A major poet during the reign of Louis XIV in France, Madame Deshoulières used her writings to defend philosophical naturalism. Like her intellectual model Lucretius, she employed verse to argue that natural causes can adequately explain such apparently spiritual phenomena as thought, volition, and love. In metaphysics, Deshoulières argues that the real is comprised of variations of matter and that material causation adequately explains observed changes in the real. In anthropology, she claims that the difference between animal and human is one of degree, not of kind. Material organs, and not the occult powers of a spiritual soul, produce such human phenomena as thought and choice. In ethics, she insists that such instincts as self-preservation govern the virtuous activity customarily ascribed to an elusive free will. In particular, she emphasizes that the human phenomenon of love, endlessly debated in the salons she frequented, owes far more to instinctual attraction and repulsion than rationalist philosophers would admit. A friend and disciple of Pierre Gassendi, she constructed a distinctive chapter in Renaissance naturalism and in its struggle against the philosophical alternatives of Aristotelianism and Cartesianism.
Antoinette du Ligier de la Garde was born into an aristocratic Parisian family on January 1, 1638. Her father Melchior du Ligier, sieur de la Garde, occupied a prominent position in court circles as a chevalier de l’ordre du roi. He served as maître d’hôtel for Queen Anne of Austria, the wife of Louis XIII, and performed important services for the queen mother Marie de Médicis, the regent of France.
Even by the standards of the court aristocracy, Mademoiselle du Liger de la Garde’s early education was unusually sophisticated. She learned Latin, a rare achievement for a woman of the period, as well as learning Spanish and Italian. She studied the fashionable novels of La Calpranède, Urfé, and Scudéry, though she would later dismiss the novel as an inferior species of literature. Through her tutor Jean Hesnault, Du Ligier de la Garde became a partisan of philosophical naturalism. A disciple of Pierre Gassendi, Hesnault argued that all human action, like all movement in the cosmos, could be explained by physical causes. The tutor allied his metaphysical naturalism to religious skepticism (which is opposed to the thesis of the immortality of the soul), and also to ethical libertinism, which celebrated the rational pursuit of pleasure as the supreme moral good. Hesnault deepened this apprenticeship of naturalism by guiding Du Ligier de la Garde’s reading of the major texts of Gassendi and of the classical Latin philosopher Lucretius.
In 1651 Du Ligier de la Garde married Guillaume de la Fon-de-Boisguérin, seigneur Deshoulières. By all accounts, the marriage was an aristocratic alliance of convenience that permitted the spouses to pursue separate lives. A military officer attached to the Prince de Condé, Seigneur Deshoulières was embroiled in the Fronde (1648-1653), the intermittent civil war that pitted the French throne against dissident aristocrats, led by Condé. During the beginning of her husband’s war-related exile in the Lowlands, Madame Deshoulières studied philosophical works at her parent’s home in Paris. Her renewed study of Gassendi confirmed her allegiance to the philosophical naturalism she had imbibed from Hesnault.
In 1656, Madame Deshoulières joined her husband in exile in Belgium. Due to her persistent efforts to obtain the back pay owed her husband, she was imprisoned at the chateau of Wilworden in 1657. After a daring rescue by her husband, the couple fled to France, where they received a personal pardon from Louis XIV. Their reintegration into French society was quickly followed by the collapse of their marriage. In 1658, Seigneur Deshoulières successfully sued for a permanent separation of goods and persons. Declaring bankruptcy, he consigned his few remaining assets to his creditors. An impoverished Madame Deshoulières faced a grim social future in the anomalous position of a woman who was neither single, divorced, nor truly united to her legal husband.
Despite her penury, Deshoulières began her literary ascent in 1658 when she began to conduct a salon in her modest apartment on the Rue de l’Homme armé in Paris. The salon quickly attracted a coterie of authors noted for their libertinism: Benserade, Des Barreaux, Ménage, Quinault, Pellisson, and La Monnoye. In 1662, she published her first poem: a portrait of the skeptic Linières. An influential arbiter of literary disputes, she defended the modernist party in the querelle des anciens et modernes over the comparative merits of classical and contemporary French literature. A partisan of Corneille, she led an ill-fated campaign against the drama of Racine.
In 1672 Deshoulières published her first nature idyll in Le Mercure galant. Acclaimed as a poet of the first rank, Deshoulières published a flood of poetry during the next two decades. Her works explored the theme of nature and man’s immersion in it. Many of her more philosophical poems demonstrated how physical instinct is the cause of the intellectual and volitional activity philosophers wrongly attribute to a spiritual soul. Her poetry dealing with flora and fauna denied a substantial difference between human beings and other species of the organic world. In recognition of her literary achievement and philosophical prowess, the Academy of the Ricovrati of Padua (1684) and the Academy of Arles (1689) elected her to membership. Despite being banned from membership due to her gender, Deshoulières received recognition from the Académie française. During the inauguration of Fontenelle as a member in 1691, Académie officials recited poetry of Deshoulières as part of the official proceedings. Louis XIV granted her an annual pension of 2,000 pounds in 1688, consecrating her status as one of the nation’s leading authors.
In 1682, as Deshoulières showed the first symptoms of breast cancer, her poetry become more austere. Her older pastoral poetry yielded to a more abstract analysis of the characteristic virtues and vices of human nature. Toward the end of the decade, Deshoulières reverted to the Catholic faith of her youth. Her final poems, paraphrases of psalms in the Latin Vulgate, renounced the skeptical views of her earlier years and refuted a materialist explanation of human spiritual activity.
Madame Deshoulières died from cancer on February 17, 1694.
First published in 1687, the collected poetical works of Madame Deshoulières demonstrated her literary dexterity. Deshoulières wrote in multiple literary genres: ode, idyll, ballad, madrigal, rondeau, portrait, maxim, biblical paraphrase, comedy, tragedy, and opera libretto. Immensely popular throughout the eighteenth century, her poetry underwent twenty distinct editions until the final edition of her complete works in 1810. The odes, pastorals, and satires no longer charmed a literary public avid for the more bombastic fare of Romanticism.
Anthologies of French poetry routinely include several of Deshoulière’s poems as exceptional specimens of neoclassical nature idylls. Many literary critics have noted the philosophical skepticism that permeates Deshoulières’s poetical exploration of nature. Antoine Adam’s argument is typical: “She [Deshoulières] had the reputation of being foreign to all religious belief and her poetry seems in fact to carry the reflection of this incredulity.”
The philosophical reception of Deshoulières has been less consistent. In the decades following her death, Deshoulières was acclaimed as a bold philosophical thinker who prepared the path to the religious skepticism of the Enlightenment. In his influential Dictionnaire historique et critique (1696; 1702) Pierre Bayle discusses the skepticism of Deshoulières concerning human immortality: “It is certain that anyone who spoke this way literally would be denying the immortality of the soul. But to save the honor of Madame Deshoulières, let’s just say that she was following certain poetical conventions we are not supposed to take too seriously—not that one can’t hide a good deal of libertinage under the privilege of versifying.” Veiled in his characteristic irony, Bayle’s judgment clearly pegs Deshoulières as a libertine skeptic. In their respective correspondences, both Voltaire and Rousseau praise the work of Deshoulières.
Subsequent history of philosophy has largely ignored Deshoulières. Just as her antiquated genres of expression closed her work to literary audiences after the French Revolution, her non-treatise style of argument masked the philosophical nature of her work. Only in the recent feminist expansion of the philosophical canon has the properly philosophical nature of Deshoulières’s work imposed itself anew.
In the poetry written until her reconversion to Catholicism, Deshoulières defends a comprehensive philosophical naturalism. Her metaphysics conceives the world as an interactive network of atomically structured bodies. All phenomena, including the human phenomena traditionally interpreted as spiritual, could be explained in terms of material causation. Her theory of human nature denies a substantial difference between human beings and nonrational animals. The alleged human differences, such as the power of intellection and volition, for her suggest the comparative inferiority of human nature. Her ethical theory claims that alleged moral virtues are in fact the outcroppings of physical instincts. Deshoulières’s naturalism is normative as well as descriptive. The complete immersion of the real (which includes the human person) in nature demands a respectful treatment of the natural environment.
The clearest expression of Deshoulières’s naturalistic metaphysics is found in her early work, “Imitation of Lucretius.” Faithfully following De Rerum Natura by the Roman poet and philosopher Lucretius, Deshoulières depicts the universe as founded on a simple, original principle of matter. “The order of an extrinsic cause/ Makes, by invisible moves,/ Enter into the form of various bodies/ All the sympathy described by academics.” This material principle of the cosmos requires a divine being, or an uncaused cause, to bring it into existence. Once matter exists, however, its internal principles and activities account for the subsequent evolution of the universe. This matter already has present within it the attraction and repulsion (“the sympathy”) that will create, destroy, and alter the various bodies that will proceed from this material matrix.
This vitalist material cosmos is an atomic one. “Imitation of Lucretius” explains how the atomic structure of the universe and of the discrete bodies that emerge from this universe causes change through the charged interaction of the atoms. “These atoms conjoined with the light,/ By their extreme fluidity,/ Are always in communion/ With the governing essence.” Just as the entire universe experiences flux through the dynamic interaction of its material parts which undergo the rhythm of attraction and repulsion, each distinct body represents a microcosm where change occurs through alteration of internal atomic structure due to incessant encounters with external bodies.
In Deshoulières’s metaphysics, the human person is not exempt from this network of material causation and atomic change. Like other bodies in the cosmos, human beings emerge from and are governed by the same principle of matter. “In a cyclone of subtle matter/ Placing them everywhere in inequality,/ The entire human race is the blessed offspring./ Its multiplicity rises to infinity.” Deshoulières insists that the allegedly spiritual powers, and not only the physical traits, of the human person can be explained by this material causation. The activity of thought is caused by the functioning of the physical organ of the brain, not by the impulses of an elusive spiritual power called reason. “The more one examines, the more one digs/ Into the confusion of what is true,/ Where particular individuals move in every way,/ It is evident that our organs, rather than our reason, figure things out.” Careful examination of human intellectual activity reveals its dependence on and origination in the physical organs of the body, preeminently in the brain. “Imitation of Lucretius” repeatedly appeals to the “envelope of matter” as the sole principle which explains the actions and changes of the embodied beings (including human beings) which populate the cosmos.
The naturalist metaphysics of “Imitation of Lucretius” indicates Dechoulières’s adherence to the atomic vitalism of Lucretius and Democritus. It also indicates a more radical cast of naturalism in comparison with that of her mentor Gassendi. Whereas Gassendi affirmed the existence of an immortal human soul specially created by God in light of the Beatific Vision, Deshoulières only briefly affirms the existence of a god necessary for the initial creation of matter. Once matter exists, its internal principles and activities are the unique cause for the existence and constitution of all subsequent beings, including human beings in their entirety. For Deshoulières, the real is coterminous with material nature, even if this nature has a decidedly lyrical character due to its fundamental dynamic of attraction and repulsion.
In her poetry, Deshoulières explores the relationship of human nature to the enveloping material nature of the cosmos. As she compares human beings to other animals, she insists that the allegedly spiritual activities of human beings can be explained by physical causation. Rather than being superior to other animals, human beings are actually inferior, inasmuch as they claim to possess a reason and freedom that are in fact illusory. The mute obedience of other animals to natural instinct compares favorably with the human propensity to self-destruction in trying to create a future that vainly attempts to alter the laws of nature. Traditional claims concerning human reason, free will, and immortality are subjected to critical scrutiny.
The nature idyll “The Sheep” (1674) criticizes the faculty of reason, which philosophers often exalt as the sign of human spirituality. In actual exercise, reason appears to be subordinate to the senses and the instincts possessed by all members of the animal kingdom. This distinctively human power appears impotent when challenged by the arational forces of passion. “This proud reason about which they make so much noise/ Is not a sure remedy against the passions./ A bit of wine disturbs it; a child charms it./ Ripping apart a heart that calls it for help/ Is the only effect it produces./ Always important and severe,/ It opposes everything but resolves nothing.” Deshoulières allies her critique of the claims of human reason to epistemological skepticism. For all its vaunted power, reason habitually leads to uncertain conclusions. Emotions govern the vacillating activity of reason far more powerfully than philosophical defenders of the light of reason would admit.
Like reason, free will is constructed on an illusion concerning the difference between human and animal natures. For Deshoulières, perfect freedom is found in following natural instinct rather than eluding it in fantasies of alternatives to natural causation. The nature idyll “The Birds” (1678) explains how authentic freedom is found in fidelity to natural instinct. “Little birds that charm me!/ You want to love? You love./ You dislike some place?/ You go to another./ You are known neither for virtue nor for faults…There is no freedom except among animals.” Authentic freedom consists in the capacity to follow one’s natural impulse. The praise of the birds’ freedom to love at will suggests the libertinism of Deshoulières’s intellectual milieu.
Later in the poem, Deshoulières explains that the only true obstacles to freedom are physical ones, such as the fowler’s net. Human freedom, the chimera of free will that produces “virtues and faults,” is illusory. Human agents claim to exercise free will to create a future that could have been otherwise. In actual fact, natural causation dictates future outcomes that cannot be altered by human wish. Deshoulières’s critique of free will as a human illusion rests on a deterministic theory of action that interprets human acts, as well as animal movements, as the product of physical causes.
In the same poem, Deshoulières extends a similar critique to the human phenomenon of love. Rather than being specific to human beings and rooted in the human possession of a will, love exists among all animals in their various expressions of attraction and repulsion. For her, the entire physical universe is built upon this amatory structure. “If Love were not mixed into this change [of the landscape from winter into spring],/ We would see all things perish. Love is the soul of the universe. As it triumphs over the winters,/ Which desolate our fields by a rude war,/ It banishes the chill from an indifferent heart.” Rather than being limited to the realm of the human psyche, love governs the entire movement of atoms as they effect change in the cosmos. The affectivity of the human heart is not superior to the physical forces that surround it. Like the seasonal changes of the cosmos, alterations in human temperament are directed by the play of external natural powers.
The illusory exaltation of the intellect and the will is rooted in a false conception of the human soul. “Ode to La Rochefoucauld” (1678) contests the theory of a human soul that would exist independently of the body. Deshoulières insists that everyday experience clearly demonstrates the interpenetration between body and soul. “Although the soul is divine,/ Invisible connections unite it to the body./ Does the soul have some bitterness?/ The body beats itself and consumes itself/ And shares its anguish./ Is the body a captive of pain?/ The soul no longer feels joy./ It itself weakens as the body does.” The strict parallel between the mental state and physical state in the human person indicates the identity between soul and body. The thesis of a spiritual soul existing independently of the body is rejected as an illusion, and is contradicted by the empirical evidence of the soul’s reciprocal dependence on the body.
In many passages, Deshoulières draws the explicit conclusion that the human individual cannot be immortal from her denial of a transcendent human soul. She argues that the psyche of the human person is governed more strictly by the laws of material nature than most philosophers of the period would concede. “The Flowers” (1677) compares the inevitable death of the human person to the extinction of flowers after a brief existence. In both cases, the death undergone is total. “Sad reflections! Useless wishes [of immortality]!/ When once we cease to be,/ Lovely flowers, it is forever. One fearful instant destroys us without exception.” While human beings might experience a metaphorical survival after death as “a faint memory of our names conserved by our society,” this mnemonic after-life is clearly not the survival of the personal soul. In Deshoulières’s demythologized account of human nature, the denial of personal immortality is the most radical of her efforts to demonstrate the complete circumscription of human nature within material nature.
In criticizing the human pretension to superiority over nature through its alleged possession of reason and free will, Deshoulières devotes particular attention to the human claims of moral virtue. In her later works, she operates an umasking of virtue as the simple operation of natural instinct. What is often claimed to be a moral attribute developed by free will is revealed to be the natural reaction of an embodied subject to particular stimuli in his or her material environs. Her epigrammatic “Diverse Reflections” (1686) typifies this demythologization of virtue. She critically analyzes three moral virtues in particular: wisdom, prudence, and courage.
Philosophers often claim that wisdom is acquired by human beings as they age. This virtue is alleged to be the fruit of careful reflection on alternative courses of action. Unlike the rashness of youth, this cautious thoughtfulness frees the elderly to abandon certain dangerous habits that compromise their health. According to Deshoulières, however, this enlightenment is more instinctual than intellectual. “We believe we’ve become wise/ When, after having seen the autumnal fall of leaves more than fifty times,/ We abandon the dangerous use of certain pleasures./ We delude ourselves./ Such changes are not the work of free choice./ It is only the pride cloaking humanity/ Which, using every pretext/ Gives to the cause of virtue/ What we owe to the cause of aging.” As the human body ages, with the concomitant risk of illness and accident and the growing risk of death, the human agent instinctively moderates the use of dangerous drink or food or sport. This instinctual moderation owes far more to biology than to any deliberate choice. The alleged virtue of the elderly derives more from the natural reaction of the body to the threat of destruction, than to some mysterious internal act of election.
Similarly, the capstone moral virtue of prudence is little more than the instinctual exercise of common sense in the face of imminent peril. The alleged virtue might permit the moral agent to foresee danger but in and of itself it can not remove that danger. The common estimate of prudence gravely exaggerates the power of human reason and will to create the future. “The incense we give to prudence/ Leads my mood to despair./ What is its purpose? To see in advance/ The evils we must endure./ Is it such a benefit to predict them?/ If this cruel virtue had some certain rule/ That could remove them from us,/ I’d find the worries it gives bearable enough,/ But nothing is so misleading as human prudence./ Alas! Almost always the detour it takes/ In order to help us avoid a looming misfortune/ Is the path that takes us right to it.” Like the praise of other alleged virtues, the esteem for prudence overestimates the scope of human agency. While the human agent can detect dangers in its immediate environment, it can do little to alter that environment since it is bound by the laws of material nature, and so its future course is largely determined by the causative activity of that nature.
The cardinal moral virtue of courage is similarly dismissed as the product of sensible self-protection rather than of heroic freedom. Deshoulières attacks the courage of classical pagan warriors often lauded in the pedagogical literature of the period. The politically motivated suicides of disgraced civic leaders in the classical era are a predictable response to an unbearable physical and emotional environment. “We scarcely recognize ourselves in discussions of courage/ When we elevate to the rank of the generous/ Those Greeks and Romans whose suicidal deaths / Have made the name of courage so famous./ What have they done that is so great? They left life/ When, after crushing disgrace, Life had nothing pleasant left for them./ By one single death they spared themselves a thousand.” The suicide of a disgraced politician awaiting imminent arrest and probable execution reflects rational self-interest rooted in the instinct for sparing oneself greater pain than immediate death. There is nothing particularly surprising nor meritorious in executing such an act. In the circumstances, it could not have been otherwise.
In her demythologization of virtue, Deshoulières manifests the comprehensive scope of her naturalist conception of human nature. Virtue and vice, allegedly the manifestations of free will, are simply the instinctual reactions of the moral agent to the stimuli of pain and pleasure in his or her environment. Prudence, courage, temperance, and justice permit one to negotiate the perils in one’s surroundings in the interest of self-preservation. The repertory of virtue is not different in kind from the various defensive responses to threatening stimuli evinced by the other members of the animal kingdom as they confront the challenges of the material cosmos.
Deshoulières’s philosophical naturalism includes a deontology (or ethics of duty) as well as a metaphysics. It is not anachronistic to claim that Deshoulières defends an environmentalist ethics. The total dependence of humanity upon nature requires the human agent to treat the material environment with respect. A properly naturalistic concept of human nature emphasizes the duty to reverence the cosmos that is humanity’s sole origin and end. Conversely, a rationalistic exaltation of humanity as set over and above material nature by dint of its allegedly superior reason justifies the subordination and destruction of nature.
In Deshoulières’s primitivist account of history, humanity reverenced nature in the first stages of its development. Ancient gathering societies respected the material world they gently used for their rustic lifestyle. “Ode to La Rochefoucauld” evokes this environmentalist golden age. “In that happy country when without prejudice/ Morals were permitted to run freely,/ Humanity was not avid/ For riches and honors./ It lived on wild fruit,/ Slept under open-air blankets,/ Drank in a clear stream./ Without goods, without rank, without envy/ It entered the tomb/ As it entered life.” This primitive humanity in tranquil communion with nature possesses its own politics. It is an egalitarian as well as frugal society. Its spontaneous moral life free of the constraints of social prejudice contains Deshoulières’s habitual libertine accents.
In modern society, technology has turned humanity into nature’s enemy. The human enterprise of land clearage, farming, dams, mines, and canals has disfigured material nature. “The Stream” (1684) argues that human exaltation of its allegedly superior reason has justified this domination and destruction of nature. “It is humanity itself that tells us that by a just choice/ Heaven placed, when it formed human beings,/ the other beings under its laws./ Let us not flatter ourselves./ We are their tyrants rather than their kings./ Why do we torture you [the streams]?/ Why do we shut you up in a hundred canals?/ And why do we reverse the order of nature/ By forcing you to spring up into the air?” The error of rationalism in refusing to see humanity as a part of nature is not a purely theoretical one; by exalting humanity as a rational being superior to the rest of nature, it has justified the human destruction of the environment as a species of moral good. This critique of environmental destruction also reflects Deshoulières’s religious skepticism. Clearly alluding to the Book of Genesis’s account of the divine grant of dominion over nature to humanity, the ode argues that it was human pride rather than divine inspiration that created such theological justifications for environmental destruction.
Deshoulières proposes that justification for the destruction of nature through an appeal to an illusory superior human reason has taken dangerous political and religious forms in modern society. “The Stream” criticizes the political claim to human rights since such a claim often justifies the human mutilation of nonhuman material beings that do not allegedly possess such rights. “Do not brag to me about these imaginary goods,/ These prerogatives, these rights/ Invented by our pride.” Similarly, the theological claim that human beings are made in God’s image justifies the destruction of other creatures allegedly not made in the divine image. “The more I see the weakness and malice of humanity,/ The less of the divinity/ I recognize in its image.” Rather than enhancing human dignity and human moral conduct, the claim of imago Dei actually increases human violence since it justifies the destruction of the material environment in the name of the ontological superiority of the human.
Critical commentary on the works of Deshoulières has tended to highlight two strands of her philosophy. Earlier philosophical analysis (Bayle) underlined her religious skepticism, in particular her denial of human immortality. Recent literary exegesis (Adam, Lachèvre) has dwelt upon her libertinism. This approach has focused on the neo-Epicurian justification of the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain as a central ethical code in her works. It has noted her ethical theory’s critical distance from traditional Christian morality, especially in matters of sexuality.
The limitation in these approaches lies in their relative lack of attention to the broader naturalist metaphysics of Deshoulières. Her religious skepticism is grounded on the metaphysical conviction that the real is nothing other than the movement of material substance, structured in atomic patterns. All claims of spiritual substance, with the possible exception of an aloof deity who provides the initial matter, are illusory. The claims for the existence of an immortal human soul are part of a greater error concerning the nature of reality itself. Similarly, her moral libertinism is rooted in a naturalist conception of human nature. Since all mental activity is an epiphenomenon of corporeal activity, specifically in the brain, moral action rightly focuses on the preservation and care of the body. The maximization of pleasure and the reduction of pain thus becomes an imperative moral duty for the human individual and community. Her neo-Epicurean moral principles rest on the naturalist thesis that human nature is entirely immersed within the web of material nature and that claims of human transcendence due to a spiritual soul are erroneous. One of the challenges for contemporary exegesis of Deshoulières is to excavate the naturalist metaphysics in which her theological skepticism and utilitarian ethics are embedded.
Another challenge for contemporary analysis and appreciation of Deshoulières’s philosophy lies in the arcane genres in which she expresses her theories. Like other philosophical salonnières of the period, Deshoulières does not use the standard academic genre of the treatise to state her claims concerning metaphysics, anthropology, and ethics. If Lucretius’s poetic version of philosophical argument can challenge the contemporary student of philosophy, Deshoulières’s bewildering variety of poetical genres can overwhelm. The pastoral, the ode, and the idyll no longer have currency in literary circles, let alone in academic philosophical circles who determine the shape of the philosophical canon. Patient literary analysis of these antiquated forms is the necessary complement to a philosophical exploration of Deshoulières’s comprehensive naturalism. Behind the quaint quatrains of the shepherds stand a substantial environmentalist metaphysics and ethics.
All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola College of Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 15, 2008 | Originally published: