Disjunctivism, as a theory of visual experience, claims that the mental states involved in a “good case” experience of veridical perception and a “bad case” experience of hallucination differ. They differ even in those cases in which the two experiences are indistinguishable for their subject. Consider the veridical perception of a bar stool and an indistinguishable hallucination; both of these experiences might be classed together as experiences of a bar stool or experiences of seeming to see a bar stool. This might lead us to think that the experiences we undergo in the two cases must be of the same kind, the difference being that the former, but not the latter, is connected to the world in the right kind of way. Such a conjecture has been called a “highest common factor” or “common kind” assumption. At heart, disjunctivism consists in the rejection of this assumption. According to the disjunctivist, veridical experiences and hallucinations do not share a common component.
There are a host of interesting questions surrounding disjunctivism including: What is involved in the claims that good case and bad case experiences differ? Why might one want to be a disjunctivist? What kinds of claims can the disjunctivist make about hallucination and illusion? These questions, and problems for the thesis, will be discussed as we proceed.
If disjunctivism consists in the rejection of the claim that veridical perceptions and hallucinations share a common factor, why “disjunctivism”? The thesis acquires its name from the particular way in which it reinterprets statements that, at face value, might appear to commit us to the existence of experiences, understood as good case/bad case common factors. Consider the sentence, ‘I seem to see a flash of light’. Such a sentence could be true regardless of whether we are perceiving or hallucinating. As such, the truthmaker of such a sentence might seem to be something common to the two cases, and a commitment to the truth of such sentences in turn to commit us to a common factor. However, J.M. Hinton contends that ‘I seem to see a flash of light’ is simply “a more compact way of saying” something like this: “Either I see a flash of light, or I have an illusion of a flash of light” (1967: 217).
It is this reinterpretation of seems-sentences as disjunctive in form that gives disjunctivism its name. Moreover, not only do disjunctivists insist that a seems-statement is shorthand for a disjunctive statement, they insist that such statements have a disjunctive truthmaker. The statement, Either I see an F or it merely seems to me as if that were so, can be made true in two different ways: either by its being true that I actually do see an F, or by its being true that I don’t see an F but that it is for me as if I did. To see how this is supposed to work, consider the following example from Don Locke:
“This is a woman, or a man dressed as a woman” does not assert the presence of a woman/transvestite-neutral entity … its truth depends simply on the presence of either a woman or a transvestite, as the case may be. (1975: 467)
In this way, Hinton shows how we can be committed to the existence of true seems-statements without being committed to a common factor that makes them true.
In reinterpreting seems-statements in this way, Hinton opens the door for philosophers to claim that veridical perception and hallucination might be psychologically different kinds of experience, which nonetheless both make it the case that it seems to the subject to be a certain way. The core disjunctive claim is therefore that “we should understand statements about how things appear to a perceiver to be equivalent to a disjunction that either one is perceiving such and such or one is suffering a … hallucination; and that such statements are not to be viewed as introducing a report of a distinctive mental event or state common to these various disjoint situations. (Martin 2004: 37).
In insisting that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are mental states of different kinds, the disjunctivist takes on the explanatory burden of giving an account of how two experiences could be indistinguishable without being experiences of the same kind. Given this, what might lead someone to endorse disjunctivism? We shall consider specific arguments for disjunctivism in section 4, but for present purposes it will suffice to note that the typical motivation has been to make room for a “naïve realist” theory of veridical experience. The naïve realist claims that, in the good cases, external objects and their properties “partly constitute one’s conscious experience” (Martin 1997: 83) and thereby “shape the contours of the subject’s conscious experience” (Martin 2004: 64). So naïve realism entails disjunctivism: if naïve realism is true, then the kind of mental state that is involved in a veridical perception – a mental state that relates the subject to elements of the mind-independent environment – could not be involved in a hallucinatory situation. The hallucinatory state must therefore be of a different kind. A defence of naïve realism therefore requires a defence of disjunctivism.
As there is such an intimate connection between disjunctivism and naïve realism, some theorists have actually incorporated naïve realism about the good cases into the very definition of disjunctivism. Paul Snowdon, one of the names most closely associated with the theory, takes disjunctivism to involve the claim that: “the experience in a genuinely perceptual case has a different nature to the experience involved in a non-perceptual case. It is not exhausted, however, by the simple denial of a common nature, but involves also the characterisation of the difference between the perceptual and non-perceptual in terms of the different constituents of the experiences involved. The experience in the perceptual case in its nature reaches out to and involves the perceived external object, not so the experience in other cases.” (2005: 136-7; for a similar formulation, see Sturgeon 2006: 187). However, despite the fact that naïve realism entails the denial of the common kind thesis, the denial of the common kind thesis does not entail naïve realism. For this reason, I think it makes taxonomic sense to restrict the label “disjunctivist” to theories that deny that there is a common factor to indistinguishable cases of veridical perception and hallucination. Yet of course, as naïve realism entails disjunctivism, an argument for naïve realism is thereby also an argument for disjunctivism. We will come back to this when considering motivations for disjunctivism in section 4. Before we do this, however, we need to take a moment to look closely at the claim that veridical perception and hallucination share a common component.
The reason for caution is that, if we read this claim as holding that veridical perception and hallucination have nothing in common whatsoever, then it is surely false. As we have already seen, a veridical perception of an F and a hallucination of an F have at least this in common: they are both visual experiences of an F / cases of seeming to see an F. So the “no common factor” claim must be read as allowing that they have something in common. This, however, raises an important question. In what respects can the mental states involved in veridical perception and hallucination be the same and the theory remain a version of disjunctivism? This opens up the possibility of different types of disjunctivism.
For example, Byrne and Logue formulate a version of disjunctivism they call epistemological disjunctivism, which is disjunctivist about perceptual evidence (2008: 66). That is, the epistemological disjunctivist denies that one’s perceptual evidence is the same across indistinguishable cases of veridical perception and hallucination. As Snowdon puts it, “we can divide cases where it is true that it appears to the subject as if P into two sorts; one is where the subject is in a position to know that P, in that the fact that P is manifested to him, and others where the subject is in a position to know merely that it appears to be P” (2005: 140). On both Byrne and Logue’s presentation and Snowdon’s, epistemological disjunctivism is consistent with the two experiences having substantial commonalities. As Snowdon asks, “why cannot a single basic sort of (inner) experience have quite different epistemological significance in different cases, depending, say, on the context and on facts about causation?” (ibid.)
Epistemological disjunctivism, then, leaves room for veridical perception and hallucination to be of the same metaphysical kind, so long as they do not have the same epistemological status. More robust versions of disjunctivism will go on to reject the claim that veridical perception and hallucination are of the same metaphysical kind. For example, we might define “metaphysical disjunctivism” as the claim that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are different kinds of mental states in as much as they have different constituents, or different supervenience bases. Yet as Byrne and Logue point out, even this seems to be compatible with the two mental states having something in common. Thus they introduce the “moderate view” (2008: 71), which accepts that the good cases and bad cases “are different in significant mental respects, despite having a common mental element,” where this common mental element is in the picture to ground the phenomenal similarity of the two states. A yet more robust version of disjunctivism, then, holds that, despite cases of veridical perception and hallucination both being cases in which it seems to the subject as if P, they nonetheless do not have even phenomenal character in common.
In an attempt to impose some order, Martin characterizes disjunctivism as committed to the claim that the “most fundamental kind that the perceptual event is of, the kind in virtue of which the event has the nature that it does, is one which couldn’t be instanced in the case of hallucination.” (2004: 60). They key notion here is that of a “fundamental kind” – the kind in virtue of which the event has the nature it does. How do we determine the fundamental kind a particular mental state or event belongs to? By determining the “most specific answer to the question, ‘What is it?’” (2006: 361). So, for example, take our veridical experience of a bar stool. If the common kind theory were correct, then the “best candidate for the fundamental or essential kind” of both a veridical perception of a bar stool and a hallucination of a bar stool would be that they are both instances of the kind: experience (as) of a bar stool. Disjunctivism, however, allows that the “best candidate for the fundamental or essential kind” of a veridical perception of a bar stool is that it is an instance of the kind: veridical perception of a bar stool. Hallucinations, of course, do not belong to this kind (2004: 72). We will discuss the kinds that hallucinations do belong to in section 6.2.
So we have a number of different varieties of disjunctivism available; varieties that differ in the degree of similarities that the mental states involved in veridical perception and hallucination are allowed to share. However, as we shall see in the next section, not every type of disjunctivism just discussed will successfully legitimate the various motivations that have been cited as reasons for endorsing disjunctivism.
Before we move onto reasons to think that disjunctivism is true, it is worth noting that its first outing post-Hinton was in fact as a component of an argument, due to Paul Snowdon, against the Causal Theory of Perception. But this argument does not require the truth of disjunctivism, merely its conceptual coherence, for which reason I mention it only briefly. The causal theory claims that “it is a conceptual requirement that, necessarily, if P (a subject) sees O (an object) then O is causally responsible for an experience (call it E) undergone by (or had by) P” where “experiences are amongst the events, the intrinsic natures of which are independent of anything outside the subject” (Snowdon 1990: 123). So the causal theory is committed, not only to a common factor conception of experiences, but also to the claim that this is a conceptual truth – something “immediately acknowledgeable by any person, whatever their education, who can count as having the concept in question” (1980: 176). Essentially, Snowdon’s argument consists in arguing that, even if disjunctivism turns out to be false, it will only be “scientifically established facts about perceptual and hallucinatory processes” that disprove it (1990: 130). But these are results that the man on the street could not be expected to know merely in virtue of having the concept of perception. So even if it is false, disjunctivism is not a conceptual falsehood and therefore the second claim of the causal theory – that the intrinsic nature of the experience a subject has when perceiving an object is independent of anything outside the subject – is not a conceptual truth as the causal theorist requires.
As Snowdon’s argument does not require the truth of disjunctivism, we still have been given no arguments for the thesis. One salient motivation has to do with epistemology. Consider a sceptical argument that runs as follows. When we hallucinate, the kind of experience we have clearly fails to put us in a position to know anything about the external world. The experience we have in the case of a veridical perception indistinguishable from this hallucination is an experience of the same kind. As the bad case experience fails to put us in a position to acquire knowledge, having the same kind of experience in the good case cannot place us in a better epistemic position. So even when we have veridical experiences, we are not in a position to know anything about the external world.
Disjunctivism offers to block this argument by denying the premise that the experience we have when we veridically perceive is the same as the experience we have when we hallucinate. This would not, of course, prove that we do know anything about the external world, merely that such knowledge is not impossible. Yet this would block the sceptic from using the impossibility of knowledge as a premise in an argument for this conclusion. In response, the disjunctivist’s opponent may point out that, given the acknowledged indistinguishability of veridical perception and hallucination, we cannot know, on any given occasion, whether we are hallucinating or perceiving veridically. So it is not after all clear that disjunctivism does provide any epistemic advantages. The disjunctivist might then reply that this misses the point. It is not that disjunctivism offers an argument to prove that we do have knowledge, rather it offers a rebuttal to an argument that we cannot. To illustrate this, consider the familiar sceptical claim that all of our experiences might have been just as they are even if we were in the clutches of Descartes’ demon. If the disjunctivist is correct, this is no longer possible – if any of my experiences are in fact veridical, then they could not have been as they are misleading. Suppose, then, that the sceptic were to reformulate the sceptical hypothesis as follows: all of your experiences might have been of the misleading kind. Now we can ask, so what? As long as they are not misleading, then many of our empirical beliefs will be justified. As McDowell puts it, this leaves the door open for us to hold that “our knowledge that [the sceptical] possibilities do not obtain is sustained by the fact that we know a great deal about our environment” (2008: 379).
An interesting question about the epistemological motivation for disjunctivism is that of which variety of disjunctivism it requires. In one sense, it clearly requires epistemological disjunctivism, according to which good cases and bad cases differ in epistemological significance. Yet having said this, we might also wonder to what extent two experiences that are the same in significant respects might be plausibly held to provide different levels of perceptual evidence. Could two experiences with the same constituents and phenomenal character be claimed to be significantly epistemologically different? If not, what about experiences that are metaphysically different but phenomenally similar? Or does the claim of significant epistemological difference require the most robust version of disjunctivism: phenomenal disjunctivism? The answers given to these questions will in turn depend on one’s position on other questions in epistemology, such as the nature of justification. For example, an externalist about justification can easily allow that two experiences that are metaphysically similar can differ in epistemological significance, yet one inclined to internalism about justification may need to go all the way to a phenomenal disjunctivism. How compelling we find the epistemological motivation will therefore depend on a range of other issues.
Another argument that has been used to support disjunctivism is that, unlike common factor theories, it is not required to “attribute to responsible subjects potential infallibility about the course of their experiences” (2004: 51). This argument turns on what is required for a particular experiential occurrence to count as a “visual experience”, where this category includes veridical perceptions and hallucinations.
Martin begins by asking us to consider a veridical perception of a bar stool and a perfectly indiscriminable hallucination of such. Now ask, in virtue of what do these both count as experiences of a bar stool? According to the common factor theorist, veridical perceptions are experiences with certain positive characteristics that are both necessary and sufficient for that perception to qualify as an experience of a bar stool. Then, “when I come to recognize the possibility of perfect hallucination just like my current perception, what I do is both recognize the presence of these characteristics … in virtue of which this event is such an experience, and also recognize that an event’s possessing these characteristics is independent of whether the event is a perception or not.” (2004: 47). According to Martin’s kind of disjunctivist, however, nothing more needs to be said; something is an experience of a bar stool just in case it is indiscriminable from a veridical perception of a bar stool.
With these two explanations in hand, Martin then points out that as of yet, “nothing rules out as possible a situation in which [these positive characteristics] are absent but in which a subject would be unable to discriminate through reflection this situation from one in which a [bar stool] was really being seen.” (2004: 49). Now the disjunctivist’s conception of what is required for an event to qualify as visual experience would allow us to count such an event as an experience (as) of a bar stool simply in virtue of the fact that it is indiscriminable from a veridical perception of a bar stool. The alternative conception, however, could not count this as a visual experience. In order to rule out the possibility of such cases, Martin therefore suggests that the disjunctivist’s opponent will have to assume that a careful subject simply cannot fail to recognize the presence of positive characteristics when they are present, or the absence of such characteristics when they are absent. Thus unlike the disjunctivist, the common factor theorist has to immodestly attribute to subjects substantive epistemic powers. Disjunctivism is therefore a more modest and hence preferable theory.
Another set of motivations for disjunctivism turn on the fact, noted in section 2 above, that naïve realism requires disjunctivism, and that naïve realism is the view of the ‘common man’ or, as Martin puts it, that it “best articulates how sensory experience seems to us to be just through reflection” (2006: 354). Yet as Hawthorne and Kovakovich point out, if it is true that the common man does indeed have a view of visual experience, which in itself is not obvious, it is unlikely to be specific enough to decide between philosophical theories of perception. For example, whatever force this motivation carries turns on the idea that the common man would endorse the naïve realist’s theory of the good cases. But it is entirely possible that the common man would also have views about, say, the nature of hallucination or the relationship between consciousness and the brain that are inconsistent with this view. If this were to be the case, then the appeal to the common man may well be indecisive. Finally, Hawthorne and Kovakovich argue that there would not be “much point in pursuing the philosophy of perception in a setting where it is assumed that [common sense] commitments will survive philosophical and scientific reflection. After all, we shouldn’t think that vulgar common sense has seen in advance how to handle various challenges to its commitments” (2006: 180)
Despite these difficulties, Benj Hellie has recently offered a phenomenological argument in favour of naïve realism. This argument turns on the premise that, “a judgment about an experience to the fact that it is F based on phenomenological study [by experts, under ideal circumstances] will be accurate” (2007a: 267). He then lists a number of judgments from such experts on phenomenological study, which he claims embody judgments that veridical visual experience is naïve realist in character. To give a flavour of these quotes, consider Levine’s claim that the “ripe tomato seems immediately present to me in experience […] The world is just there” (2006: 179) and Campbell’s claim that “the phenomenal character of your experience … is constituted by the layout of the room itself” (2002: 116).
An alternative phenomenological motivation is also developed by Martin. This motivation is distinctive, however, in that it turns on the phenomenology of sensory visual imagination rather than that of visual perception per se (2002: 402-19). In brief, Martin argues first for the Dependency Thesis – that imagining X = imagining experiencing X – and then for the claim that to imagine experiencing is to imagine how things would be immediately presented to us in such an experience. He then argues that the naïve realist can give a much better account of this imagined immediacy than can a representationalist because, according to naïve realism, the immediacy of a visual experience of X is explained by X’s being presented to the subject. So in imagining an experience of X, one thereby imagines X being presented to the subject and immediacy follows. The representationalist’s account of visual immediacy, on the other hand, turns on the fact that the attitude the subject bears to the relevant content is stative – i.e. committal to the truth of the content – whereas, in imagination, one does not bear a stative attitude to the imagined content. One “is not thereby in a state whose attitudinative aspect would give rise to the phenomenon of immediacy” (2002: 415). According to Martin, naïve realism therefore gives the correct account of the phenomenology of sensory visual imagination.
John Campbell (2002) has argued that a naïve realist conception of experience is a requirement for the very possibility of having thoughts about mind-independent objects at all. Campbell’s contention is that, if you are to know what my use of a demonstrative expression refers to, you have to be able to consciously single out the relevant object, an ability that requires a naïve realist conception of conscious visual experience. To illustrate this, Campbell uses an example of a party where you ask me questions about ‘that woman’. Even if it turns out that I can make reliable guesses about what the woman is wearing, drinking, and so on, Campbell suggests that if I cannot consciously pick out the woman you are talking about, then I do not know to whom you are referring (2002: 8-9). He concludes that conscious (visual) attention is therefore ordinarily required for us to have knowledge of the reference of demonstratives. This therefore places a condition on an adequate account of visual experience – it must explain how it can be the source of this kind of knowledge. Campbell then asks: what would experience have to be like for it to play the role of grounding our knowledge of the reference of a demonstrative? He then argues that, to know the reference of a demonstrative, we must interpret the demonstrative as “referring to a categorical object, not merely a collection of potentialities” (2002: 145). To see why, suppose I do have the ability to reliably guess what the woman you are talking about is eating, drinking and wearing. If all there was to knowing the reference of a demonstrative was to be aware of the various potentialities that the object has, I would therefore know the reference of your use of ‘that woman’. Yet as we saw, I do not know the reference of your demonstrative. What is missing, Campbell suggests, is experience of why these potentialities exist – experience of the categorical object that grounds these potentialities. So if experience is to explain our knowledge of demonstrative reference, then an adequate analysis of experience must account for the fact that experience is experience of the categorical. This is just the kind of account that is offered by naïve realism.
As we have seen, as the truth of naïve realism entails the truth of disjunctivism, then arguments for naïve realism are thereby arguments for disjunctivism. And indeed, the majority of arguments for disjunctivism appear therefore to require the most robust phenomenal version of the thesis. Yet as the entailment does not go in the other direction, an objection to naïve realism is not, thereby, an objection to disjunctivism. This section focuses only on objections to disjunctivism itself. For objections to naïve realism – objections, the success of which may remove some or all of the motivations for being a disjunctivist — see Objects of Perception.
As an argument against disjunctivism, the causal argument starts from the obvious truth that, in order for perceiving to take place, there must be chains of causation from the perceived object to the subject’s sense organs, and then to the subject’s brain. A simple version of the causal argument proceeds as follows. At the end of this causal chain is an experience. Suppose then that the intermediate stages of the causal chain were activated in a nonstandard manner – say, by direct stimulation of the brain. So long as the later stages of the causal chain were as they would have been in the good case, the same kind of experience will result. But this is just to say that the same kind of experience can be caused in both good cases and bad cases, contra disjunctivism.
As expressed here, this argument turns on a principle we might call the “same immediate cause – same effect” principle. It asserts that, so long as the neural stage in the causal chain prior to the experience is the same then, no matter whether that prior stage was produced by external objects or internal misfirings, the effect – the experience – will be the same in both cases. The issue then becomes one of whether or not we should accept this principle. And there are reasons to think that we should not. To adapt an example from Dretske, if forgers managed to reproduce the machine that prints legitimate banknotes, the banknotes the forgers print on it will still be counterfeit, even though the immediate “cause” of these banknotes is the same as the immediate “cause” of genuine currency. Or, to take a more philosophical example, considerations familiar from the work of Putnam (1975) suggests that what makes my thoughts about water is not a feature of their immediate causes, but their distal causes. So there are reasons why we might dispute the “same immediate cause – same effect” principle when the effects in question are taken to be experiences.
For this reason, some opponents of disjunctivism have resorted to a weaker version of the principle. A.D. Smith, for example, insists that “it is surely not open to serious question that [the same immediate cause – same effect principle] does apply with respect to the merely sensory character of conscious states” (2002: 203). Here is a nice passage in which this contention is laid out in detail.
Distal environmental causes generate experiential effects only by generating more immediate links in the causal chains between themselves and experience, namely, physical stimulations in the body’s sensory receptors … These states and processes causally generate experiential effects only by generating still more immediate links in the causal chains between themselves and experience – namely, afferent neural impulses, resulting from transduction at the sites of the sensory receptors on the body. Your mental intercourse with the world is mediated by sensory and motor transducers at the periphery of your central nervous system. Your conscious experience would be phenomenally just the same even if the transducer-external causes and effects of your brain’s afferent and efferent neural activity were radically different from what they are” (Horgan and Tienson 2002: 526-7).
The contention here is that, even if there are reasons to think that changes in a subject’s environment would affect the overall nature of the mental state that results from the same type of neural stimulation (perhaps because it could make a “seeing of water” experience into a “seeing of twater” experience), the “conscious [aspects of the] experience would be phenomenally just the same”. This result, of course, would suffice to refute the phenomenal version of disjunctivism, if not the thesis in its metaphysical and epistemological forms. Again, though, for this argument to succeed, the weaker principle – that “same immediate cause – same effect” is true for the phenomenal aspects of mental states – must be found to be acceptable. One consideration that has been cited in its favour is that it provides an explanation of how indiscriminable hallucinations are possible at all: “if it were not the case that perceptual processes, however stimulated, were sufficient to generate experience, it would be a mystery why [veridical-seeming] hallucinations should occur” (Robinson 1994: 152). However the legitimacy of this motivation can be challenged.
Even if the causal argument in this form is rejected, the disjunctivist is still not out of the woods. Suppose the kind of neural replication appealed to by the causal argument is at least possible in principle. And suppose, too, that the mental upshot of such neural replication would be an indistinguishable hallucination. Most theorists, I think, would accept these two plausible claims. Yet if they are accepted, the disjunctivist is still in difficulty, even though we haven’t yet mentioned the phenomenal character of the experiences. The problem is this. If an indiscriminable hallucination is produced by neural replication, then we might think that there must be an explanation of this indiscriminability: that the hallucinatory experience must have a property – call it property I – that explains why the hallucination is mistaken for a veridical experience. But in these neural replication situations – Martin calls them “causally matching” hallucinations (2004: 60) – it must be that the neural activity alone suffices for the experience to have property I. Now, if the same neural activity takes place in a case of veridical perception, then it would also suffice for the veridical experience to have property I. But then the disjunctivist’s opponent can argue as follows.
We have already accepted that property I – whatever this property may be – accounts for the fact that the hallucinatory experience seems, to its subject, just like a veridical perception. Now for the reasons just given, veridical experiences also have property I, together with whatever special phenomenal character they have by virtue of being veridical. But so long as I suffices to explain why the hallucination is taken to be a veridical experience, then I also ought to suffice to explain why the veridical perception is taken to be a veridical experience. Property I would therefore seem to “screen off” whatever additional characteristics the veridical experience may have from having any explanatory import. The disjunctivist needs to be aware of this threat in developing theories of hallucination as we shall see.
This objection takes, as a starting point, the idea that for any possible veridical perception, there is a hallucination that ‘matches’ or ‘corresponds’ to that veridical perception – the hallucination that would, from the subject’s point of view, seem just like that veridical perception. The challenge for the disjunctivist is to give an account of what this correspondence amounts to. Farkas puts the challenge this way:
take a particular veridical perception (VP) of a teacup in front of me, and the corresponding hallucination (H). H is not a perception of the teacup – but this is true of many other events as well. What else do we have to say about H to make sure that it is the hallucination corresponding to the VP in question? (2006: 205-6).
One plausible answer to this question, suggests Farkas, is that both good cases and bad cases have to “involve the same phenomenal properties” (2006: 207). Yet as she points out, this answer has “a metaphysical character,” indeed one that commits us to the existence of something that the two cases have in common. This is, therefore, an answer that the phenomenal disjunctivist, at least, cannot endorse. Farkas then goes on to canvas a number of non-metaphysical answers to this question and argues that they all fail to provide a plausible response. The conclusion drawn is that the only way we can provide an adequate account of what it is for a hallucination to correspond to a veridical perception of a particular kind is to accept, contra phenomenal disjunctivism at least, that the two states have something metaphysical in common.
Thus far we have seen that the disjunctivist has a negative claim to make about hallucination: that it is not an experience of the same kind as a veridical perception. But what else can the disjunctivist say about hallucination?
The positive disjunctivist insists that there is a positive story to tell about the nature of the hallucinatory state. For example, one might insist that hallucination involves the awareness of something other than external objects – some object proxy, if you will. Michael Thau (2004: 195) suggests that this is the form of disjunctivism advocated by John McDowell. In presenting his disjunctive position, McDowell suggests that “an appearance that such-and-such is the case can be either a mere appearance or the fact that such-and-such is the case making itself perceptually manifest to someone” (1982: 472). Immediately following this presentation, McDowell goes on to say that “mere appearances” are the objects of deceptive experiences. So McDowell’s complete picture looks to be one on which we have one kind of experiential relation to two different kinds of objects: “facts made manifest” in the perceptual case, and “mere appearances” in the hallucinatory ones.
A related view is presented by Mark Johnston (2004), although it is unclear whether or not it really qualifies as a variant of disjunctivism. Johnston contends that, when we have a veridical visual experience, we are aware of an instantiated sensible profile: “a complex, partly qualitative and partly relational property, which exhausts the way the particular scene before your eyes is” (2004: 134). Importantly, the sensible profile that we are aware of, says Johnston, is a type not a token; had we stood before an array of different particulars instantiating the same sensible profile, what we are aware of – the sensible profile – would have been the same. Then, when you have a hallucination that is indiscriminable from this experience, “you are simply aware of the partly qualitative, partly relational profile. … When the visual system misfires, as in hallucination, it presents uninstantiated complexes of sensible qualities and relations” (2004: 135).
On Johnston’s view, there are, then, clear similarities between good cases and bad cases – in particular, in both cases the subject is aware of the same sensible profile. Yet there are important differences too. “When we see,” says Johnston, “we are aware of instantiations of sensible profiles. When we hallucinate we are aware merely of the structured qualitative parts of such sensible profiles. Any case of hallucination is thus a case of “direct” visual awareness of less than one would be “directly” aware of in the case of seeing” (2004: 137 emphasis added). The objects of hallucination are therefore “proper parts” of the objects of seeing (140). So Johnston’s view seems best described as a variant of the moderate view outlined in section 3 above. The difficulty faced by positive views is that they flirt with the screening off problem just noted. Focusing on the McDowellian view first, suppose that a certain pattern of neural activity suffices for one to be aware of “mere appearances” in the bad cases. But then, what about the same neural activity that occurs in the good case? If it is claimed that this does not suffice for awareness of mere appearances, then we might wonder why, “if the mechanism or brain state is a sufficient causal condition for the production of an image, or otherwise characterised subjective sense-content, when the [objects] are not there, why is it not so sufficient when they are present? Does the brain state mysteriously know how it is being produced … or does the [object], when present, inhibit the production of an image by some sort of action at a distance?” (Robinson 1994: 153-4). Yet if we do accept that the pattern of neural activity also suffices for the subject to be aware of “mere appearances” in the good cases, then as these suffice to explain how things are from the subject’s perspective in the bad cases, they should likewise suffice in the good cases. But if this is so, then an appeal to the subject’s being aware of “facts made manifest” in the good cases seems superfluous, at least for the purposes of characterizing how things are from the subject’s perspective.
It is less clear how Johnston’s view fares here. At a point in his paper, he asks: “Why isn’t awareness of a sensible profile a common act of awareness as between seeing and hallucination? It may be held to be … But it does seem that once we adopt the act/object treatment of visual experience it is more natural to individuate an act of awareness occurring at a time in terms of an object that includes all that one is aware of in the relevant time” (2004: 171). Given that, as noted above, the perceiver is aware of more than the hallucinator (in that the perceiver is aware of the particulars that instantiate the sensible profile whilst the hallucinator is aware of the sensible profile alone), his suggestion seems to be that, when we account for the perceiver’s awareness of the particulars, we thereby account for the perceiver’s awareness of the sensible profile. There is then no need to introduce an additional awareness of an (uninstantiated) sensible profile. Yet this may not convince his opponents. The objection remains: if neural activity suffices for awareness of an uninstantiated sensible profile in the bad cases, it should suffice in the good cases too, whether or not we need to appeal to this to explain the fact that the subject is aware of a sensible profile at all. So Johnston’s view may also be threatened by the screening off worry, even if it is in the sense that a subject’s awareness of a particular sensible profile is overdetermined.
It is this concern – that any positive account of hallucination will play into the hands of the screening off objection – that motivates some disjunctivists to provide an essentially negative account of hallucination. In answer to the question, “What else can the disjunctivist say about hallucination?”, the negative disjunctivist says, nothing else – all that we can say about indiscriminable hallucinations is that they are not veridical perceptions but are indiscriminable from them. This approach is most closely associated with the work of M.G.F. Martin.
Given the threat of the screening off worry, Martin investigates whether there are any limitations to the general principle that common properties screen special properties off from being causally efficacious and concludes that there are. Consider the property of being an unattended bag in an airport, which causes a security alert. Sometimes objects with this property are harmless, but sometimes they contain a bomb. Now ask: does the property common to harmless and non-harmless objects – that of being an unattended bag in an airport – screen off the non-common property of being a bomb in an airport from being explanatory? Not at all. Instead, the only reason the common property of being an unattended bag in an airport has the explanatory role it does is because, sometimes, this property is correlated with the special property of being a bomb in an airport. In such a case, we can say that the explanatory potential of the common property of being an unattended bag in airport is “inherited from” or “dependent upon” the explanatory potential of the special property of being a bomb in an airport. As Martin concludes, common properties with “inherited or dependent explanatory potential offer us exceptions to the general model of common properties screening off special ones” (2004: 70).
In the discussion of Martin’s claim that disjunctivism is a more “modest” theory of visual experience than a common factor theory (section 4.2), we saw that Martin’s kind of disjunctivist accepts that a hallucination of a certain kind has the property of being indiscriminable from a veridical perception. Now although such indiscriminability properties are common to both good cases and bad cases – a veridical perception of an F is indiscriminable from itself – whatever explanatory potential indiscriminability properties have is inherited from the explanatory potential of the associated veridical experience.
Why did James shriek like that? He was in a situation indiscriminable from the veridical perception of a spider. Given James’s fear of spiders, when confronted with one he is liable so to react; and with no detectable difference between this situation and such a perception, it must seem to him as if a spider is there, so he reacts in the same way. (2004: 68).
Martin therefore suggests that, if the screening off worry is to be avoided, the disjunctivist must characterize the hallucinatory state purely negatively – must say that “when it comes to a mental characterization of the hallucinatory experience, nothing more can be said than the relational and epistemological claim that it is indiscriminable from the perception” (2004: 72). So whilst there is a kind which is shared by hallucination and veridical perception – the kind: being indiscriminable from a veridical perception – only for hallucinations is this their most fundamental kind. Where veridical perceptions are concerned, “being a veridical perception of a tree is a better candidate for being its fundamental or essential kind than being indiscriminable from being such a veridical perception” (2004: 72). This is how Martin avoids the screening off objection.
Negative disjunctivism is also endorsed by Brewer (2008: 173) and Fish (2008). Fish does say a little more on the question of what it is that makes hallucinations indiscriminable from veridical perceptions, however. According to Fish, for a hallucination to be indiscriminable from a veridical perception of a certain kind is for it to generate the same kinds of introspective beliefs that a veridical perception of that kind would have generated. Consider again James’s veridical experience of a spider. Normally, this would lead James to believe that he sees a spider. A hallucination qualifies as indiscriminable from such a veridical perception if it also yields such beliefs. It is the presence of these beliefs that then explains why hallucinating subjects behave as they do: as a hallucination of a spider leads James to believe that he sees a spider (by definition), so James will therefore react in the way he would if he really did see a spider.
Given the negative disjunctivist’s characterization of the hallucinatory state as a state that is indiscriminable from a veridical perception of a certain kind, a lot hangs on the way in which the key notion of indiscriminability is understood. In discussing these issues, Martin suggests that a hallucination of an F “is such that it is not possible to know through reflection that it is not one of the veridical perceptions [of an F]” (2006: 364). We can therefore define indiscriminability as follows: x is indiscriminable from a veridical perception of an F if and only if x is such that it is not possible to know through reflection that it is not a veridical perception of an F. There are two key features of this definition that have been the source of objections. First, the restriction to the relevant knowledge being acquired ‘through reflection’; second, the question of how to interpret the modality present in ‘not possible to know’.
One way of coming to know that your experience is not a veridical perception of an F is by testimony. However, Martin suggests that, even if you know that your experience is not veridical in this way, it might still qualify as indistinguishable from a veridical perception. He therefore introduces the ‘through reflection’ clause in order to rule out knowledge from testimony as a defeater for indistinguishability (2006: 364-5). Sturgeon, however, argues that it is far from straightforward to spell out just what information should be disqualified by not being available ‘through reflection’(2006: 208-10). On the one hand, he suggests that the ‘through reflection’ restriction must be strong enough to rule out any of the routes by which a hallucinating subject might ‘figure out’ that they are hallucinating and hence must be taken to stipulate that the “information involved in background beliefs cannot be generally available to reflection …. Otherwise the possibility of everyday knowledge of [hallucination] will slip through the net [and] count as knowledge obtainable by reflection” (2006: 209).
On the other hand, he points out that when one hallucinates an F, one is thereby in a position to know a vast array of things. As a hallucination of an F is discriminable from veridical experiences of Gs, Hs, and Js, Martin’s definition of indiscriminability will require that, for each case, a subject hallucinating an F can know, by reflection alone, that his experience is not one of these veridical experiences. But Sturgeon suggests that this “is a huge amount of knowledge to be got solely by reflection … and not by reflection on the visual character of [the hallucination], recall. … The only way that could be true, I submit, is if background beliefs were generally available to reflection on context” (2006: 210). With these two results, Sturgeon presents Martin with a dilemma. On the one hand, to rule out the possibility we might simply use our background beliefs to figure out that we are hallucinating, the ‘through reflection’ clause must restrain us from making use of background beliefs. Yet on the other, to make sense of all the reflective knowledge Martin’s theory allows that we are in a position to acquire when we hallucinate, the ‘through reflection’ clause must allow us to make use of background beliefs. But this, suggests Sturgeon, is just to say that Martin cannot give an adequate account of the ‘through reflection’ restriction.
Another source of objections has stemmed from Martin’s interpretation of the ‘not possibly knowable’ condition. The concern is that we want to allow that creatures that lack the sophistication to know things might nonetheless have hallucinations. But given the centrality of the notion of knowledge in Martin’s definition of indistinguishability, if a creature cannot know things at all, then for any hallucination it might have, the creature cannot know that it is not veridically perceiving an F, or a G, or an H, and so on. So all hallucinations will be such that, for the creature, they will qualify as indiscriminable from each and every kind of creature perception.
In discussing this concern, Martin insists that whilst a creature “might fail to discriminate one experience from another, making no judgment about them as identical or distinct at all, that is not to say that we cannot judge, in ascribing to them such experience, that there is an event which would or would not be judgeably different from another experience” (2004: 54). In other words, Martin suggests that “not possibly known” should not be interpreted personally, such that a specific creature’s capacities are relevant to the question of what qualifies as being possible to know, but rather in an impersonal way. So in saying that a hallucination is not possibly known to be distinct from a veridical perception of a certain kind, Martin does not mean not possibly known by the subject but rather, not possibly known in some impersonal sense.
Siegel argues that this claim faces the crucial problem of explaining how we can pick out the hallucinatory ‘experience’ – the state or event that is reflected upon – in an appropriate yet non question-begging manner (2008: 212). Given Martin’s view, the state or event cannot be picked out in virtue of its having any robust features as this would conflict with the claim that nothing more can be said of the hallucination than that it is indiscriminable from the veridical perception. Yet we cannot pick out the relevant state in virtue of its indiscriminability property either. As we are trying to explain what it is for a state of the creature’s to have the indiscriminability property in the first place, we cannot get a fix on which state we are talking about by appeal to its being the one that has that property.
Fish’s view diverges from Martin’s on both of these questions. Where Martin endorses an impersonal sense of indiscriminability, Fish endorses a personal sense; where Martin rules out testimony, Fish rules it in. This does mean, of course, that Fish foregoes Martin’s explanations of the indiscriminability of both animal hallucinations and hallucinations in which the subject is aware that they are hallucinating. In the case of animal hallucinations, Fish responds by extending the claim that indiscriminability requires sameness of introspective beliefs to the claim that indiscriminability requires sameness of cognitive effects, where both behaviour and (in conceptually sophisticated creatures) introspective beliefs qualify as a species of cognitive effect. Then, where animals are concerned, a hallucination can qualify as indiscriminable from a veridical perception of a certain kind so long as it yields the kinds of behaviour that a veridical perception of that kind would have yielded.
When it comes to known hallucinations, Fish contends that we do not have to rule out testimony so long as we relativize the relevant effects to the overall cognitive context the subject is in. Consider a situation in which a subject is hallucinating but comes to believe, through testimony, that their experience is hallucinatory and therefore does not form the belief that they see something. Fish asks us to consider what would be the effects of a veridical perception of the relevant kind in a parallel situation in which a subject believes, through testimony, that they are hallucinating. He suggests that, in such a case, a veridical perception would likewise fail to yield the relevant kinds of belief. On these grounds, he therefore contends that the hallucination would still have the same cognitive effects as a veridical perception would have had, and thereby qualifies as indiscriminable from that perception.
Siegel also objects to Fish’s version of negative disjunctivism by pointing out that relativizing cognitive effects to particular contexts has an unappealing consequence: that there will be contexts in which even a veridical perception would not lead a subject to believe that they saw something. But in such cases, she contends, a hallucination that had the same effects as this veridical perception would have had will lack the resources to explain how this hallucination has a felt reality (2008: 217). Likewise, she contends that an animal that was lethargic or sick might have a hallucination and fail to engage in any kind of behaviour at all. Once again, Fish’s view doesn’t appear to have the resources to accommodate this.
So given the different approaches to the bad case of hallucination, what can the disjunctivist say about the bad case of illusion? The two obvious possibilities are to place illusion into one of the two disjuncts that we already have: to treat illusions as either like hallucinations or like veridical perceptions.
McDowell seems to endorse the former approach. Recall his claim that “an appearance that such-and-such is the case can be either a mere appearance or the fact that such-and-such is the case making itself perceptually manifest to someone” (1982/1998: 386-7). As the veridical disjunct contains cases in which a “fact” is made manifest then, given that there is no such thing as a non-obtaining fact, any scenario in which it appears to the subject that such-and-such is the case when it is not could not be a case of a fact being made manifest. So illusions looks to fall into the category of cases in which it merely appears as though a fact is made manifest along with hallucinations.
However, there are concerns with an attempt to treat illusions as hallucinations. Robinson protests that, “if all non-veridical perceptions were treated in the same way as hallucinations, then every case of something not looking exactly as it is would be a case in which one was aware of some kind of subjective content. Only perfectly veridical perceptions would be free of such subjective contents” (1994: 159). This leads A.D. Smith to ridicule the view: the “picture of our daily commerce with the world through perception that therefore emerges is one of a usually indirect awareness of physical objects occasionally interrupted by direct visions of them glimpsed in favoured positions” (2002: 28).
So perhaps we would do better to bring illusion under the perceptual, rather than the hallucinatory, disjunct. The key disjunctions offered by both Snowdon and Child suggest they would prefer this approach. As illusions involve situations in which something does look to be F to a subject, but where that thing – the thing that looks to be F – is not really F, the fact that both Snowdon and Child characterize the perceptual disjunct as containing cases in which something looks to S to be F suggests that they view this disjunct as containing illusions as well as veridical perceptions.
Now of course, if illusion is treated as a special case of veridical perception, then the specific way in which illusion is treated will be dictated by the theory of the good cases. Yet as we are treating disjunctivism as not being committed to any particular theory of the good cases, this doesn’t yet tell us much about illusion. However, it is worth noting that, as one of the most significant motivations for disjunctivism is to make room for a naïve realist account of the good cases, as illusions are cases in which objects look to be a way that they are not, on the face of it, this approach to illusion would not obviously be available to a disjunctivist who also wanted to be a naïve realist about the good cases.
Having said this, in a recent paper, Brewer develops an account of illusion that treats it as a special case of veridical perception, understood in broadly naïve realist terms. Brewer’s view of good case experience is that “the core subjective character of perceptual experience is given simply by citing the physical object which is its mind-independent direct object.” (2008: 171). But how, we might think, could we give an analogous account of the core subjective character of illusion? Well, suggests Brewer, when seen from different points of view and/or in different circumstances, a certain kind of external object/property may have “visually relevant similarities” with paradigms of other kinds of object/property. These visually relevant similarities may lead us to take the kind of object/property we see to be an instance of the kind for which those visual features are paradigm – a kind that the object/property is not, in fact, a member of.
To grasp the notion of a kind for which certain visual features are paradigm, consider the process of learning concepts. Our parents or teachers guide our acquisition of kind concepts by making paradigm instances of those kinds salient. To teach a child the meaning of the term, “red,” for example, we do not show the child a red object in darkness, or make the child wear unusually colored spectacles; we show the child the red object in conditions in which it will be seen as paradigmatically red. This is because, in these conditions, the object has visual features that are paradigm for the kind: red.
Brewer then shows how this can accommodate various kinds of illusion – in this case, an illusion of color:
a white piece of chalk illuminated with red light looks red. The … proposal is that the core of the subjective character of such illusory experience is constituted by that very piece of chalk itself: a particular … mind-independent physical object. From the viewpoint in question, and given the relevant perceptual circumstances – especially, of course, the abnormally red illumination – it looks red. This consists in the fact that it has visually relevant similarities with paradigm red objects: the light reflected from it is like that reflected from such paradigms in normal viewing conditions (2008: 173).
On Brewer’s view, then, illusions are not really “illusory” at all. In the case just described, we are seeing the chalk as it is in those circumstances. So the illusion is really a special case of veridical perception. However, we would also say that the white chalk looks red. This, Brewer suggests, is to say no more than that, in the circumstances in which the white object is veridically seen, it has visually relevant similarities with paradigmatically red objects. That is all that we mean when we say that this is a case of illusion. Whether this kind of approach can be extended to accommodate all illusions remains to be seen.
As a theory of visual experiences, disjunctivism is very much in its infancy, and much interesting research remains to be done.
References marked (*) can be found in A. Haddock and F. Macpherson (eds.) (2008) Disjunctivism: Perception, Action, and Knowledge (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
References marked (+) are reprinted in Byrne, A. and Logue, H. (eds.) (2009) Disjunctivism: Contemporary Readings (Cambridge MA: The MIT Press).
Disjunctivism and Naïve Realism
Types of Disjunctivism
Arguments for Disjunctivism
Naïve Realism: Phenomenology
Naïve Realism: Demonstrative Reference
The Causal Argument
The “Screening Off” Objection
Matching Hallucinations to Perceptions
Negative Disjunctivism and Indiscriminability: Objections
Illusion as Hallucination
Illusion as Veridical Perception
Email: W.J.Fish ‘at’ massey.ac.nz
Last updated: March 7, 2009 | Originally published: