Divine simplicity is central to the classical Western concept of God. Simplicity denies any physical or metaphysical composition in the divine being. This means God is the divine nature itself and has no accidents (properties that are not necessary) accruing to his nature. There are no real divisions or distinctions in this nature. Thus, the entirety of God is whatever is attributed to him. Divine simplicity is the hallmark of God’s utter transcendence of all else, ensuring the divine nature to be beyond the reach of ordinary categories and distinctions, or at least their ordinary application. Simplicity in this way confers a unique ontological status that many philosophers find highly peculiar.
Inspired by Greek philosophy, the doctrine exercised a formative influence on the development of Western philosophy and theology. Its presence reverberates throughout an entire body of thought. Medieval debates over simplicity invoked fundamental problems in metaphysics, semantics, logic, and psychology, as well as theology. For this reason, medieval philosopher-theologians always situate the doctrine within a larger framework of concepts and distinctions crafted to deal with its consequences. An inadequate grasp of this larger framework continues to hamper the modern debates. Detractors and proponents frequently talk past each other, as this article will show. Reconstructing this larger context is not feasible here. But it will be necessary to refer to its main outlines if one is to capture the basic sense of the doctrine in its original setting.
The following overview begins with a look at some high watermarks of the doctrine. Next it looks at what has motivated the doctrine throughout its long career. A look at the origins and motives is followed by some representative objections. The bulk of the rest of the article sketches some common responses to these objections. The responses invoke aspects of the doctrine’s original context to further understanding of it. This treatment will mainly discuss objections to the doctrine’s internal coherence. Problems involving the compatibility of simplicity with another particular teaching generally require highly individual treatment beyond the present scope; this is also so with revealed matters such as the Trinity or Incarnation. However, some general considerations will prove applicable to these individual issues. Progress on the systematic issues seems tied to understanding the intrinsic claims of the doctrine. A separate article examines God’s immutability, though again some considerations here could prove applicable. The following discussion will suggest that disagreements over simplicity tend to reflect prior theological disagreements over the fundamental character of God and what language about God can or cannot imply.
Classic statements of the doctrine of divine simplicity are found in Augustine (354–430), Anselm (1033– 1109), and Aquinas (1225–74). Aquinas is often thought to represent the historical peak of the doctrine’s articulation and defense. Modern discussions usually reference his version as a standard, however, the roots of simplicity go back to the Ancient Greeks, well before its formal defense by representative thinkers of the three great monotheistic religions— Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. (The current English-speaking debates over simplicity usually refer to its Western, Christian developments, which are thus a focus of the present discussion.) Greek philosophers well before Socrates and Plato were fascinated by the idea of a fundamental unity underlying the vast multiplicity of individuals and their kinds and qualities. One idea proposed all things as sharing a common element, a universal substrate providing the stuff of which all things are made. Another idea proposed a being or principle characterized by a profound unity and inhabiting a realm above all else. Thales (640–546 B.C.E.) proposes water to be the common element from which all things in the universe are made. Anaximenes (588–524 B.C.E.) posits all material objects as ultimately constituted by compressed air of varying density. Parmenides (c. 515–c. 450 B.C.E.) presents an early Monism, the idea that all things are of a single substance. He holds that common to all things is their being, taken as a collective undifferentiated mass of all the being in the universe. He further introduces being as possessing an incorruptible perfection. Plato (428–348 B.C.E.) locates unity in the Forms. His metaphysics posits a supreme good constituting a unity beyond all ordinary being. The Platonic idea of a highest principle, combining supreme unity and utter perfection, strongly influenced Jewish and early Christian discussions of God’s supreme unity and perfection. Plato leaves the causal role of the supreme good somewhat vague. Aristotle (384–322 B.C.E.) posits the supreme being to be a subsisting and unchanging form that is also a first mover. Aristotle’s prime mover sits at the top of an efficient causal hierarchy governing all motion and change in the universe. Aristotle’s first mover is a simple, unchanging form that still causally affects other beings: in Aristotle’s case the heavenly spheres would move themselves in imitation of the divine perfection, resulting in the motions of terrestrial beings. Aristotle’s god is still considered ontologically finite by theistic standards and remains only a cosmic mover rather than a creator ex nihilo. The Platonic notion of a supreme perfection at a remove from all things and Aristotle’s causally efficacious, disembodied mind would combine to suggest a powerful model for Western theologians seeking language to describe God’s nature.
The Greek emphasis on a simple first principle figures prominently in the revival of classical Hellenistic philosophy at the close of the ancient world. Christianity is in its infancy when the Jewish theologian Philo of Alexandria (c. 30 B.C.E.– 50 C.E.) observes that it is already commonly accepted to think of God as Being itself and utterly simple. Philo is drawing on philosophical accounts of a supreme unity in describing God as uncomposite and eternal. He identifies this simple first being of the philosophers with the personal God of the Hebrew Scriptures who consciously creates things modeled after the divine ideas. Neoplatonist philosophers Plotinus (205–70) and later Proclus (410–85) will also posit a simple first principle. Plotinus’s Enneads speak of a One that exceeds all of the categories applicable to other things. Consequently it is unknowable and inexpressible (1962, V.3.13, VI.9.3). Plotinus voices an argument for the One’s simplicity that will emerge as a standard line of argument in later thinkers:
Even in calling it The First we mean no more than to express that it is the most absolutely simplex: it is Self-Sufficing only in the sense that it is not of that compound nature which would make it dependent upon any constituent [emphasis added]; it is the Self-Contained because everything contained in something alien must also exist by that alien. (1962, II.9.1)
For the One to have any metaphysical components is for them to account for the existence and character of the composite. Plotinus is working from the idea of a being that is utterly self-explanatory and thus is uncaused. A similar view of the first cause as lacking any internal or external causes will motivate Scholastic accounts of simplicity. Proclus’s Elements of Theology opens its analysis of the first principle by emphasizing its simplicity. (The work actually defends polytheism against the emerging Christianity.) This prioritizing of simplicity in the Elements is imitated in the anonymous Book of Causes and Dionysius’s On the Divine Names, two works that circulate to great effect in the medieval schools.
Christian theological speculation from the beginning views simplicity as essential for preserving God’s transcendence. The second-century Christian apologist Athenagoras of Athens argues that the Christian God by definition has no beginning; thus God is utterly indivisible and unchangeable. The Church Fathers—including Sts. Clement, Basil, and Cyril—see simplicity as preserving God’s transcendence and absolute perfection. St. John Damascene (c. 675–749) in book 3 of his An Exposition of the Orthodox Faith describes the divine nature as a unified single act (energeia) (1899). He allows it can be intellectually conceived under different aspects while remaining a simple being. Dionysius is the sixth-century Christian author of On the Divine Names. He long enjoyed authoritative status in the West after being mistaken for Dionysius of the Areopagus, whom St. Paul mentions in Acts. Unlike St. Augustine’s On the Trinity, Dionysius begins his account of the divine nature with divine simplicity. Aquinas, in his last great theological synthesis, places simplicity at the head of the divine predicates (Summa theologiae Ia q.3). He first argues that simplicity is part and parcel to being a first cause. Simplicity then becomes a foundation for his account of the other major predicates of God’s nature (Burns 1993; Weigel 2008, ch. 1). However, well before Aquinas’s sophisticated treatment of the doctrine, representative thinkers of all three great monotheistic traditions recognize the doctrine of divine simplicity to be central to any credible account of a creator God’s ontological situation. Avicenna (980–1037), Averroes (1126–98), Anselm of Canterbury, Philo of Alexandria, and Moses Maimonides (1135–1204) all go out of their way to affirm the doctrine’s indispensability and systematic potential.
The doctrine proceeds by denying in God forms of ontological composition that are found in creatures. The forms of composition in question will vary with different ontological systems, particularly so in the modern cacophony of approaches to ontology. For now, it will help to stick with the claims as presented in the classic doctrine. First, God lacks any matter in his being. There are no physical parts. God is also completely independent of matter. Therefore, nothing about God depends on matter to be what it is. Second, the divine nature is not composed with something else. God is the divine nature, so there are no accidental features or other ontological accretions in God. All that God is, he is through and through. The identification of God with his nature is also understood to mean that God exhausts what it is to be divine. For instance, Socrates and Plato do not exhaust what it is to be human because each manifests different ways to be a human being. God cannot be any more divine than he is. This has the further implication that the divine nature is not sharable by multiple beings. Socrates and Plato both possess a human identity. The divine nature, however, is exclusive to God.
Another major tenet is that God is maximal existence. Aquinas calls God ipsum esse subsistens, subsistent existence itself. The Church Fathers from early on affirm God as the absolute Being. Augustine calls God “existence itself” (ipsum esse). God is the ultimate in being. God is not just the best among extant beings. There is no possible being that could be more or better than God is. Hence, God is maximal perfection and goodness. This also means God is infinite. God lacks the ontological limitations creatures have because God has no potentiality to be in a different state than he is. An immediate consequence of simplicity is that classical theism acknowledges severe limits on what created minds can know about God. Human beings can affirm propositions true of God, but no finite mind even approaches comprehending all that God is. A God that is simple is also immutable. A change requires that something in a being undergoes alternation and something else remains continuous. Yet a simple being does not have changeable components, and maximal being cannot be other than it is. There is no temporal unfolding of successive states and God is not subject to place. Thus a simple and immutable God is eternal, not subject to time. As Nicholas Wolterstoff aptly observes, divine simplicity seems to be the ontological basis for “grant[ing] a large number of other divine attributes,” and consequently “one’s interpretation of all God’s other attributes will have to be formed in light of that conviction” (Wolterstorff 1991, 531).
Proponents of the doctrine historically favor two lines of reasoning already mentioned. Classical theism wants to preserve God’s transcendence and also insure God is a genuine first cause. A truly uncaused first cause depends on nothing. Anselm, for instance, holds that God’s supreme perfection precludes division even “by any mind.” Yet in arguing for this state of perfection he uses the idea seen in Plotinus that components determine a composite to be what it is (Proslogion, ch. 19). Internal components are “causes” in the broad sense that the Greeks used [aition] to speak of that which determines something else to exist or be a certain way. (The narrowing of causation to efficient causation comes later.) Aquinas in his Summa theologiae similarly argues for simplicity: “Because every composite is posterior to its components, and depends upon them. However, God is the first being, as shown above [in the arguments for his existence]” (Ia q.3 a.7). Contemporary scholars often refer to God’s independence from all things as his aseity. God is not “self-caused,” as in causing himself to exist by a kind of ontological bootstrapping. Instead, he is a first cause that transcends everything and sustains everything in existence at all moments. This will be the kind of entity for which the question of its own causation or dependence cannot arise. Its nature is self-explanatory.
This idea of a first cause being utterly uncaused has its origin in a model of explanation that sees all things as subject to the principle of sufficient explanation. Everything in existence requires complete explanation for why it exists and why it has the properties it does. Something with a nature that cannot account for its own existence eventually refers back, in this model, to a single, self-explanatory first cause. (It is important to remember that the model here seeks causal explanations of particular entities. Gottfried Leibniz [1646–1716] by contrast defends the principle of a sufficient reason for the truth of all propositions. Some critics argue that this latter model poses the dilemma of having to create necessarily [not freely] or else God would have to create for reasons independent of God.) Philosophers will debate whether this model holds or whether such a first cause exists; however, such discussions fall outside the present scope. The point is that simplicity emerges from a certain view of the world’s causal intelligibility, combined with a strict reading of the unconditioned nature of the first uncaused cause. Marilyn Adams follows how these considerations about a first cause influence the doctrine of simplicity, in her study of simplicity beginning with the writings of Maimonides and ending with William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347) (1987, 930–60).
Classical theism sees simplicity as guaranteeing God’s transcendence. A simple being does not form any mixture or composition with anything else. This rules out pantheistic conceptions of God. God cannot be an aspect of the natural world, such as a world-soul. The Church Fathers, Augustine, and the Scholastics also understand simplicity as maintaining the infinite ontological distance regarded as definitive of transcendence. A complex and mutable being is not something Augustine, Maimonides, or Aquinas would call God. A composite and changeable being they see as much like the rest of creation and not transcending it in any robust sense. Christian ecclesiastical documents reflect similar concerns. Correspondence by Pope St. Leo the Great (reigned 440–61) affirms God’s simplicity and immutability. Simplicity is affirmed in the Council of Lateran IV (1215) and again as recently as Vatican I (1870). One might propose a lesser transcendence that allows for composition and change but that is another discussion. Classical theism remains consistent on the matter. Rising dissatisfaction with a simple and unchanging God in the West parallels the rising popularity of immanent, process-oriented conceptions of the divine nature (Rogers 1996, 165). (See Process Philosophy.) It was just such a dissatisfaction that led philosophers late in the last century to revive modern versions of age-old objections to the doctrine of divine simplicity.
Contemporary objections to the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine are interrelated. They rely on similar assumptions about the doctrine and its categories. One line of critique cites the intrinsic claims of the doctrine as incoherent because calling God subsistent existence does not make sense. Another line of critique looks at multiple predicates as introducing divisions in God. The relevant predicates here signify the presence of a positive reality and include such traditional predicates as God is ‘good,’ ‘wise,’ and ‘living.’. Positive divine predicates contrast with negative ones, such as calling God ‘immaterial’ or ‘immutable.’ Here the term’s immediate significance is to deny a reality or situation. In this case the terms signify the absence of matter and change.
Alvin Plantinga’s critique of simplicity in his Does God Have a Nature (1980) has become a touchstone in the contemporary debates. Earlier versions of most of Plantinga’s objections can be found in other authors (Bennett 1969; Ross 1969; LaCroix 1977; Martin 1976; Wainwright 1979). Before that, discussions of simplicity percolated though other traditions, such as in religious schools and seminaries. The recent attention to these issues by analytic philosophers is not as novel as might be thought. Variations of them are probably as old as the doctrine of divine simplicity itself.
One of Plantinga’s major criticisms is that simplicity is incompatible with God appearing to have multiple attributes. According to the doctrine, “[God] doesn’t merely have a nature or essence; he just is that nature, … [and] each of his properties is identical with each of his properties…so that God has but one property.” But this “seems flatly incompatible with the obvious fact that God has several properties; he has power and mercifulness, say, neither of which is identical with the other” (1980, 46–47). Two objections are in play. First, positive predicates normally signify distinct features or aspects in things. Whatever makes Socrates wise differs from what makes him good. Would not God also have distinct properties? Plantinga’s second objection notes that God’s nature is identical with what is predicated of it. Socrates is not his goodness or wisdom but God is identical with his properties (which are identical with each other). Yet, no subject is its properties, much less a property, period. Similar versions of this critique are elsewhere (see, for example, Bennett 1969; Mann 1982).
Plantinga sees an even more basic problem here. Plantinga thinks properties and natures are abstract objects: “Still further we have been speaking of [God’s] own properties; but of course there is the rest of the Platonic menagerie—the propositions, properties, numbers, sets, possible worlds, and all the rest” (1980, 35). Properties and natures are abstract objects that neither subsist as individual things, such as oak trees and cats, nor inhere in individuals. This view of properties and natures as abstracta is a common one in the analytic tradition. It flourished during the middle and later decades of the last century and appears still widely held, if less dominant. If Plantinga is right, nothing divine is a property or nature:
No property could have created the world; no property could be omniscient, or, indeed, know anything at all. If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object; he has no knowledge, awareness, power, love or life. So taken, the simplicity doctrine seems an utter mistake. (47)
Properties in this view are things individuals can exemplify or instantiate, but not actually be. A painted wooden fence, for instance, exemplifies the property of being red. But redness itself is an abstract object separate from the individuals exemplifying it. Variations on this criticism in Plantinga are raised by Richard Gale (1991, 23) and Christopher Hughes (1989, 10–20) among others.
There is an additional line of objection here that commentators often miss. Plantinga takes it for granted God is a person: “If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object . . .” (1980, 47). Persons are not abstract objects. Moreover, persons are composite and changeable. They have faculties of understanding and volition that involve composition and a temporal sequence of states. So nothing simple can be a person. Yet God is obviously a person, according to Plantinga and others. He is obviously then not simple. David Hume (1711–76) argues along a similar line. A simple and immutable being has no mind, for “a mind whose acts and sentiments and ideas are not distinct and successive . . . has no thought, no reason, no will, no sentiment, no love, no hatred; or in a word, is no mind at all” (1980, part 4). A simple God is not a person, nor could God have the sort of mind persons have.
Another attack on the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine cites the claim that God is Being or existence itself. This basic claim appears early on in the doctrine’s history and is held by contemporary defenders of the doctrine (see, for example, Miller 1996; Davies 2004, 174–75). But detractors find the claim puzzling at best. Christopher Hughes speaks for many in calling it “perhaps the single most baffling claim Aquinas makes about God” (1989, 4). Anthony Kenny’s analysis concludes in even stronger terms by calling the position “nothing but sophistry and illusion” (2002, 194). A. N. Prior criticizes the view as simply ill-formed, that it “is just bad grammar, a combining of words that fails to make them mean—like ‘cat no six’” (1955, 5).
The theological controversy is rooted in a prior philosophical controversy over what it means to predicate existence of objects. According to one prevalent view of existence, saying “Fido exists” adds nothing to Fido. It adds no determinate feature the way predicating ‘hairy’ or ‘four-legged’ does. Existence then is not a real property. If existence is treated as a constituent of things, then there is also a certain paradox involving the denial something exists. To say “Fido does not exist” seems to presuppose Fido is there to be talked about, but then does not exist. This is self-contradictory. Given these apparent oddities, some philosophers decided existence is not predicated of extra-mental things but of concepts. Gottlob Frege (1848–1925) will say that asserting “There exists no four-sided triangle” is just to assign the concept of such a triangle the number zero. C. J. F. Williams echoes the Fregean view in his critique of God as just “to be’” “No doubt the question ‘What is it for x to be?’ is, by Frege’s standards, and they are the right standards, ill formed. To be cannot for anything be the same as to be alive, since the latter is something that can be said of objects, while the former is used to say something of concepts” (1997, 227). This modern analysis of existence goes back to Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) critique of Rene Descartes’ (1596–1650) version of the ontological argument. Kant seems to have read Pierre Gassendi’s (1592–1665) analysis of Descartes’ argument. Gassendi holds that existence does not qualify as a property; it is not a property of God or of anything else. If existence is not really saying anything directly about things, then it is nonsense to say God is literally just existence.
But suppose one allows that existence might be some sort of extra-mental aspect of things. There seem to be other problems in identifying God with existence. Existence never just occurs by itself in some rarefied form. One affirms the existence of dogs and begonias and such. Anthony Kenny notes, “If told simply that Flora is, I am not told whether she is a girl or a goddess or a cyclone, though she may be any of these. But God’s esse is esse which permits no further specification. Other things are men or dogs or clouds, but God is not anything, he just is” (2000, 58). How could existence itself subsist? Even if there could be something like mere existence, then surely God could not be some rarified glob of existence. God would seem to have many other properties. Thus, the problem of calling God subsistent existence returns one to the original problem of predicating multiple properties.
These objections represent the bulk of the objections commonly leveled at the doctrine’s basic coherence. One might summarize them as follows:
(a) God has several properties. Simplicity must deny this.
(b) Multiple properties occur as distinct from each other in things. Simplicity problematically says they are identical in God.
(c) God is a subsisting, individual thing. Properties do not subsist.
(d) In fact, properties, essences, natures are abstracta. God is not an abstract object.
(e) God is a person. Persons are ontologically complex.
(f) Simplicity says God is Being or subsistent existence. Existence is not a property, like being round.
(g) Nothing at all can be just existence.
(h) If God is some kind of rarified existence, this raises the same problem in (a).
These difficulties are hardly exhaustive. Still, together they account for much of the contemporary opposition to simplicity. They also embody certain assumptions other kinds of objections tend to use. What follows can only be a sketch of some common responses to the above objections. Another task will be to demonstrate how proponents of classical simplicity tend to invoke different background assumptions from its critics.
Looking at the contemporary ontology in which these objections are couched is a good place to start. Plantinga considers natures, properties, essences, and the like to be causally inert abstract objects that are separate from particular individual things. In this scheme, saying God is a nature is a category mistake. It is like referring to someone’s poodle as a prime number.
However, classical simplicity uses a metaphysics that sees the predication of natures and properties differently. Natures, essences, and properties are in this view constituents of things. Nicholas Wolterstorff characterizes this difference in ontological outlook in the following manner:
The theistic identity claims [in simplicity] were put forward by thinkers working within a very different ontological style from ours. They worked within an ontology I shall call constituent ontology. [Contemporary philosophers] typically work within a style that might be called relation ontology….Claims which are baffling in one style will sometimes seem relatively straightforward in another. (1991, 540–41)
Contemporary ontologies of this sort regard natures and properties as abstracta, which individual objects only “have” in the sense of exemplifying or instantiating them. Medieval proponents of simplicity regard such things as natures and properties as entities that actually inhere in the individuals that have them. Wolterstorff observes,
An essence is [for twentieth-century philosophers] an abstract entity. For a medieval, I suggest, the essence of nature was just as concrete as that of which it is the nature….Naturally the medieval will speak of something as having a certain nature. But the having here is to be understood as having as one of its constituents . . . for [contemporary philosophers], having an essence is . . . exemplifying it.” (1991, 541–42)
Many medieval thinkers would say that Socrates and Plato both have a human nature. This means there is an intrinsic set of properties constituting their identity as human beings, instead of being some other kind of natural object. Despite having the same nature, Socrates and Plato are of course distinct individuals. How so? Each individual is made out of a different parcel, or quantity, of matter. Each has different accidental features (non-essential properties). Socrates and Plato are thus two separate composites. Moreover, each has his individual humanity. The nature present in each is individualized or “particularized” in virtue of being in separate lumps of matter, and secondarily by the presence of different accidental, individualized features inhering the individual composite substance. Humanity is not an exact replica in each, in the way new Lincoln pennies might look the same except for being in different places. In this ontological outlook, a mind can form a general concept of human nature in abstraction from its various particularized instances. But this common, abstract humanity is only an object of thought. There is no non-individualized human nature outside of minds producing abstract concepts. For this ontological perspective, there is no Platonic human nature outside of individual human beings. One might give a similar account of various properties Socrates and Plato have. Each has white skin. Each composite is white in its own particular way. One can say here that Socrates’ whiteness inheres in this composite, Plato’s in that one. The way each is white will thus look similar but also slightly different. One can form an abstract, general concept of being white that abstracts from its particular instances. However, the medievals believe such mental abstractions hardly commit one to ontological abstracta apart from minds or individual instances. Consequently, humanity and whiteness are not part of a menagerie of Platonic entities separate from the individual composite beings that exemplify them.
Similarly, classical ontology holds that the divine nature is not an abstract object. The divine nature, or the what-it-is to be God, is not separate from the being that is God. Since simplicity denies matter and accidents in God, here, as Aquinas explains in Summa theologiae, is the extraordinary case where a certain entity just is its own nature:
God is the same as his essence or nature . . . in things composed of matter and form, the nature or essence must differ from the suppositum [that is, the whole subject]….Hence the thing which is a man has something more in it than [its] humanity….On the other hand, in things not composed of matter and form, in which individualization is not due to individual matter…the forms themselves should be subsisting supposita. Therefore suppositum and nature are in them are identified. Since God is not composed of matter and form, he must be his own Godhead, his own life, and whatever else is predicated of him. (Ia q.3 a.3)
Socrates is more than his nature; a human being is a material entity and has non-essential features in addition to his nature. God just is a nature, which does not form a composite with anything else. Such an extraordinary being is difficult to imagine or know much about. But, if natures and properties can be individual components of things, then simplicity hardly makes God an abstract object. Some commentators acknowledge the different approach classical ontology has toward natures and properties, but raise objections to it (for example, Hughes 1989, 12–20). Defenders of simplicity do not find such reservations compelling, and they make the further point that simplicity at bottom never considers God an abstract object (Bergmann and Brower 2006; Leftow 1990, 593–94). The main point is that one’s own ontology might not be that of another age. A technical assessment of these rival approaches to ontology might be left for a longer discussion (Leftow 2003). One should also keep in mind that contemporary defenders of simplicity show a variety of ontological predilections. Some mix historical and contemporary ontological views without seeing incoherence in this (for example, Vallicella 1992; Miller, 1996). Adjudicating among rival ontologies, however, is the substance of a much longer discussion. (For more, see the cited sources in this paragraph.)
Modern authors sometimes speak of God as a person (for example, Plantinga 1980, 47, 57). If God is a person and if simplicity leaves no room for being a person, then simplicity seems incompatible with believing in God. Certainly there are reasons for calling God a person. Classical theism predicates of God such things commonly associated with persons as knowledge and a will. This is not all. Human persons and their cognitive faculties are composite and changeable. So, if persons are the model for God being a person, then simplicity runs into the problems Plantinga and Hume mention above. But then it would be odd if Jewish, Christian, and Islamic thinkers over the centuries momentarily forgot God is like a human person when they affirm God’s simplicity. In fact, referring to God as a person is more complicated than one might think.
Many theists nowadays take it for granted God is a person, albeit a kind of disembodied super-powerful one. Brian Davies observes that the formula ‘God is a person’ “is by no means a traditional one. It does not occur in the Bible. It is foreign to the Fathers and to writers up to and beyond the Middle Ages. Not does it occur in the creeds” (2000, 560). Judaism believes man is in the image of God because man has understanding and free choice. Yet that is a long way from God actually being a person, much less in the way persons are persons. (Man is in the image of God but not vice versa.) Islam regards the ninety-nine names of Allah as titles of honor and not at all descriptions of God’s essence. The Christian Trinity speaks of three persons of one substance (ousia or substantia). It does not say the Godhead itself is a person, or that God is three persons in one person.
Stanley Rudman argues that thinking of the Godhead itself as a person is a relatively recent development (1998, ch. 8). It is mostly absent from Western theology before the eighteenth century. William Paley (1741–1805) and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834) provide early examples of trying out the idea. The nineteenth century sees an emphasis on God as a person or personality gain considerable momentum. In the present day, the eminent philosopher of religion Richard Swinburne does not find it particularly controversial to say, “That God is a person yet one without a body seems the most elementary claim of theism” (1999, 99). The difficulty lies in how one understands predicating ‘person.’ The modern sensibility seems to regard God as a person not altogether dissimilar to the way Socrates is a person. God is a disembodied mind that performs discursive thinking and makes a succession of distinct choices.
Far different is how Aquinas sees the predication of ‘person’ to God. He allows one can use the term. But here it signifies in a manner unlike its everyday use (Summa theologiae Ia q.29 a.4). It never applies univocally of God and creatures, but must be differently conceived in each case (q. 29 a.4 ad 4). Aquinas notes that ‘person’ signifies “what is most perfect in all of nature—that is, a subsistent individual of a rational nature.” Working with this general idea, God is called a person because “his essence contains every perfection,” including supreme intelligence, and because “the dignity of the divine nature excels every dignity” (q.29 a.4 ad 2). ‘Person’ thus applies to God in a manner eminently surpassing creatures. The overall context suggests Aquinas regards the term as mainly honorific, in the way God is thought of as a king on account of his rule over creation.
God is not a person if that implies any diminution of his maximal perfection. God does not go from being potentially in another state to acquiring that state. God has a rational nature, but only “if reason be taken to mean, not discursive thought, but in a general sense, an intelligent nature” (q.29 a.4 ad 3). Human persons need not be the definitive model for persons. If they are, God surely is not a person. Predicates God shares with persons, such as intellect and will, apply only by analogy. The predicates must abstract from, or be stripped of, any implication of change, composition, or imperfection. The language of personality applies with the realization that, as Brian Davies notes,
Our language for what is personal (and our primary understanding of this) comes from our knowledge of human beings. And we ought to be struck by a difference between what it takes to be a human being and what it must take to be God. . . . [They do not] reflect a knowledge of God as he is in himself. (2000, 561)
The modern tendency to think of God as a person leads to anthropomorphic interpretations of traditional divine predicates, and this arguably misses the intent of the original proponents of simplicity. A similar problem involves a lack of familiarity with the religious epistemology surrounding the doctrine.
Simplicity traditionally emphasizes God as profoundly unlike created beings. Classical philosophical theology frequently approaches divine predication using negative theology. God is seen as profoundly unknown as he is in himself. Much of what can be affirmed about God expresses what God is not, and in general how unlike and beyond created things God is. This preserves a sense of God’s infinite ontological distance from creatures. It also ensures predicates are not applied as if categories used for persons and everyday objects apply in roughly the same way to God.
Negative predicates such as ‘simple’ and ‘immutable’ signify the removal of features commonly found in created things. Negations should not immediately suggest positive imagery of what God is like. A temptation is to think these terms mean what it would be like for, say, an animate object or a human being to lack such features. Everyday human experience does not associate a lack of complexity with richness and perfection. One imagines dull uniformity, like a bowl of tepid porridge. Aquinas realizes this and follows his presentation of simplicity with God’s unlimited perfection and goodness. Similar caution applies to thinking about God’s immutability. Grace Jantzen observes of an unchangeable God: “A living God cannot be static: life implies change . . . [divine immutability] would preclude divine responsiveness and must rather be taken as steadfastness of character” (1983, 573). However, classical theists will argue that the correct image here should not be that of a static and inert physical object. The historical sources do not suggest this, and often go to great lengths to mitigate against this confusion. God has unlimited perfection, statues and rocks do not. As Brian Davies observes, “living” predicated of God does not mean a literal-minded image of biological life and physical change. Instead it acknowledges God’s independence from things and being a source of change in them (Davies 2004, 165–66).
Classical simplicity maintains that God is beyond knowledge of what he is like in himself. Concepts deriving from everyday experiences of physical objects remain profoundly inadequate to the reality of God. An expert might acquire a good sense of how complicated machinery works. By contrast, Aquinas introduces simplicity by saying it is safer to consider the ways God is unlike the created order, rather than like it: “Now we cannot know how God is, but only how he is not; we must therefore consider the ways in which God does not exist, rather than the ways in which he does” (Summa theologiae Ia q.3 introduction). The context suggests one cannot know the essence of God, or have any direct acquaintance of it the way one knows physical things. Positive predications of the form ”God is A” can allow readers to confuse the semantic distinction between the subject and predicate with a real distinction between God and separate properties. Plotinus operates with a similar caution in denying one can properly even say the One is (1962, V.4.1). This does not mean the One is non-extant. It signals that the One is beyond anything that could be associated with the world of changing and composite beings. Boethius discusses God as a simple being and then qualifies this by saying that God is not to be thought of as a subject. Dionysius (1957) shows an affinity with this position in his On the Divine Names.
Moses Maimonides also displays great caution in his account of simplicity and divine predication. For Maimonides, even positive predicates apply to God with severe qualifications to avoid compromising God’s simplicity (2000, ch. 50–58). Scripture enjoins the believer to affirm God is good, wise, just, and such. Yet positive predicates can only express that (a) God is the ultimate cause of certain good qualities, or (b) the predicate is a disguised negation of something from God. ‘God is good’ might mean God is the cause of good things. ‘God is living’ assures that God is not like something dead or ineffective. Subsequent thinkers will point out difficulties with this view of positive predicates. Saying nothing positive directly about God allows some strange expressions. God is the cause of everything. There are also innumerable things God is not. Thus God might be called a ‘lion’ to avoid the impression of weakness, or ‘quick-witted’ to preclude the impression that God is dull.
Aquinas will cite the Aristotelian dictum (Physics 184a23–184b12) that to affirm something exists is to have at least a very partial and incomplete notion what it is or is like. In addition, some modern commentators point out an agnosticism about God’s essence that can go too far. ‘Simple’ is a negative predicate. But the doctrine implies God is unsurpassed perfection and ultimate being. The absence of something like direct acquaintance with the divine nature could still allow positive things to be affirmed of it. This returns the discussion to the problem of assigning multiple predicates.
Multiple predicates differ from each other in meaning. Must they imply multiple properties that are components in God? Maimonides handles this by denying that positive predicates of God actually refer to the divine nature. There is another way. Positive predicates are affirmed of the divine essence, but do not pick out multiple properties in God. God does not have properties, strictly speaking, if one has distinct component features in mind. The undivided reality of God confirms predicates that differ in meaning but all refer to the whole nature. Each predicate corresponds to a way of considering the divine reality. Yet none of these affirmations, taken individually or collectively, imply division. None exhaustively express the maximal perfection to which they all refer. One might use the contemporary distinction between the sense of a predicate, its meaning or conceptual associations, from its reference, the thing or things to which a predicate refers. The divine predicates differ in sense, but share the simple nature as their common referent. (Modern theories of reference differ from medieval theories of signification. But here the basic idea need not do harm.) Aquinas remarks on these predicates:
God, however, as considered in himself is altogether one and simple; but nevertheless our intellect knows him by diverse conceptions, because it cannot see him as he is in himself. But, although it understands him under diverse conceptions, it knows that all these conceptions correspond (respondet) [emphasis added] to one and the same simple thing. Therefore, this plurality, which is [a plurality] according to reason, is represented by the plurality of subject and predicate; and the intellect represents the unity by composition. (Summa theologiae, Ia q.13 a.12)
“Good” and “living” are associated with two different concepts. Applied to creatures they signify distinct, inherent properties. Applied to God they are both true, but the ontological basis of their truth is the whole of what God is. The predicates retain their creaturely modes of signifying, where the mind associates the predicate with a limited and accidental property. Aquinas will say each signifies a perfection creatures have in common with God. John Damascene uses the metaphor of God being an infinite ocean of perfection, which can answer to distinctive intellectual conceptualizations while remaining undivided and unlimited in itself.
This does not mean a person grasps what it is about God or “in” God (a misleading expression) corresponding to the predicate. One can say that certain predicates should be affirmed, but claiming to know just what they signify at the level of the divine is another matter. This raises the question of what features inhering in created things would have in common with the divine reality. God’s nature seems to stretch the identity of what is predicated beyond its original significance. Marilyn Adams (1987) has suggested that the real issue with simplicity is not that multiple predicates imply composition. The problem is how the identity of the perfection signified is maintained between its created and divine applications. Aquinas notes that divine perfection differs from created perfection not just in degree. Since God is simple and maximal perfection, an entirely different mode of existence is involved. This is why he will say the predicates apply to God analogously, and not univocally, as “wise” applies to Plato and Socrates. Proponents of simplicity use a variety of solutions to show how the same predicate might refer to God and creatures. Such approaches can widely vary, according to an individual’s views on ontology and religious language (see, for example, Miller 1996; Klima 2001; Teske 1981; Vallicella, 1992; Weigel 2008, ch.6).
Similar considerations about divine predication can make sense of saying God is existence. As noted, contemporary philosophers often deny existence is predicated of things (Williams 1997; Kenny 2002, 110–11). Others question this. They note that the Fregean view of existence originally flourished in response to long-faded controversies in late-nineteenth- and early-twentieth-century theories of quantification and reference (Smith 1961, 118–33; Klima 2001; Knuuttila 1986; Miller 1996, 15–27). Gyula Klima observes that medieval theories of signification predicate existence of things in the world. They also speak of entities that do not exist without generating the obscure paradoxes modern assumptions about reference seem to (2001; Spade 1982). Some philosophers think that predicating existence of objects does say something non-trivial about them. Just because existence is not a determinate property, such as being orange, does not mean its predication to things adds nothing of significance. John Smith argues in this vein that “It is obvious that at least one considerable difference between lions and unicorns is that the former do exist while the latter do not,” and this need not involve some well-defined concept of existence (1961, 123). Philosophers aware of a variety of semantic theories now floating around English-speaking philosophy see the exclusively Fregean interpretation of existence as commanding less assent than it once did.
Fortunately, a sensible reading of the claim can be found without getting philosophers to agree on what existence is. First, God is not the being of all things collectively considered. This is just to have a universal concept of being that abstracts from individual beings and their determinations. But God is no lump sum of existence, which would be pantheistic. Second, saying God is existence does not mean God is some bland, characterless property of existence that one sees as common to cats, trees, and ballpoint pens. Instead, speaking of God as existence itself is a kind of shorthand for God’s ontology. Saying God’s essence is to exist expresses God’s independence from creatures as the uncaused source of all else. God depends on nothing for the being that God is. It also signals God’s supreme perfection. God’s maximal perfection and supreme unity surpass all individual beings and their limitations. Augustine will say in On the Trinity that because God is supreme among all beings, God is said to exist in the highest sense of the expression, “for it is the same thing to God to be, and to be great” (1963, V.10.11). Finally, Aquinas says that God is the full and exhaustive expression of the divine nature (Summa theologiae, Ia q.2 a.3). No other possible being rivals the divine plenitude. So, nothing else can be God. Calling God subsistent existence underscores God as (a) uncaused and independent, (b) maximal perfection, (c) simple, (d) and one.
Assessing the doctrine of divine simplicity is far more complicated than lining up objections and replies. The doctrine’s currents run deep in the history of Western philosophical and religious thought, predating the rise of Jewish and Christian philosophical theology. The doctrine is still regarded by many as an indispensable tenet of classical theism. Simplicity speaks to one’s fundamental understanding of God. Philosophers and theologians will continue to reach widely varying conclusions about simplicity, and the challenges it poses in a variety of areas insure it will continue to receive much attention for the foreseeable future.
Last updated: March 29, 2010 | Originally published: March 28, 2010
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