The most illustrious of the Cynic philosophers, Diogenes of Sinope serves as the template for the Cynic sage in antiquity. An alleged student of Antisthenes, Diogenes maintains his teacher’s asceticism and emphasis on ethics, but brings to these philosophical positions a dynamism and sense of humor unrivaled in the history of philosophy. Though originally from Sinope, the majority of the stories comprising his philosophical biography occur in Athens, and some of the most celebrated of these place Alexander the Great or Plato as his foil.It is disputed whether Diogenes left anything in writing. If he did, the texts he composed have since been lost. In Cynicism, living and writing are two components of ethical practice, but Diogenes is much like Socrates and even Plato in his sentiments regarding the superiority of direct verbal interaction over the written account. Diogenes scolds Hegesias after he asks to be lent one of Diogenes’ writing tablets: “You are a simpleton, Hegesias; you do not choose painted figs, but real ones; and yet you pass over the true training and would apply yourself to written rules” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 48). In reconstructing Diogenes’ ethical model, then, the life he lived is as much his philosophical work as any texts he may have composed.
The exceptional nature of Diogenes’ life generates some difficulty for determining the exact events that comprise it. He was a citizen of Sinope who either fled or was exiled because of a problem involving the defacing of currency. Thanks to numismatic evidence, the adulteration of Sinopean coinage is one event about which there is certainty. The details of the defacing, though, are murkier: “Diocles relates that [Diogenes] went into exile because his father was entrusted with the money of the state and adulterated the coinage. But Eubulides in his book on Diogenes says that Diogenes himself did this and was forced to leave home along with his father” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 20). Whether it was Diogenes or his father who defaced the currency, and for whatever reasons they may have done so, the act lead to Diogenes’ relocation to Athens.
Diogenes’ biography becomes, historically, only sketchier. For example, one story claims that Diogenes was urged by the oracle at Delphi to adulterate the political currency, but misunderstood and defaced the state currency (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 20). A second version tells of Diogenes traveling to Delphi and receiving this same oracle after he had already altered the currency, turning his crime into a calling. It is, finally, questionable whether Diogenes ever consulted the oracle at all; the Delphic advice is curiously close to Socrates’ own injunction, and the interweaving of life and legend in Diogenes’ case is just as substantial.
Once in Athens, Diogenes famously took a tub, or a pithos, for an abode. In Lives of Eminent Philosophers, it is reported that Diogenes “had written to some one to try and procure a cottage for him. When this man was a long time about it, he took for his abode the tub in the Metroön, as he himself explains in his letters” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 23). Apparently Diogenes discovered that he had no need for conventional shelter or any other “dainties” from having watched a mouse. The lesson the mouse teaches is that he is capable of adapting himself to any circumstance. This adaptability is the origin of Diogenes’ legendary askēsis, or training.
Diogenes Laertius reports that Diogenes of Sinope “fell in” with Antisthenes who, though not in the habit of taking students, was worn out by Diogenes’ persistence (Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 22). Although this account has been met with suspicion, especially given the likely dates of Diogenes’ arrival in Athens and Antisthenes’ death, it supports the perception that the foundation of Diogenes’ philosophical practice rests with Antisthenes.
Another important, though possibly invented, episode in Diogenes’ life centers around his enslavement in Corinth after having been captured by pirates. When asked what he could do, he replied “Govern men,” which is precisely what he did once bought by Xeniades. He was placed in charge of Xeniades’ sons, who learned to follow his ascetic example. One story tells of Diogenes’ release after having become a cherished member of the household, another claims Xeniades freed him immediately, and yet another maintains that he grew old and died at Xeniades’ house in Corinth. Whichever version may be true (and, of course, they all could be false), the purpose is the same: Diogenes the slave is freer than his master, who he rightly convinces to submit to his obedience.
Though most accounts agree that he lived to be quite old— some suggesting he lived until ninety— the tales of Diogenes’ death are no less multiple than those of his life. The possible cause of death includes a voluntary demise by holding his breath, an illness brought on by eating raw octopus, or death by dog bite. Given the embellished feel of each of these reports, it is more likely that he died of old age.
When Plato is asked what sort of man Diogenes is, he responds, “A Socrates gone mad” (Diogenes Laertius, Book 6, Chapter 54). Plato’s label is representative, for Diogenes’ adaptation of Socratic philosophy has frequently been regarded as one of degradation. Certain scholars have understood Diogenes as an extreme version of Socratic wisdom, offering a fascinating, if crude, moment in the history of ancient thought, but which ought not to be confused with the serious business of philosophy. This reading is influenced by the mixture of shamelessness and askēsis which riddle Diogenes’ biography. This understanding, though, overlooks the centrality of reason in Diogenes’ practice.
Diogenes’ sense of shamelessness is best seen in the context of Cynicism in general. Specifically, though, it stems from a repositioning of convention below nature and reason. One guiding principle is that if an act is not shameful in private, that same act is not made shameful by being performed in public. For example, it was contrary to Athenian convention to eat in the marketplace, and yet there he would eat for, as he explained when reproached, it was in the marketplace that he felt hungry. The most scandalous of these sorts of activities involves his indecent behavior in the marketplace, to which he responded “he wished it were as easy to relieve hunger by rubbing an empty stomach” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 46).
He is labeled mad for acting against convention, but Diogenes points out that it is the conventions which lack reason: “Most people, he would say, are so nearly mad that a finger makes all the difference. For if you go along with your middle finger stretched out, some one will think you mad, but, if it’s the little finger, he will not think so” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 35). In these philosophical fragments, reason clearly has a role to play. There is a report that Diogenes “would continually say that for the conduct of life we need right reason or a halter” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 24). For Diogenes, each individual should either allow reason to guide her conduct, or, like an animal, she will need to be lead by a leash; reason guides one away from mistakes and toward the best way in which to live life. Diogenes, then, does not despise knowledge as such, but despises pretensions to knowledge that serve no purpose.
He is especially scornful of sophisms. He disproves an argument that a person has horns by touching his forehead, and in a similar manner, counters the claim that there is no such thing as motion by walking around. He elsewhere disputes Platonic definitions and from this comes one of his more memorable actions: “Plato had defined the human being as an animal, biped and featherless, and was applauded. Diogenes plucked a fowl and brought it into the lecture-room with the words, ‘Here is Plato’s human being.’ In consequence of which there was added to the definition, ‘having broad nails’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 40). Diogenes is a harsh critic of Plato, regularly disparaging Plato’s metaphysical pursuits and thereby signaling a clear break from primarily theoretical ethics.
Diogenes’ talent for undercutting social and religious conventions and subverting political power can tempt readers into viewing his position as merely negative. This would, however, be a mistake. Diogenes is clearly contentious, but he is so for the sake of promoting reason and virtue. In the end, for a human to be in accord with nature is to be rational, for it is in the nature of a human being to act in accord with reason. Diogenes has trouble finding such humans, and expresses his sentiments regarding his difficulty theatrically. Diogenes is reported to have “lit a lamp in broad daylight and said, as he went about, ‘I am searching for a human being’” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 41).
For the Cynics, life in accord with reason is lived in accord with nature, and therefore life in accord with reason is greater than the bounds of convention and the polis. Furthermore, the Cynics claim that such a life is the life worth living. As a homeless and penniless exile, Diogenes experienced the greatest misfortunes of which the tragedians write, and yet he insisted that he lived the good life: “He claimed that to fortune he could oppose courage, to convention nature, to passion reason” (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Book 6, Chapter 38).
University of Arkansas at Little Rock
U. S. A.
Last updated: April 24, 2006 | Originally published: