criteria in order to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  He argued that, in distributions, it is just for equals to receive equal shares, unjust for equals to receive unequal shares, and unjust for those who are unequal to receive equal shares.  He maintained that what each person receives should be geometrically proportional to the degree or extent to which his or her actions fit or match these criteria (5.3.1131a10-b16).  People are judged based on normative concepts such as desert, merit, and entitlement to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  Consider a distributive context in which two people are to be treated based on what each deserves.  According to the idea of geometrical proportionality, if one person is twice as deserving as the other, then she ought to receive twice the share of what is to be distributed. According to the classical tradition, desert is one of the conceptual components of justice.  But it is not understood as being the only conceptual component of justice.  The Greek word axia, a word used by both Plato and Aristotle in their discussions of the distribution of things such as goods, honors, and services, can be translated as, or understood to include, “desert”.  But, in certain contexts, it might be misleading to translate axia as ‘desert’ instead of translating it as ‘merit’ or some other related concept (Miller 1999, 125-126). Desert has a prominent role in certain more recent conceptions of justice, such as those of John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick.  In Utilitarianism, Mill claimed that it is considered just when a person gets whatever good or evil he deserves and unjust when he receives a good or suffers an evil that he does not deserve (2001, 45).  Sidgwick argued that justice involved one’s desert being requited (1907, 280 ff).  According to some contemporary theories of justice, often referred to as “pluralist” theories, desert is one among other important conceptual components of justice.  These other components can include, but need not be limited to, entitlement, equality, merit, need, reciprocity, and moral worth.  According to these theories, whether and to what extent desert is relevant to justice depends on the context in which the judgment is being made.  And, when desert conflicts with the other components of justice, it must be measured against them in order to determine what justice requires (Miller 1999, 133; Schmidtz 2006, 4).

a. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice

Some scholars argue that desert’s role in distributive justice and retributive justice is symmetrical, i.e., that desert is more or less equally relevant in both (Sher 1987; Pojman 2006, 126).  There is disagreement in the literature as to whether desert’s role ought to be understood in this way (Moriarty 2003; Smilansky 2006).  Those who argue in favor of an asymmetry in desert’s role may attempt to explain the asymmetry in different ways.  Some might argue that desert is relevant in retributive justice but not in distributive justice because being the appropriate recipient of a harm requires a level of responsibility that being the appropriate recipient of a benefit does not.  Or, some might argue in favor of the asymmetry based on the differing modes of treatment that are called for in distributive and retributive contexts.  The motivating idea used to support this view is that desert is an appropriate and important basis for punishment, but other concepts, e.g. equality and need, are the appropriate bases for distributions of goods and services.  Even if one recognizes desert as an important conceptual component of both distributive and retributive justice, one might argue that desert differs in these different spheres.  For example, one might argue that desert in distributive justice can be forward looking, while desert in retributive justice cannot (Feldman 1995, 74-76; Schmidtz 2002, 783-784).

b. Desert, Institutions, and Justice

In many cases, what one is said to deserve is connected to a certain convention or practice within an association, organization, or larger social institution.  One cannot deserve first place in an automobile race if there are not any such competitions, nor can an employee at a steel mill deserve a raise absent the existence of the steel mill and the economic system of which the steel mill is some very small part.  In the light of such examples, some scholars claim that, if it is a defensible concept at all, desert cannot exist in the absence of such institutional conventions or practices (Cummiskey 1987).  This idea leads some scholars to offer what they view as an important distinction between pre-institutional desert (p-desert) and institutional desert (i-desert). Those who recognize p-desert argue that although specific desert bases or deserved modes of treatment are often defined within a particular associational, organizational, or institutional context, desert is a concept that is logically prior to and independent of both tacit and explicit institutional criteria and rules.  They argue that the conflation of p-desert with i-desert is based on a failure to recognize the distinction between desert as a general normative concept and a particular type of desert that is influenced by institutions.  According to this view, the distinction between p-desert and i-desert is based on an important difference between one deserving something regardless of whether one is a part of an institution and deserving a specific thing based mostly or wholly on institutional criteria or rules.  The reason why someone deserves a specific trophy made of a specific material for his effort and performance toward winning a particular automobile race is because there is an institution that holds and regulates such an event.  But the underlying reason why the person deserves something for winning the automobile race is that, pre-institutionally, effort and performance give rise to desert. Some argue that rejecting p-desert is problematic since, without it, there is no independent normative concept of desert.  That is, there is no concept of desert that is external to any given institution which can be used to evaluate the justice of institutions.  Another difficulty with the rejection of p-desert is that it would disallow the seemingly reasonable claim that a person can deserve something even if she is not a part of any identifiable institution.  One could argue that a person could deserve something in a state of nature or that she could deserve something even if she were the last person on Earth.  If she were to work hard to build a shelter and grow crops, for example, one could argue that she thereby deserves the benefits that resulted from those activities. Some who argue that John Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness allows for desert in distributive contexts interpret his theory as advancing a purely institutional conception of desert.  Samuel Scheffler (2000) argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial desert and not pre-institutional desert, however.  According to Scheffler, Rawls rejects prejusticial desert because Rawls thinks that desert can exist only after the principles of justice have been established.  Scheffler interprets Rawls as arguing that a person deserves whatever it is that justice dictates he should receive and only what justice dictates he should receive.  On this view, desert is not prejusticial since desert is defined in terms of justice as opposed to justice being defined, at least in part, in terms of desert.  But justice is understood as being pre-institutional since justice is a normative concept, external to any particular institution, which can be used to judge institutions.  The rejection of prejusticial desert will be viewed as problematic by those who, following more traditional conceptions of justice, define justice, at least in part, in terms of desert.  The concern is that defining desert in terms of justice, instead of defining justice in terms of desert, results in a backward understanding of the relationship between the two concepts.

4. Meritocracy

In general, a meritocracy is a social system in which advancement, reward, and status are based on individual abilities and talents.  In theory, those who are more able and talented would advance further, reap greater rewards, and achieve loftier status.  Meritocracy can involve attempting to erect a basic structure of society according to the ideas of a meritocracy or it can involve attempting to implement a system in which a society’s basic institutions are governed, at least in part, by principles of awarding jobs and specifying rewards for jobs on the basis of merit.  Although the two issues are sometimes conflated, Norman Daniels notes that whether someone merits a job is separate from what rewards are attached to that job.  So, while a person might merit a particular job of great importance, one should not assume that he merits higher wages or greater rewards than another person who merits a job of much less importance (Daniels, 218-219). As discussed above, there is some scholarly disagreement about the relationship between merit and desert.  For those who offer clear distinctions between the two, a social system in which advancement, reward, and status were based on desert would be different from one in which such benefits were based on merit.  A system of merit would be based on persons’ abilities and talents, whereas a system based on desert would focus on persons’ efforts and performances for which they are responsible.  As a result, although the creation of either would be difficult, the creation of a system based on desert, a “desertocracy” if you will, seems to be more problematic than one based on merit.  This is because a desertocracy would seem to require more, and more specific, information about persons than would a meritocracy.

5. Some Arguments against Desert

While many consider desert to be an important conceptual component of justice, others have argued against this view.  Some argue that the concept of desert itself is problematic.  This is known as the metaphysical argument against desert.  Others claim that, even if desert is a defensible concept, determining what people deserve or treating people according to what they deserve is not feasible.  These ideas are defended in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert.  Some maintain that, regardless of the force of the metaphysical, epistemological, or pragmatic arguments, desert does not have a prominent role in distributive justice.  Examples of this view can be found in right- and left-libertarian theories of justice.

a. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument

Among the contemporary theories of justice in which desert does not have a prominent role, John Rawls’s is the most often discussed.  Drawing from Herbert Spiegelberg’s (1944, 113) idea that the inequalities of birth are types of underserved discrimination, Rawls (1971, 104) claims that desert does not apply to one’s place in the distribution of native endowments, one’s initial starting place in society, i.e. the familial and social circumstances into which one is born, or to the superior character that enables one to put forth the effort to develop one’s abilities.  As is often the case with Rawls’s work, as evidenced by the discussion of pre-institutional and prejusticial desert above, there are many competing interpretations of his views on the relationship between desert and justice.  Yet, regardless of which of these interpretations is correct, Rawls work suggests a metaphysical argument against desert. According to this metaphysical argument, since most of who we are and what we do is greatly influenced by undeserved native endowments and by the undeserved circumstances into which we are born, one cannot deserve anything, or, at best, one can deserve very little.  According to a common interpretation, Rawls believes that desert should not have any role in distributive justice, since these undeserved factors have a major influence on all would-be desert bases (Sher 1987, 22 ff).  Others contend that Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert (Moriarty 2002, 136-137).  Regardless of whether Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert, if sound, the metaphysical argument against desert would either substantially or completely undermine the concept.

b. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments

David Hume was an early critic of those theories of distributive justice in which merit was assigned a prominent role.  Although, as discussed above, there are differences between the concepts of desert and merit, and although Hume’s use of  the term ‘merit’ differs from more modern uses, the kinds of arguments that Hume offered against merit are often used against desert in contemporary discussions.  Hume argued that since humans are both fallible in their knowledge of the factors that would establish others’ merit and prone to overestimating their own merit, distributive schemes based on merit could not result in determinate rules of conduct and would be utterly destructive to society (Hume, 27).  This thinking is captured in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert. According to the epistemological argument, since we cannot know the specific details of the lives of every member in a community or society, we cannot accurately treat people according to their desert.  Recall that effort and performance are commonly cited as appropriate desert bases.  Even if one agrees that only effort and performance should be used to determine one’s desert, concerns about how such determinations could be made with any accuracy or consistency still remain.  How could one know how much of a person’s performance was the result of effort as opposed to natural talent, brute luck, or any other number of complicating factors?  The pragmatic argument against desert is that, regardless of whether we could gain the knowledge needed to treat people according to their desert accurately, attempting to do so would have overriding negative consequences.  Such negative consequences could include expending large amounts of time and resources in an effort to make accurate desert judgments and, perhaps, losses of personal privacy as one delves into the details of others’ lives. Both the epistemological and pragmatic arguments must be accounted for when attempting to explain how a true meritocracy could and should be arranged.  Those who do not advocate meritocracies on a large scale might overcome the difficulties suggested by the epistemological and pragmatic arguments by maintaining that the use of desert should be limited to smaller, local contexts.  According to this view, since it is easier to determine a person’s desert in contexts that are limited in size and scope, accurate desert judgments would be both possible and feasible in such contexts.

c. Libertarian Arguments

According to Libertarianism, each individual agent fully owns himself.  As a full self-owner, the agent is entitled to use his various abilities to acquire property rights in the world.  For the libertarian, the primary goal of justice is the protection of negative liberty.  Based on a principle of non-interference, negative liberty is understood as the absence of constraints on an individual’s actions. Some mark a distinction between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism.  Perhaps the most well-known explication of right-libertarianism, which is often understood as the traditional version of libertarianism, is given by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State, and Utopia.  Nozick advances an entitlement theory of justice.  On this view, a just distribution is one in which each person is entitled to the holdings that she possesses according to the principles of justice in acquisition, transfer, and rectification. Nozick describes his entitlement theory as “historical,” because it determines the justice of holdings on the basis of how those holdings came to be held, and “unpatterned,” because the justice of holdings is not determined on the basis of some additional normative criteria, such as merit, need, or effort (1974, 155 ff).  Because meritocracies are patterned, Nozick would reject them.  Right-libertarians would be concerned with liberty-restricting attempts at distributing or redistributing resources according to prevailing conceptions of merit or desert.  Therefore, the concept of desert does not have a major role in their theories of justice.   Libertarians need not reject the concept of desert entirely, however.  And Nozick offers various arguments against Rawls’s rejection of desert (1974, 215 ff).  For the right-libertarian, desert could be a concept for the individual to consider in his personal decision-making processes, but not one that the state should use to try to guide allocations or distributions of resources. As with right-libertarianism, left-libertarianism is based on the idea that each individual agent fully owns himself.  But the left-libertarian view about the appropriation of natural resources differs greatly from the right-libertarian view.  Left-libertarians believe in the egalitarian ownership of natural resources.  Anyone who appropriates a natural resource would have to pay others for the value of that resource.  Such a payment might then be placed into a social fund, from which distributions to other members of a society are made.  The resources are divided according to egalitarian principles and not on the basis of merit or desert.  The rejection of desert as a basis of distribution could be based on the metaphysical argument that, strictly speaking, people do not deserve anything.  Or, a left-libertarian could recognize desert as a distributive concept, but one that is less important than equality.  According to such a view, equality, and not desert, should be the primary basis of distribution within a society.

6. Concluding Remarks

Despite its use in daily life, desert is a concept that remains somewhat nebulous.   Regardless of certain areas of disagreement, those who recognize desert as an important normative concept generally agree on a number of issues regarding the nature of desert.  One point of general agreement is that desert consists of, at least, three main parts – a subject, a mode of treatment, and a desert base.  In addition, scholars generally argue in favor of the view that desert is applicable to human beings, or at least some subset of them.  Lastly, scholars generally agree that understanding the nature of desert is important to understanding the nature of justice.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. 2nd Ed.  Translated, with an Introduction, by Terence Irwin.  Indianapolis: Hackett, 1999.
    • An accessible translation that also includes detailed notes and a glossary.
  • Boylan, Michael.  A Just Society.  Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield, 2004.
    • Presents a worldview theory of ethics and social philosophy.
  • Celello, Peter. “Against Desert as a Forward-Looking Concept.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 26, no.2  (May 2009): 144-159.
    • Argues that desert should be understood as a strictly backward-looking concept.
  • Cummiskey, David. “Desert and Entitlement: A Rawlsian Consequentialist Account.” Analysis, 47, no. 1 (Jan., 1987): 15-19.
    • Advances an institution-dependent account of desert.
  • Daniels, Norman.  “Merit and Meritocracy.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7, no. 3 (1978): 206-233.
    • A discussion of meritocracy, and the meriting of both jobs and the rewards attached to those jobs.
  • Feinberg, Joel. Doing and Deserving: Essay in the Theory of Responsibility. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1970.
    • A collection of previously published essays, and previously unpublished lectures, focused on issues surrounding the harm and benefit of others.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom.” Mind, New Series 104, no. 413 (January 1995): 63-77.
    • Argues against the ideas that desert must be backward-looking and that desert requires responsibility.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Responsibility as a Condition for Desert.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996): 165-68.
    • A reply to Smilansky’s “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction,” in which Feldman argues that Smilansky’s solution to maintaining a connection between desert and responsibility fails.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Edited by J. B. Schneewind. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1983.
    • A presentation of Hume’s moral philosophy in which he develops ideas from Book III of A Treatise of Human Nature.
  • Kekes, John. Against Liberalism. Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press, 1997.
    • A sustained criticism of political liberalism, which includes a defense of the view that justice should be understood to combine desert and consistency.
  • Kristjánsson, Kristján. “Justice, Desert, and Virtue Revisited.” Social Theory and Practice 29, no. 1 (January 2003): 39-63.
    • Argues that the sole basis for desert is moral virtue.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Contemporary Interpretations of Desert: Introduction.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999a): 61-69.
    • A brief essay about desert, its bases, and its relation to other concepts.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Desert and Institutions.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999b): 186-95.
    • Argues that some desert is institutional and some is preinstitutional.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. 2nd ed. Edited by George Sher. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2001.
    • Mill’s highly influential explication of the normative ethical theory of utilitarianism.
  • Miller, David. Principles of Social Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1999.
    • A theory of social justice that includes detailed treatments of the concept of desert and its role in justice.
  • Miller, David. Social Justice. Oxford: OxfordUniversity Press, 1976.
    • A work on social justice, including a chapter devoted to desert.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Against the Asymmetry of Desert.” Nous 37, no. 3 (2003): 518–536.
    • Argues against the view that desert can have an important role in retributive justice, while not having an important role in distributive justice.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Desert and Distributive Justice in A Theory of Justice.” Journal of Social Philosophy 33, no. 1 (Spring 2002): 131-43.
    • Argues that John Rawls recognizes pre-institutional desert and that Rawls’s failure to consider such desert in his theory of justice seems unjust.
  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
    • An influential defense of libertarian principles.
  • Plato. Laws. Translated by Trevor J. Saunders. In Plato: Complete Works, edited by John Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • Plato. Republic. Translated by G. M. A. Grube.  Revised by C. D. C. Reeve. In Plato: Complete Works.
    • The Complete Works contains recent translations of all of Plato’s works, dubia, and spuria.
  • Pojman, Louis. “Equality and Desert.” Philosophy, 72, no. 282 (Oct. 1997): 549-570.
    • Argues that the underlying justification of punishment and reward is desert or merit.
  • Pojman, Louis. Justice. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2006.
    • An accessible introduction to different theories of justice, which includes a chapter on justice as desert.
  • Pojman, Louis, and Owen McLeod, eds. What Do We Deserve?: A Reader on Justice and Desert. New York: OxfordUniversity Press, 1999.
    • Contains selections from many influential works on desert and its role in justice.
  • Rachels, James. “What People Deserve.” In Can Ethics Provide Answers?: And Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, 175-97. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997.
    • A chapter on desert, which includes a discussion of the relationship between desert and responsibility and a    discussion of desert’s temporal orientation.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1971.
    • Rawls’s seminal work in which he advances a theory of justice as fairness.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. “Justice and Desert in Liberal Theory.” California Law Review 88 (May 2000): 965-90.
    • Discusses Rawls’s view on the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice, and argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial, but not pre-institutional desert.
  • Schmidtz, David. Elements of Justice. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2006.
    • Argues for a pluralist theory of justice based on principles of equality, desert, need, and reciprocity.
  • Schmidtz, David. “How to Deserve.” Political Theory 30, no. 6 (December 2002): 774-99.
    • Includes a “promissory account” of desert, which has forward-looking aspects.
  • Sher, George. Desert. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1987.
    • A detailed examination of desert and its role in justice.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. 7th ed. London: Macmillan, 1907.
    • His seminal work in which he discusses egoism, intuitional morality, and utilitarianism.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 419 (July 1996a): 485-86.
    • A reply to Feldman’s “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom,” in which Smilansky argues that there is a connection between desert and responsibility.
  • Smilansky, Saul.  “Control, Desert, and the Difference between Distributive and Retributive Justice.  Philosophical Studies, 131(3) (2006): 511–524.
    • Provides a defense of the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “Responsibility and Desert: Defending the Connection.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996b): 157-63.
    • A reply to Feldman in which Smilansky argues for a distinction between positive and negative responsibility conditions for desert.
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “A Defense of Human Equality.” Philosophical Review 53, no. 2 (1944): 101-24.
    • Defends an ethical principle of human equality, and a view of justice based on that principle.


Author Information

Peter Celello
Ohio State University Newark
U. S. A.