Diogenes Laertius

Diogenes Laertius (3rd C. CE)

Diogenes Laertius, native of Laerte in Cilicia, was a biographer of ancient Greek philosophers. His Lives of the Philosophers (Philosophoi Biol), in ten books, is still extant and is an important source of information on the development of Greek philosophy. The period when he lived is not exactly known, but it is supposed to have been during the reigns of Septimius Severus and Caracalla. Because of his long and fairly sympathetic account of Epicurus, some think that Diogenes belonged to the Epicurean School, but this is not clear. He expresses his admiration for many philosophers, but his own allegiances, if any, are not stated.

He divides all the Greek philosophers into two classes: those of the Ionic and those of the Italic school. He derives the first from Anaximander, the second from Pythagoras. After Socrates, he divides the Ionian philosophers into three branches: (a) Plato and the Academics, down to Clitomachus; (b) the Cynics, down to Chrysippus; (c) Aristotle and Theophrastus. The series of Italic philosophers consists, after Pythagoras, of the following: Telanges, Xenophanes, Parmenides, Zeno of Elea, Leucippus, Democritus, and others down to Epicurus. The first seven books are devoted to the Ionic philosophers; the last three treat of the Italic school.

The work of Diogenes is a crude contribution towards the history of philosophy. It contains a brief account of the lives, doctrines, and sayings of most persons who have been called philosophers; and though the author is limited in his philosophical abilities and assessment of the various schools, the book is valuable as a collection of facts, which we could not have learned from any other source, and is entertaining as a sort of pot-pourri on the subject. Diogenes also includes samples of his own wretched poetry about the philosophers he discusses.

Diogenes is generally as reliable as whatever source he happens to be copying from at that moment. Especially when Diogenes is setting down amusing or scandalous stories about the lives and deaths of various philosophers which are supposed to serve as fitting illustrations of their thought, the reader should be wary. The article on Epicurus, however, is quite valuable, since it contains some original letters of that philosopher, which comprise a summary of the Epicurean doctrines.

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