Denis Diderot was the most prominent of the French Encyclopedists. He was educated by the Jesuits, and, refusing to enter one of the learned professions, was turned adrift by his father and came to Paris, where he lived from hand to mouth for a time. Gradually, however, he became recognized as one of the most powerful writers of the day. His first independent work was the Essai sur le merite et la vertu (1745). As one of the editors of the Dictionnaire de medecine (6 vols., Paris, 1746), he gained valuable experience in encyclopedic system. His Pensees philosophiques (The Hague, 1746), in which he attacked both atheism and the received Christianity, was burned by order of the Parliament of Paris.
In the circle of the leaders of the Enlightenment, Diderot’s name became known especially by his Lettre sur les aveugles (London, 1749), which supported Locke’s theory of knowledge. He attacked the conventional morality of the day, with the result (to which possibly an allusion to the mistress of a minister contributed) that he was imprisoned at Vincennes for three months. He was released by the influence of Voltaire’s friend Mme. du Chatelet, and thenceforth was in close relation with the leaders of revolutionary thought. He had made very little pecuniary profit out of the Encyclopedie, and Grimm appealed on his behalf to Catherine of Russia, who in 1765 bought his library, allowing him the use of the books as long as he lived, and assigning him a yearly salary which a little later she paid him for fifty years in advance.
In 1773 she summoned him to St. Petersburg with Grimm to converse with him in person. On his return he lived until his death in a house provided by her, in comparative retirement but in unceasing labor on the undertakings of his party, writing (according to Grimm) two-thirds of Raynal’s famous Histoire philosophique, and contributing some of the most rhetorical pages to Helvetius’s De l’esprit and Holbach’s Systeme de la nature Systeme social, and Alorale universelle. His numerous writings include the most varied forms of literary effort, from inept licentious tales and comedies which pointed away from the stiff classical style of the French drama and strongly influenced Lessing, to the most daring ethical and metaphysical speculations. Like his famous contemporary Samuel Johnson, he is said to have been more effective as a talker than as a writer; and his mental qualifications were rather those of a stimulating force than of a reasoned philosopher. His position gradually changed from theism to deism, then to materialism, and finally rested in a pantheistic sensualism. In Sainte-Beuve’s phrase, he was ” the first great writer who belonged wholly and undividedly to modern democratic society,” and his attacks on the political system of France were among the most potent causes of the Revolution.
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Last updated: April 25, 2001 | Originally published: