Design Arguments for the Existence of God
Design arguments are empirical arguments for the existence of God. These arguments typically, though not always, proceed by attempting to identify various empirical features of the world that constitute evidence of intelligent design and inferring God’s existence as the best explanation for these features. Since the concepts of design and purpose are closely related, design arguments are also known as teleological arguments, which incorporates “telos,” the Greek word for “goal” or “purpose.”
Design arguments typically consist of (1) a premise that asserts that the material universe exhibits some empirical property F; (2) a premise (or sub-argument) that asserts (or concludes) that F is persuasive evidence of intelligent design or purpose; and (3) a premise (or sub-argument) that asserts (or concludes) that the best or most probable explanation for the fact that the material universe exhibits F is that there exists an intelligent designer who intentionally brought it about that the material universe exists and exhibits F.
There are a number of classic and contemporary versions of the argument from design. This article will cover seven different ones. Among the classical versions are: (1) the “Fifth Way” of St. Thomas Aquinas; (2) the argument from simple analogy; (3) Paley’s watchmaker argument; and (4) the argument from guided evolution. The more contemporary versions include: (5) the argument from irreducible biochemical complexity; (6) the argument from biological information; and (7) the fine-tuning argument.
Table of Contents
- The Classical Versions of the Design Argument
- Contemporary Versions of the Design Argument
- The Scientifically Legitimate Uses of Design Inferences
- References and Further Reading
The scriptures of each of the major classically theistic religions contain language that suggests that there is evidence of divine design in the world. Psalms 19:1 of the Old Testament, scripture to both Judaism and Christianity, states that “The heavens declare the glory of God; and the firmament sheweth his handywork.” Similarly, Romans 1:19-21 of the New Testament states:
For what can be known about God is plain to them, because God has shown it to them. Ever since the creation of the world his eternal power and divine nature, invisible though they are, have been understood and seen through the things he has made. So they are without excuse.
Further, Koran 31:20 asks “Do you not see that Allah has made what is in the heavens and what is in the earth subservient to you, and made complete to you His favors outwardly and inwardly?” While these verses do not specifically indicate which properties or features of the world are evidence of God’s intelligent nature, each presupposes that the world exhibits such features and that they are readily discernable to a reasonably conscientious agent.
Perhaps the earliest philosophically rigorous version of the design argument owes to St. Thomas Aquinas. According to Aquinas’s Fifth Way:
We see that things which lack knowledge, such as natural bodies, act for an end, and this is evident from their acting always, or nearly always, in the same way, so as to obtain the best result. Hence it is plain that they achieve their end, not fortuitously, but designedly. Now whatever lacks knowledge cannot move towards an end, unless it be directed by some being endowed with knowledge and intelligence; as the arrow is directed by the archer. Therefore some intelligent being exists by whom all natural things are directed to their end; and this being we call God (Aquinas, Summa Theologica, Article 3, Question 2).
It is worth noting that Aquinas’s version of the argument relies on a very strong claim about the explanation for ends and processes: the existence of any end-directed system or process can be explained, as a logical matter, only by the existence of an intelligent being who directs that system or process towards its end. Since the operations of all natural bodies, on Aquinas’s view, are directed towards some specific end that conduces to, at the very least, the preservation of the object, these operations can be explained only by the existence of an intelligent being. Accordingly, the empirical fact that the operations of natural objects are directed towards ends shows that an intelligent Deity exists.
This crucial claim, however, seems to be refuted by the mere possibility of an evolutionary explanation. If a Darwinian explanation is even coherent (that is, non-contradictory, as opposed to true), then it provides a logically possible explanation for how the end-directedness of the operations of living beings in this world might have come about. According to this explanation, such operations evolve through a process by which random genetic mutations are naturally selected for their adaptive value; organisms that have evolved some system that performs a fitness-enhancing operation are more likely to survive and leave offspring, other things being equal, than organisms that have not evolved such systems. If this explanation is possibly true, it shows that Aquinas is wrong in thinking that “whatever lacks knowledge cannot move towards an end, unless it be directed by some being endowed with knowledge and intelligence.”
The next important version of the design argument came in the 17th and 18th Centuries. Pursuing a strategy that has been adopted by the contemporary intelligent design movement, John Ray, Richard Bentley, and William Derham drew on scientific discoveries of the 16th and 17th Century to argue for the existence of an intelligent Deity. William Derham, for example, saw evidence of intelligent design in the vision of birds, the drum of the ear, the eye-socket, and the digestive system. Richard Bentley saw evidence of intelligent design in Newton’s discovery of the law of gravitation. It is noteworthy that each of these thinkers attempted to give scientifically-based arguments for the existence of God.
David Hume is the most famous critic of these arguments. In Part II of his famous Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Hume formulates the argument as follows:
Look round the world: contemplate the whole and every part of it: you will find it to be nothing but one great machine, subdivided into an infinite number of lesser machines, which again admit of subdivisions to a degree beyond what human senses and faculties can trace and explain. All these various machines, and even their most minute parts, are adjusted to each other with an accuracy which ravishes into admiration all men who have ever contemplated them. The curious adapting of means to ends, throughout all nature, resembles exactly, though it much exceeds, the productions of human contrivance; of human designs, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore, the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of Nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man, though possessed of much larger faculties, proportioned to the grandeur of the work which he has executed. By this argument a posteriori, and by this argument alone, do we prove at once the existence of a Deity, and his similarity to human mind and intelligence.
Since the world, on this analysis, is closely analogous to the most intricate artifacts produced by human beings, we can infer “by all the rules of analogy” the existence of an intelligent designer who created the world. Just as the watch has a watchmaker, then, the universe has a universe-maker.
As expressed in this passage, then, the argument is a straightforward argument from analogy with the following structure:
- The material universe resembles the intelligent productions of human beings in that it exhibits design.
- The design in any human artifact is the effect of having been made by an intelligent being.
- Like effects have like causes.
- Therefore, the design in the material universe is the effect of having been made by an intelligent creator.
Hume criticizes the argument on two main grounds. First, Hume rejects the analogy between the material universe and any particular human artifact. As Hume states the relevant rule of analogy, “wherever you depart in the least, from the similarity of the cases, you diminish proportionably the evidence; and may at last bring it to a very weak analogy, which is confessedly liable to error and uncertainty” (Hume, Dialogues, Part II). Hume then goes on to argue that the cases are simply too dissimilar to support an inference that they are like effects having like causes:
If we see a house,… we conclude, with the greatest certainty, that it had an architect or builder because this is precisely that species of effect which we have experienced to proceed from that species of cause. But surely you will not affirm that the universe bears such a resemblance to a house that we can with the same certainty infer a similar cause, or that the analogy is here entire and perfect (Hume, Dialogues, Part II).
Since the analogy fails, Hume argues that we would need to have experience with the creation of material worlds in order to justify any a posteriori claims about the causes of any particular material world; since we obviously lack such experience, we lack adequate justification for the claim that the material universe has an intelligent cause.
Second, Hume argues that, even if the resemblance between the material universe and human artifacts justified thinking they have similar causes, it would not justify thinking that an all-perfect God exists and created the world. For example, there is nothing in the argument that would warrant the inference that the creator of the universe is perfectly intelligent or perfectly good. Indeed, Hume argues that there is nothing there that would justify thinking even that there is just one deity: “what shadow of an argument… can you produce from your hypothesis to prove the unity of the Deity? A great number of men join in building a house or ship, in rearing a city, in framing a commonwealth; why may not several deities combine in contriving and framing a world” (Hume Dialogues, Part V)?
Though often confused with the argument from simple analogy, the watchmaker argument from William Paley is a more sophisticated design argument that attempts to avoid Hume’s objection to the analogy between worlds and artifacts. Instead of simply asserting a similarity between the material world and some human artifact, Paley’s argument proceeds by identifying what he takes to be a reliable indicator of intelligent design:
[S]uppose I found a watch upon the ground, and it should be inquired how the watch happened to be in that place, I should hardly think … that, for anything I knew, the watch might have always been there. Yet why should not this answer serve for the watch as well as for [a] stone [that happened to be lying on the ground]?… For this reason, and for no other; namely, that, if the different parts had been differently shaped from what they are, if a different size from what they are, or placed after any other manner, or in any order than that in which they are placed, either no motion at all would have been carried on in the machine, or none which would have answered the use that is now served by it (Paley 1867, 1).
There are thus two features of a watch that reliably indicate that it is the result of an intelligent design. First, it performs some function that an intelligent agent would regard as valuable; the fact that the watch performs the function of keeping time is something that has value to an intelligent agent. Second, the watch could not perform this function if its parts and mechanisms were differently sized or arranged; the fact that the ability of a watch to keep time depends on the precise shape, size, and arrangement of its parts suggests that the watch has these characteristics because some intelligent agency designed it to these specifications. Taken together, these two characteristics endow the watch with a functional complexity that reliably distinguishes objects that have intelligent designers from objects that do not.
Paley then goes on to argue that the material universe exhibits the same kind of functional complexity as a watch:
Every indicator of contrivance, every manifestation of design, which existed in the watch, exists in the works of nature; with the difference, on the side of nature, of being greater and more, and that in a degree which exceeds all computation. I mean that the contrivances of nature surpass the contrivances of art, in the complexity, subtilty, and curiosity of the mechanism; and still more, if possible, do they go beyond them in number and variety; yet in a multitude of cases, are not less evidently mechanical, not less evidently contrivances, not less evidently accommodated to their end, or suited to their office, than are the most perfect productions of human ingenuity (Paley 1867, 13).
Since the works of nature possess functional complexity, a reliable indicator of intelligent design, we can justifiably conclude that these works were created by an intelligent agent who designed them to instantiate this property.
Paley’s watchmaker argument is clearly not vulnerable to Hume’s criticism that the works of nature and human artifacts are too dissimilar to infer that they are like effects having like causes. Paley’s argument, unlike arguments from analogy, does not depend on a premise asserting a general resemblance between the objects of comparison. What matters for Paley’s argument is that works of nature and human artifacts have a particular property that reliably indicates design. Regardless of how dissimilar any particular natural object might otherwise be from a watch, both objects exhibit the sort of functional complexity that warrants an inference that it was made by an intelligent designer.
Paley’s version of the argument, however, is generally thought to have been refuted by Charles Darwin’s competing explanation for complex organisms. In The Origin of the Species, Darwin argued that more complex biological organisms evolved gradually over millions of years from simpler organisms through a process of natural selection. As Julian Huxley describes the logic of this process:
The evolutionary process results immediately and automatically from the basic property of living matter—that of self-copying, but with occasional errors. Self-copying leads to multiplication and competition; the errors in self-copying are what we call mutations, and mutations will inevitably confer different degrees of biological advantage or disadvantage on their possessors. The consequence will be differential reproduction down the generations—in other words, natural selection (Huxley 1953, 4).
Over time, the replication of genetic material in an organism results in mutations that give rise to new traits in the organism’s offspring. Sometimes these new traits are so unfavorable to a being’s survival prospects that beings with the traits die off; but sometimes these new traits enable the possessors to survive conditions that kill off beings without them. If the trait is sufficiently favorable, only members of the species with the trait will survive. By this natural process, functionally complex organisms gradually evolve over millions of years from primordially simple organisms.
Contemporary biologist, Richard Dawkins (1986), uses a programming problem to show that the logic of the process renders the Darwinian explanation significantly more probable than the design explanation. Dawkins considers two ways in which one might program a computer to generate the following sequence of characters: METHINKS IT IS LIKE A WEASEL. The first program randomly producing a new 28-character sequence each time it is run; since the program starts over each time, it incorporates a “single-step selection process.” The probability of randomly generating the target sequence on any given try is 2728 (that is, 27 characters selected for each of the 28 positions in the sequence), which amounts to about 1 in (10,000 x 1,000,0006). While a computer running eternally would eventually produce the sequence, Dawkins estimates that it would take 1,000,0005 years—which is 1,000,0003 years longer than the universe has existed. As is readily evident, a program that selects numbers by means of such a “single-step selection mechanism” has a very low probability of reaching the target.
The second program incorporates a “cumulative-step selection mechanism.” It begins by randomly generating a 28-character sequence of letters and spaces and then “breeds” from this sequence in the following way. For a specified period of time, it generates copies of itself; most of the copies perfectly replicate the sequence, but some copies have errors (or mutations). At the end of this period, it compares all of the sequences with the target sequence METHINKS IT IS LIKE A WEASEL and keeps the sequence that most closely resembles it. For example, a sequence that has an E in the second place more closely resembles a sequence that is exactly like the first except that it has a Q in the second place. It then begins breeding from this new sequence in exactly the same way. Unlike the first program which starts afresh with each try, the second program builds on previous steps, getting successively closer to the program as it breeds from the sequence closest to the target. This feature of the program increases the probability of reaching the sequence to such an extent that a computer running this program hit the target sequence after 43 generations, which took about half-an-hour.
The problem with Paley’s watchmaker argument, as Dawkins explains it, is that it falsely assumes that all of the other possible competing explanations are sufficiently improbable to warrant an inference of design. While this might be true of explanations that rely entirely on random single-step selection mechanisms, this is not true of Darwinian explanations. As is readily evident from Huxley’s description of the process, Darwinian evolution is a cumulative-step selection method that closely resembles in general structure the second computer program. The result is that the probability of evolving functionally complex organisms capable of surviving a wide variety of conditions is increased to such an extent that it exceeds the probability of the design explanation.
While many theists are creationists who accept the occurrence of “microevolution” (that is, evolution that occurs within a species, such as the evolution of penicillin-resistant bacteria) but deny the occurrence of “macroevolution” (that is, one species evolving from a distinct species), some theists accept the theory of evolution as consistent with theism and with their own denominational religious commitments. Such thinkers, however, frequently maintain that the existence of God is needed to explain the purposive quality of the evolutionary process. Just as the purposive quality of the cumulative-step computer program above is best explained by intelligent design, so too the purposive quality of natural selection is best explained by intelligent design.
The first theist widely known to have made such an argument is Frederick Robert Tennant. As he puts the matter, in Volume 2 of Philosophical Theology, “the multitude of interwoven adaptations by which the world is constituted a theatre of life, intelligence, and morality, cannot reasonably be regarded as an outcome of mechanism, or of blind formative power, or aught but purposive intelligence” (Tennant 1928-30, 121). In effect, this influential move infers design, not from the existence of functionally complex organisms, but from the purposive quality of the evolutionary process itself. Evolution is, on this line of response, guided by an intelligent Deity.
Contemporary versions of the design argument typically attempt to articulate a more sophisticated strategy for detecting evidence of design in the world. These versions typically contain three main elements—though they are not always explicitly articulated. First, they identify some property P that is thought to be a probabilistically reliable index of design in the following sense: a design explanation for P is significantly more probable than any explanation that relies on chance or random processes. Second they argue that some feature or features of the world exhibits P. Third, they conclude that the design explanation is significantly more likely to be true.
As we will see, however, all of the contemporary versions of the design inference seem to be vulnerable to roughly the same objection. While each of the design inferences in these arguments has legitimate empirical uses, those uses occur only in contexts where we have strong antecedent reason for believing there exist intelligent agents with the ability to bring about the relevant event, entity, or property. But since it is the very existence of such a being that is at issue in the debates about the existence of God, design arguments appear unable to stand by themselves as arguments for God’s existence.
Design theorists distinguish two types of complexity that can be instantiated by any given structure. As William Dembski describes the distinction: a system or structure is cumulatively complex “if the components of the system can be arranged sequentially so that the successive removal of components never leads to the complete loss of function”; a system or structure is irreducibly complex “if it consists of several interrelated parts so that removing even one part completely destroys the system’s function” (Dembski 1999, 147). A city is cumulatively complex since one can successively remove people, services, and buildings without rendering it unable to perform its function. A mousetrap, in contrast, is irreducibly complex because the removal of even one part results in complete loss of function.
Design proponents, like Michael J. Behe, have identified a number of biochemical systems that they take to be irreducibly complex. Like the functions of a watch or a mousetrap, a cilium cannot perform its function unless its microtubules, nexin linkers, and motor proteins are all arranged and structured in precisely the manner in which they are structured; remove any component from the system and it cannot perform its function. Similarly, the blood-clotting function cannot perform its function if either of its key ingredients, vitamin K and antihemophilic factor, are missing. Both systems are, on this view, irreducibly complex—rather than cumulatively complex.
According to Behe, the probability of evolving irreducibly complex systems along Darwinian lines is sufficiently small that it can be ruled out as an explanation of irreducible biochemical complexity:
An irreducibly complex system cannot be produced … by slight, successive modifications of a precursor system, because any precursor to an irreducibly complex system that is missing a part is by definition nonfunctional…. Since natural selection can only choose systems that are already working, if a biological system cannot be produced gradually it would have to arise as an integrated unit, in one fell swoop, for natural selection to have anything to act on (Behe 1996, 39; emphasis added).
Since, for example, a cilium-precursor (that is, one that lacks at least one of a cilium’s parts) cannot perform the function that endows a cilium with adaptive value, organisms that have the cilium-precursor are no “fitter for survival” than they would have been without it. Since chance-driven evolutionary processes would not select organisms with the precursor, intelligent design is a better explanation for the existence of organisms with fully functional cilia.
Though Behe states his conclusion in categorical terms (that is, irreducibly complex systems “cannot be produced gradually”), he is more charitably construed as claiming only that the probability of gradually producing irreducibly complex systems is very small. The stronger construction of the conclusion (and argument) incorrectly presupposes that Darwinian theory implies that every precursor to a fully functional system must itself perform some function that makes the organism more fit to survive. Organisms that have, say, a precursor to a fully functional cilium are no fitter than they would have been without it, but there is nothing in Darwinian theory that implies they are necessarily any less fit. Thus, there is no reason to think that it is logically or nomologically impossible, according to Darwinian theory, for a set of organisms with a precursor to a fully functional cilium to evolve into a set of organisms that has fully functional cilia. Accordingly, the argument from irreducible biochemical complexity is more plausibly construed as showing that the design explanation for such complexity is more probable than the evolutionary explanation.
Nevertheless, this more modest interpretation is problematic. First, there is little reason to think that the probability of evolving irreducibly complex systems is, as a general matter, small enough to warrant assuming that the probability of the design explanation must be higher. If having a precursor to an irreducibly complex system does not render the organism less fit for survival, the probability a subspecies of organisms with the precursor survives and propagates is the same, other things being equal, as the probability that a subspecies of organisms without the precursor survives and propagates. In such cases, then, the prospect that the subspecies with the precursor will continue to thrive, leave offspring, and evolve is not unusually small.
Second, the claim that intelligent agents of a certain kind would (or should) see functional value in a complex system, by itself, says very little about the probability of any particular causal explanation. While this claim surely implies that intelligent agents with the right causal abilities have a reason for bringing about such systems, it does not tell us anything determinate about whether it is likely that intelligent agents with the right causal powers did bring such systems about—because it does not tell us anything determinate about whether it is probable that such agents exist. As a logical matter, the mere fact that some existing thing has a feature, irreducibly complex or otherwise, that would be valuable to an intelligent being with certain properties, by itself, does not say anything about the probability that such a being exists.
Accordingly, even if we knew that the prospect that the precursor-subspecies would survive was “vanishingly small,” as Behe believes, we would not be justified in inferring a design explanation on probabilistic grounds. To infer that the design explanation is more probable than an explanation of vanishingly small probability, we need some reason to think that the probability of the design explanation is not vanishingly small. The problem, however, is that the claim that a complex system has some property that would be valued by an intelligent agent with the right abilities, by itself, simply does not justify inferring that the probability that such an agent exists and brought about the existence of that system is not vanishingly small. In the absence of some further information about the probability that such an agent exists, we cannot legitimately infer design as the explanation of irreducible biochemical complexity.
While the argument from irreducible biochemical complexity focuses on the probability of evolving irreducibly complex living systems or organisms from simpler living systems or organisms, the argument from biological information focuses on the problem of generating living organisms in the first place. Darwinian theories are intended only to explain how it is that more complex living organisms developed from primordially simple living organisms, and hence do not even purport to explain the origin of the latter. The argument from biological information is concerned with an explanation of how it is that the world went from a state in which it contained no living organisms to a state in which it contained living organisms; that is to say, it is concerned with the explanation of the very first forms of life.
There are two distinct problems involved in explaining the origin of life from a naturalistic standpoint. The first is to explain how it is that a set of non-organic substances could combine to produce the amino acids that are the building blocks of every living substance. The second is to explain the origin of the information expressed by the sequences of nucleotides that form DNA molecules. The precise ordering of the four nucleotides, adenine, thymine, guanine, and cytosine (A, T, G, and C, for short), determine the specific operations that occur within a living cell and is hence fairly characterized as representing (or embodying) information. As Stephen C. Meyer puts the point: “just as the letters in the alphabet of a written language may convey a particular message depending on their sequence, so too do the sequences of nucleotides or bases in the DNA molecule convey precise biochemical instructions that direct protein synthesis within the cell” (Meyer 1998, 526).
The argument from biological information is concerned with only the second of these problems. In particular, it attempts to evaluate four potential explanations for the origin of biological information: (1) chance; (2) a pre-biotic form of natural selection; (3) chemical necessity; and (4) intelligent design. The argument concludes that intelligent design is the most probable explanation for the information present in large biomacromolecules like DNA, RNA, and proteins.
The argument proceeds as follows. Pre-biotic natural selection and chemical necessity cannot, as a logical matter, explain the origin of biological information. Theories of pre-biotic natural selection are problematic because they illicitly assume the very feature they are trying to explain. These explanations proceed by asserting that the most complex nonliving molecules will reproduce more efficiently than less complex nonliving molecules. But, in doing so, they assume that nonliving chemicals instantiate precisely the kind of replication mechanism that biological information is needed to explain in the case of living organisms. In the absence of some sort of explanation as to how non-organic reproduction could occur, theories of pre-biotic natural selection fail.
Theories of chemical necessity are problematic because chemical necessity can explain, at most, the development of highly repetitive ordered sequences incapable of representing information. Because processes involving chemical necessity are highly regular and predictable in character, they are capable of producing only highly repetitive sequences of “letters.” For example, while chemical necessity could presumably explain a sequence like “ababababababab,” it cannot explain specified but highly irregular sequences like “the house is on fire.” The problem is that highly repetitive sequences like the former are not sufficiently complex and varied to express information. Thus, while chemical necessity can explain periodic order among nucleotide letters, it lacks the resources logically needed to explain the aperiodic, highly specified, complexity of a sequence capable of expressing information.
Ultimately, this leaves only chance and design as logically viable explanations of biological information. Although it is logically possible to obtain functioning sequences of amino acids through purely random processes, some researchers have estimated the probability of doing so under the most favorable of assumptions at approximately 1 in 1065. Factoring in more realistic assumptions about pre-biotic conditions, Meyer argues the probability of generating short functional protein is 1 in 10125—a number that is vanishingly small. Meyer concludes: “given the complexity of proteins, it is extremely unlikely that a random search through all the possible amino acid sequences could generate even a single relatively short functional protein in the time available since the beginning of the universe (let alone the time available on the early earth)” (Meyer 2002, 75).
Next, Meyer argues that the probability of the design explanation for the origin of biological information is considerably higher:
[O]ne can detect the past action of an intelligent cause from the presence of an information-rich effect, even if the cause itself cannot be directly observed. For instances, visitors to the gardens of Victoria harbor in Canada correctly infer the activity of intelligent agents when they see a pattern of red and yellow flowers spelling “Welcome to Victoria”, even if they did not see the flowers planted and arranged. Similarly, the specifically arranged nucleotide sequences—the complex but functionally specified sequences—in DNA imply the past action of an intelligent mind, even if such mental agency cannot be directly observed (Meyer 2002, 93).
Further, scientists in many fields typically infer the causal activity of intelligent agents from the occurrence of information content. As Meyer rightly observes by way of example, “[a]rcheologists assume a mind produced the inscriptions on the Rosetta Stone” (Meyer 2002, 94).
Meyer’s reasoning appears vulnerable to the same objection to which the argument from biochemical complexity is vulnerable. In all of the contexts in which we legitimately make the design inference in response to an observation of information, we already know that there exist intelligent agents with the right sorts of motivations and abilities to produce information content; after all, we know that human beings exist and are frequently engaged in the production and transmission of information. It is precisely because we have this background knowledge that we can justifiably be confident that intelligent design is a far more probable explanation than chance for any occurrence of information that a human being is capable of producing. In the absence of antecedent reason for thinking there exist intelligent agents capable of creating information content, the occurrence of a pattern of flowers in the shape of “Welcome to Victoria” would not obviously warrant an inference of intelligent design.
The problem, however, is that it is the very existence of an intelligent Deity that is at issue. In the absence of some antecedent reason for thinking there exists an intelligent Deity capable of creating biological information, the occurrence of sequences of nucleotides that can be described as “representing information” does not obviously warrant an inference of intelligent design—no matter how improbable the chance explanation might be. To justify preferring one explanation as more probable than another, we must have information about the probability of each explanation. The mere fact that certain sequences take a certain shape that we can see meaning or value in, by itself, tells us nothing obvious about the probability that it is the result of intelligent design.
It is true, of course, that “experience affirms that information content not only routinely arises but always arises from the activity of intelligent minds” (Meyer 2002, 92), but our experience is limited to the activity of human beings—beings that are frequently engaged in activities that are intended to produce information content. While that experience will inductively justify inferring that some human agency is the cause of any information that could be explained by human beings, it will not inductively justify inferring the existence of an intelligent agency with causal powers that depart as radically from our experience as the powers that are traditionally attributed to God. The argument from biological information, like the argument from biochemical complexity, seems incapable of standing alone as an argument for God’s existence.
Scientists have determined that life in the universe would not be possible if more than about two dozen properties of the universe were even slightly different from what they are; as the matter is commonly put, the universe appears “fine-tuned” for life. For example, life would not be possible if the force of the big bang explosion had differed by one part in 1060; the universe would have either collapsed on itself or expanded too rapidly for stars to form. Similarly, life would not be possible if the force binding protons to neutrons differed by even five percent.
It is immediately tempting to think that the probability of a fine-tuned universe is so small that intelligent design simply must be the more probable explanation. The supposition that it is a matter of chance that so many things could be exactly what they need to be for life to exist in the universe just seems implausibly improbable. Since, on this intuition, the only two explanations for the highly improbable appearance of fine-tuning are chance and an intelligent agent who deliberately designed the universe to be hospitable to life, the latter simply has to be the better explanation.
This natural line of argument is vulnerable to a cogent objection. The mere fact that it is enormously improbable that an event occurred by chance, by itself, gives us no reason to think that it occurred by design. Suppose we flip a fair coin 1000 times and record the results in succession. The probability of getting the particular outcome is vanishingly small: 1 in 21000 to be precise. But it is clear that the mere fact that such a sequence is so improbable, by itself, does not give us any reason to think that it was the result of intelligent design. As intuitively tempting as it may be to conclude from just the apparent improbability of a fine-tuned universe that it is the result of divine agency, the inference is unsound.
George N. Schlesinger, however, attempts to formalize the fine-tuning intuition in a way that avoids this objection. To understand Schlesinger’s argument, consider your reaction to two different events. If John wins a 1-in-1,000,000,000 lottery game, you would not immediately be tempted to think that John (or someone acting on his behalf) cheated. If, however, John won three consecutive 1-in-1,000 lotteries, you would immediately be tempted to think that John (or someone acting on his behalf) cheated. Schlesinger believes that the intuitive reaction to these two scenarios is epistemically justified. The structure of the latter event is such that it is justifies a belief that intelligent design is the cause: the fact that John got lucky in three consecutive lotteries is a reliable indicator that his winning was the intended result of someone’s intelligent agency. Despite the fact that the probability of winning three consecutive 1-in-1,000 games is exactly the same as the probability of winning one 1-in-1,000,000,000 game, the former event is of a kind that is surprising in a way that warrants an inference of intelligent design.
Schlesinger argues that the fact that the universe is fine-tuned for life is improbable in exactly the same way that John’s winning three consecutive lotteries is improbable. After all, it is not just that we got lucky with respect to one property-lottery game; we got lucky with respect to two dozen property-lottery games—lotteries that we had to win in order for there to be life in the universe. Given that we are justified in inferring intelligent design in the case of John’s winning three consecutive lotteries, we are even more justified in inferring intelligent design in the case of our winning two dozen much more improbable property lotteries. Thus, Schlesinger concludes, the most probable explanation for the remarkable fact that the universe has exactly the right properties to sustain life is that an intelligent Deity intentionally created the universe such as to sustain life.
This argument is vulnerable to a number of criticisms. First, while it might be clear that carbon-based life would not be possible if the universe were slightly different with respect to these two-dozen fine-tuned properties, it is not clear that no form of life would be possible. Second, some physicists speculate that this physical universe is but one material universe in a “multiverse” in which all possible material universes are ultimately realized. If this highly speculative hypothesis is correct, then there is nothing particularly suspicious about the fact that there is a fine-tuned universe, since the existence of such a universe is inevitable (that is, has probability 1) if all every material universe is eventually realized in the multiverse. Since some universe, so to speak, had to win, the fact that ours won does not demand any special explanation.
Schlesinger’s fine-tuning argument also appears vulnerable to the same criticism as the other versions of the design argument (see Himma 2002). While Schlesinger is undoubtedly correct in thinking that we are justified in suspecting design in the case where John wins three consecutive lotteries, it is because—and only because—we know two related empirical facts about such events. First, we already know that there exist intelligent agents who have the right motivations and causal abilities to deliberately bring about such events. Second, we know from past experience with such events that they are usually explained by the deliberate agency of one or more of these agents. Without at least one of these two pieces of information, we are not obviously justified in seeing design in such cases.
As before, the problem for the fine-tuning argument is that we lack both of the pieces that are needed to justify an inference of design. First, the very point of the argument is to establish the fact that there exists an intelligent agency that has the right causal abilities and motivations to bring the existence of a universe capable of sustaining life. Second, and more obviously, we do not have any past experience with the genesis of worlds and are hence not in a position to know whether the existence of fine-tuned universes are usually explained by the deliberate agency of some intelligent agency. Because we lack this essential background information, we are not justified in inferring that there exists an intelligent Deity who deliberately created a universe capable of sustaining life.
Robin Collins defends a more modest version of the fine-tuning argument that relies on a general principle of confirmation theory, rather than a principle that is contrived to distinguish events or entities that are explained by intelligent design from events or entities explained by other factors. Collins’s version of the argument relies on what he calls the Prime Principle of Confirmation: If observation O is more probable under hypothesis H1 than under hypothesis H2, then O provides a reason for preferring H1 over H2. The idea is that the fact that an observation is more likely under the assumption that H1 is true than under the assumption H2 is true counts as evidence in favor of H1.
This version of the fine-tuning argument proceeds by comparing the relative likelihood of a fine-tuned universe under two hypotheses:
- The Design Hypothesis: there exists a God who created the universe such as to sustain life;
- The Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis: there exists one material universe, and it is a matter of chance that the universe has the fine-tuned properties needed to sustain life.
Assuming the Design Hypothesis is true, the probability that the universe has the fine-tuned properties approaches (if it does not equal) 1. Assuming the Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis is true, the probability that the universe has the fine-tuned properties is very small—though it is not clear exactly how small. Applying the Prime Principle of Confirmation, Collins concludes that the observation of fine-tuned properties provides reason for preferring the Design Hypothesis over the Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis.
At the outset, it is crucial to note that Collins does not intend the fine-tuned argument as a proof of God’s existence. As he explains, the Prime Principle of Confirmation “is a general principle of reasoning which tells us when some observation counts as evidence in favor of one hypothesis over another” (Collins 1999, 51). Indeed, he explicitly acknowledges that “the argument does not say that the fine-tuning evidence proves that the universe was designed, or even that it is likely that the universe was designed” (Collins 1999, 53). It tells us only that the observation of fine-tuning provides one reason for accepting the Theistic Hypothesis over the Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis—and one that can be rebutted by other evidence.
The confirmatory version of the fine-tuning argument is not vulnerable to the objection that it relies on an inference strategy that presupposes that we have independent evidence for thinking the right kind of intelligent agency exists. As a general scientific principle, the Prime Principle of Confirmation can be applied in a wide variety of circumstances and is not limited to circumstances in which we have other reasons to believe the relevant conclusion is true. If the observation of a fine-tuned universe is more probable under the Theistic Hypothesis than under the Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis, then this fact is a reason for preferring the Design Hypothesis to Atheistic Single-Universe Hypothesis.
Nevertheless, the confirmatory version of the argument is vulnerable on other fronts. As a first step towards seeing one worry, consider two possible explanations for the observation that John Doe wins a 1-in-7,000,000 lottery (see Himma 2002). According to the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis, God wanted John Doe to win and deliberately brought it about that his numbers were drawn. According to the Chance Lottery Hypothesis, John Doe’s numbers were drawn by chance. It is clear that John’s winning the lottery is vastly more probable under the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis than under the Chance Lottery Hypothesis. By the Prime Principle of Confirmation, then, John’s winning the lottery provides a reason to prefer the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis over the Chance Lottery Hypothesis.
As is readily evident, the above reasoning, by itself, provides very weak support for the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis. If all we know about the world is that John Doe won a lottery and the only possible explanations for this observation are the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis and the Chance Lottery Hypothesis, then this observation provides some reason to prefer the former. But it does not take much counterevidence to rebut the Theistic Lottery Hypothesis: a single observation of a lottery that relies on a random selection process will suffice. A single application of the Prime Principle of Confirmation, by itself, is simply not designed to provide the sort of reason that would warrant much confidence in preferring one hypothesis to another.
For this reason, the confirmatory version of the fine-tuning argument, by itself, provides a weak reason for preferring the Design Hypothesis over the Atheistic Single Universe Hypothesis. Although Collins is certainly correct in thinking the observation of fine-tuning provides a reason for accepting the Design Hypothesis and hence rational ground for belief that God exists, that reason is simply not strong enough to do much in the way of changing the minds of either agnostics or atheists.
It is worth noting that proponents are correct in thinking that design inferences have a variety of legitimate scientific uses. Such inferences are used to detect intelligent agency in a large variety of contexts, including criminal and insurance investigations. Consider, for example, the notorious case of Nicholas Caputo. Caputo, a member of the Democratic Party, was a public official responsible for conducting drawings to determine the relative ballot positions of Democrats and Republicans. During Caputo’s tenure, the Democrats drew the top ballot position 40 of 41 times, making it far more likely that an undecided voter would vote for the Democratic candidate than for the Republican candidate. The Republican Party filed suit against Caputo, arguing he deliberately rigged the ballot to favor his own party. After noting that the probability of picking the Democrats 40 out of 41 times was less than 1 in 50 billion, the court legitimately made a design inference, concluding that “few persons of reason will accept the explanation of blind chance.”
What proponents of design arguments for God’s existence, however, have not noticed is that each one of these indubitably legitimate uses occurs in a context in which we are already justified in thinking that intelligent beings with the right motivations and abilities exist. In every context in which design inferences are routinely made by scientists, they already have conclusive independent reason for believing there exist intelligent agents with the right abilities and motivations to bring about the apparent instance of design.
Consider, for example, how much more information was available to the court in the Caputo case than is available to the proponent of the design argument for God’s existence. Like the proponent of the design argument, the court knew that (1) the relevant event or feature is something that might be valued by an intelligent agent; and (2) the odds of it coming about by chance are astronomically small. Unlike the proponent of the design argument, however, the court had an additional piece of information available to it: the court already knew that there existed an intelligent agent with the right causal abilities and motives to bring about the event; after all, there was no dispute whatsoever about the existence of Caputo. It was that piece of information, together with (1), that enabled the court to justifiably conclude that the probability that an intelligent agent deliberately brought it about that the Democrats received the top ballot position 40 of 41 times was significantly higher than the probability that this happened by chance. Without this crucial piece of information, however, the court would not have been so obviously justified in making the design inference. Accordingly, while the court was right to infer a design explanation in the Caputo case, this is, in part, because the judges already knew that the right kind of intelligent beings exist—and one of them happened to have occupied a position that afforded him with the opportunity to rig the drawings in favor of the Democrats.
In response, one might be tempted to argue that there is one context in which scientists employ the design inference without already having sufficient reason to think the right sort of intelligent agency exists. As is well-known, researchers monitor radio transmissions for patterns that would support a design inference that such transmissions are sent by intelligent beings. For example, it would be reasonable to infer that some intelligent extraterrestrial beings were responsible for a transmission of discrete signals and pauses that effectively enumerated the prime numbers from 2 to 101. In this case, the intelligibility of the pattern, together with the improbability of its occurring randomly, seems to justify the inference that the transmission sequence is the result of intelligent design.
As it turns out, we are already justified in thinking that the right sort of intelligent beings exist even in this case. We already know, after all, that we exist and have the right sort of motivations and abilities to bring about such transmissions because we send them into space hoping that some other life form will detect our existence. While our existence in the universe—and this is crucial—does not, by itself, justify thinking that there are other intelligent life forms in the universe, it does justify thinking that the probability that there are such life forms is higher than the astronomically small probability (1 in 21136 to be precise) that a sequence of discrete radio signals and pauses that enumerates the prime numbers from 2 to 101 is the result of chance. Thus, we would be justified in inferring design as the explanation of such a sequence on the strength of three facts: (1) the probability of such a chance occurrence is 1 in 21136; (2) there exist intelligent beings in the universe capable of bringing about such an occurrence; and (3) the sequence of discrete signals and pauses has a special significance to intelligent beings. In particular, (2) and (3) tell us that the probability that design explains such an occurrence is significantly higher than 1 in 21136—though it is not clear exactly what the probability is.
Insofar as the legitimate application of design inferences presupposes that we have antecedent reason to believe the right kind of intelligent being exists, they can enable us to distinguish what such beings do from what merely happens. If we already know, for example, that there exist beings capable of rigging a lottery, then design inferences can enable us to distinguish lottery results that merely happen from lottery results that are deliberately brought about by such agents. Similarly, if we already have adequate reason to believe that God exists, then design inferences can enable us to distinguish features of the world that merely happen from features of the world that are deliberately brought about by the agency of God. Indeed, to the extent that we are antecedently justified in believing that God exists, it is obviously more reasonable to believe that God deliberately structured the universe to have the fine-tuned properties than it is to believe that somehow this occurred by chance.
If this is correct, then design inferences simply cannot do the job they are asked to do in design arguments for God’s existence. Insofar as they presuppose that we already know the right kind of intelligent being exists, they cannot stand alone as a justification for believing that God exists. It is the very existence of the right kind of intelligent being that is at issue in the dispute over whether God exists. While design inferences have a variety of scientifically legitimate uses, they cannot stand alone as arguments for God’s existence.
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- Richard Bentley, A Confutation of Atheism from the Origin and Frame of the World (London: H. Mortlock, 1692-1693)
- Robin Collins, “A Scientific Argument for the Existence of God,” in Michael J. Murray (ed.), Reason for the Hope Within (Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Co., 1999)
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- George N. Schlesinger, New Perspectives on Old-time Religion (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988)
- Frederick Robert Tennant, Philosophical Theology, Volume 2 (1928-30)
Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.
Last updated: April 12, 2009 | Originally published: December/23/2003
Categories: Philosophy of Religion