Juan Donoso Cortés, parliamentary statesman, diplomat, government minister, royal counselor, theologian, and political theorist, may not be well known among modern political philosophers. However, his ideas had an enormous influence in the spheres of politics and religion in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Donoso’s theories were uniquely influential in shaping the ideological trajectory that began with the reaction against the Enlightenment and the French Revolution in the eighteenth century and culminated in the rise of fascism in the twentieth century. This Spanish Catholic and conservative thinker was the philosophical heir of Joseph de Maistre, one of the most prominent reactionary conservative thinkers of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Even though his life was short and his works few in number, Donoso’s contribution to modern political philosophy and theology cannot be ignored if we wish to have a more complete understanding of the ideas and actions that have shaped Europe and the Roman Church in recent centuries. His most notable idea—the theory on dictatorship—was Donoso’s most significant and unique contribution to modern political thought.
In the early years of his life, Donoso’s thinking was deeply influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment. His education was thoroughly grounded in the study of such Enlightenment thinkers as Rousseau, Montesquieu, Voltaire, and Diderot. It was only in the last years of his life that Donoso distinguished himself as a standard bearer of an ideological camp that stood in complete opposition to the philosophes. By the year 1848 Donoso was firmly in the camp of such contre-philosophes as Joseph de Maistre and Louis de Bonald.
Until the European revolution of 1848, the primary concern of reactionary conservative thinkers was the restoration of the pre-1789 monarchical ancien régime. The authority and hierarchical order that were the centerpieces of conservative thought, were seen only in the context of restoring and preserving a monarchical régime. The revolution of 1848 exposed the inability of many of the European monarchies to maintain authority and hierarchical order. Donoso was one of the first and most vociferous of conservative thinkers to acknowledge this. While like de Maistre he was something of a romantic medievalist who advocated a hierarchical social order, with the Pope of Rome at the head of that order wielding absolute spiritual and temporal power while all other temporal and ecclesiastical authorities ruled as his deputies, he was also a realist who could strategically adapt his ideology to contemporary exigencies. He was the first conservative thinker to develop an alternative theory that posited a different model of régime calculated to achieve the restoration and maintenance of the authority and hierarchical order that all conservatives saw as the foundation of civilization. This was his theory on dictatorship. Even though Donoso was always an ardent monarchist, like his precursor de Maistre, he was also enough of a political realist to know that the ultimate goal of a stable social order based on obedience to infallible authority and adherence to a rigid hierarchy of rank and privilege could be achieved by other means, if necessary. If monarchies were too feeble to maintain such a social order, then other forms of government, more harsh in nature, need to be instituted in order to subjugate human beings.
Like de Maistre, Donoso viewed human beings as essentially and naturally depraved and irrational. To Donoso, human beings are so irredeemably corrupt in moral capacity and intellectually drawn to absurdity that they must be ruled with an iron fist. All social and religious order depends upon the will of those who rule to demand and impose obedience to their dictates and belief in their teachings as well as upon the willingness of subjects to obey and believe their rulers, both secular and religious. Civilization, according to Donoso, can only be preserved through the imposition and acceptance of political and religious commands and dogmas. These commands and dogmas are the repressive mechanisms Donoso held as essential to the survival and preservation of civilization, especially that mode of civilization which Donoso called “Catholic.” Repression, said Donoso, is one of the most essential elements of civilization. For Donoso, no amount of free and open discussion could ever arrive at any modicum of truth. He saw truth as revealed by God and mediated through God’s chosen instrument, the Catholic Church and it’s Supreme Pontiff. Discussion only opens the door to doubt, confusion, and discord thus preparing the ground for socialism. Discussion, which Donoso held as the cornerstone of liberalism, creates a belief vacuum that can only be filled by Christ or Antichrist, by Catholicism or socialism. In a begrudging sort of way, Donoso respected socialism more than liberalism because he saw the former as more akin to Catholicism, as something offering human beings a set of dogmatic beliefs. Liberalism can only offer doubt and uncertainty.
In his Speech on Dictatorship, Donoso described two different types of repression which he saw as necessary for the survival and maintenance of civilization—political and religious. These two forms of repression must exist in an equilibrium in order to be effective. With a decline in religious repression must come a corresponding and proportional rise in political repression, and vice versa. As the “thermometer” of religious repression falls, the “thermometer” of political repression must rise; and as the “thermometer” of political repression falls, so the “thermometer” of religious repression must rise. All political and religious régimes must be repressive if political and religious order are to endure. Donoso emphasized that the legitimacy of a régime is not based upon heredity, but upon the capacity of a régime to be repressive. This constituted a major shift in conservative thinking. Concern was not focused as much on who should rule, but on how rule is to be exercised. While authority and hierarchical order remained the conservative ideal, Donoso introduced a degree of realistic pragmatism to how this ideal could be achieved and preserved. This shift had ominous consequences in the twentieth century since the door was opened to more radical and ruthless forms of political and religious control.
In the religious arena, Donoso’s ideas on authority influenced the life of the Roman Catholic Church for over a century. Again echoing the views of de Maistre, Donoso thought that infallibility is an essential characteristic of authority. Authority is synonymous with infallibility. The power to command behavior and impose beliefs is not subject to error and must not be seen as subject to error. Without the exercise of and belief in infallible authority, Donoso thought that people and societies would sink into a morass of confusion, doubt, and error.
Donoso’s theory on infallibility helped to lay the foundation for the doctrine of papal infallibility that was promulgated by Pope Pius IX in 1870 at the end of the First Vatican Council. His advice was sought by Pius IX through the papal nuncio to France in the early 1850s, Rafaello Cardinal Fornari, with regard to the drawing up of a list of religious and philosophical propositions that were to be condemned as heretical. Donoso’s loathing for democracy, freedom of thought, freedom of speech, freedom of religion, rationalism, liberalism, socialism, pluralism, freedom of expression, and tolerance was reflected in his Letter to Cardinal Fornari. The ideas asserted in this letter appeared in Pius IX’s decree the Syllabus of Errors.
The repressive methods of governance advocated by Donoso in his theory on dictatorship also influenced the development of a papal régime that rested upon the absolute exercise of power by the pope over the Church. Donoso’s theories contributed to the development of a totalitarian ideology of papal supremacy and authority that dominated the Church until the Second Vatican Council in the early 1960s. A dictatorial papal régime was established by Pius IX that lasted through and reached its zenith during the pontificate of Pius XII. The Church endured a form of régime and a vision that pitted it in a holy war against modernity. His theories helped to shape the ideas and vocabulary that justified the establishment of a strong and centralized papal régime and the persecution of dissident and progressive Catholic thinkers—”modernists”— who sought to bring about a reconciliation between Christianity and the modern world.
In the political arena, Donoso’s influence was just as ominous. His theory of dictatorship and his critique of liberal democratic parliamentarianism significantly influenced the thinking of the twentieth century German conservative political theorist Carl Schmitt. Schmitt figured prominently in the development of the legal principles and structures of the Nazi régime. Schmitt’s critique of parliamentary democracy rests heavily upon arguments first developed by Donoso. Furthermore, Schmitt’s depiction of politics as a constant struggle of friends against enemies reflects Donoso’s quasi-Manichæan view of politics as a war between Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization. Donoso’s notion of infallible authority resonated in the Nazi Führerprinzip, the Italian fascist principle of Ducismo, and the principle of Caudillaje of the Franco régime in Spain (1936-75). The emphasis Donoso placed on infallible authority, his contempt of parliamentary democracy, and his support of dictatorial rule were common features of both conservative authoritarian as well as fascist régimes. Donoso’s ideas were held in high esteem in Spain during the time of the Franco dictatorship and were also reflected in other conservative authoritarian régimes in Portugal under Salazar and Caetano, France under Pétain (the Vichy régime), Austria under Dollfuss and Schuschnigg, and Hungary under Horthy.
Donoso’s theory on sacrifices, developed in his Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo, endorsed violence as a social necessity. The spilling of blood by the State is essential in keeping the repressive equilibrium required to maintain a society. For every drop of blood spilled in crime, there must be an equal amount of blood spilled in the name of justice if authority and order are to be preserved. Criminal violence must be balanced with just violence; the violence that promotes evil must be met with the violence that promotes the good. Donoso saw human beings as so morally depraved and feeble in intellect that they require dictatorial rulers to regulate their behavior, priests to tell then what to believe and think, and executioners to punish them when they waver or depart from the commanded norms of behavior, thought, and belief. Kings, priests, and executioners are the pillars of civilization.
Donoso’s view of history reflect the influence of St. Augustine, Vico, and Hegel. It combines the eschatological perspective of Augustine with the historical cycles of Vico and the dialectical process of Hegel. History is a process of the unfolding of a divine plan guided by Providence toward a specific end, which is the triumph of good over evil, of Catholic civilization over philosophical civilization. The process advances in cycles wherein the recurrent theme of good against evil is played out in a dialectical manner until the end is reached. Each cycle in the dialectical process ends with what Donoso called the “supernatural triumph of good over evil.” The action of divine Providence is essential in this process. Just as the executioner turns an evil into a good by replacing criminal violence with just violence, so Providence turns the natural triumph of evil into the supernatural triumph of the good. Donoso saw the natural triumph of evil in Jesus’ death as a supernatural triumph at the same time. The evil of the crucifixion accomplished the good of human redemption. The evil that afflicts can also be a good that strengthens and saves. The evil of sin allows God to display the good that is manifested in his justice and his mercy. History is the playing out of this drama in a cyclic and dialectically structured process guided by divine Providence toward a definite conclusion-the ultimate triumph of good over evil. Catholic civilization, which Donoso depicted as totally good, will ultimately crush and triumph over that evil he called philosophical civilization.
Donoso can also be seen as a modern-day Cassandra uttering prophecies of apocalyptic doom. He saw the development of modern technology, symbolized by the telegraph for him, and the establishment of mass permanent armies and police forces as potential instruments in the hands of a future godless and socialistic tyranny. All of his efforts in the arenas of politics, philosophy, and religion were aimed at preventing the rise of such an evil. Revolution had to be met with counterrevolution, anarchy with dictatorship, freethinking with dogma, doubt with certainty, and discussion with decree. The ultimate battle for Donoso was to be a quasi-Manichæan struggle between Catholicism and socialism, or Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization, two systems of belief in a combat to the death for the control of societies and souls.
Works by Juan Donoso Cortés:
Works on Juan Donoso Cortés:
Jeffrey P. Johnson
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 14, 2005 | Originally published: