Doxastic Voluntarism

Doxastic Voluntarism

Doxastic voluntarism is the philosophical doctrine according to which people have voluntary control over their beliefs. Philosophers in the debate about doxastic voluntarism distinguish between two kinds of voluntary control. The first is known as direct voluntary control and refers to acts which are such that if a person chooses to perform them, they happen immediately. For instance, a person has direct voluntary control over whether he or she is thinking about his or her favorite song at a given moment. The second is known as indirect voluntary control and refers to acts which are such that although a person lacks direct voluntary control over them, he or she can cause them to happen if he or she chooses to perform some number of other, intermediate actions. For instance, a person untrained in music has indirect voluntary control over whether he or she will play a melody on a violin. Corresponding to this distinction between two kinds of voluntary control, philosophers distinguish between two kinds of doxastic voluntarism. Direct doxastic voluntarism claims that people have direct voluntary control over at least some of their beliefs. Indirect doxastic voluntarism, however, supposes that people have indirect voluntary control over at least some of their beliefs, for example, by doing research and evaluating evidence.

This article offers an introductory explanation of the nature of belief, the nature of voluntary control, the reasons for the consensus regarding indirect doxastic voluntarism, the reasons for the disagreements regarding direct doxastic voluntarism, and the practical implications for the debate about doxastic voluntarism in ethics, epistemology, political theory, and the philosophy of religion.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Indirect Doxastic Voluntarism
  3. Direct Doxastic Voluntarism
    1. Arguments against Direct Doxastic Voluntarism
      1. The Classic Argument
      2. The Empirical Belief Argument
      3. The Intentional Acts Argument
      4. The Contingent Inability Argument
    2. Arguments for Direct Doxastic Voluntarism
      1. The Observed Ability Argument
      2. The Action Analogy Argument
  4. Significance: Ethical, Epistemological, Political, and Religious
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The central issue in the debate about doxastic voluntarism is the relationship between willing and acquiring beliefs. Necessarily related to this central issue are two other important issues: the nature of belief and the nature of the will, or more specifically, the nature of voluntary control. In order to provide a basic foundation for understanding the central issue, let us begin by clarifying each of these related issues.

First, let us make a preliminary and necessarily cursory clarification about the nature of belief. Consider your own case. Assuming that you are like most people, you believe a wide variety of things. Among the various things you believe, is one of them that the sum of thirty-seven and three is forty? If all went well, as you read and replied to that question, two things happened: (i) you comprehended the proposition the sum of thirty-seven and three is forty—that is, it was immediately present to your mind, you understood it, and you actively considered it, etc.—and (ii) you answered affirmatively. In light of such examples, philosophers have traditionally characterized the nature of belief as follows. To say that a person believes a proposition is to say that, at a given moment, the person both comprehends and affirms the proposition. It is in this sense that Augustine claims, “To believe is nothing but to think with assent” (Augustine, De Praedestione Sanctorum, v; cf. Aquinas, Summa Theologicae II-II, Q. 2, a. 1; Descartes, Meditations IV, Principles of Philosophy I.34; Russell 1921. For a detailed discussion of the nature of assent, see, for example, Newman 1985.).

This traditional characterization is a reasonable starting point for understanding the nature of belief, but it is at the very least incomplete. To see why, reflect on your own experience of considering the above-raised question. Both prior to and subsequent to considering the question, the proposition the sum of thirty-seven and three is forty was neither immediately present to your mind nor something you were actively considering. Nonetheless, you still believed it, and you still believe it. In this respect, you are like most other people. There are, as a matter of fact, some propositions that people believe about which they are currently thinking and others that they believe about which they are not currently thinking. To account for this fact, let us amend the traditional characterization of belief. To say that a person believes some proposition is to say that, at a given moment, the person either

i) comprehends and affirms the proposition, or

ii) is disposed to comprehend and to affirm the proposition (cf. Audi 1994, Price 1954, Ryle 2000, Scott-Kakures 1994, Schwitzgebel 2002).

There are, as one might expect, a number of subtle and controversial issues regarding the nature of belief that one could raise at this point, and addressing such issues would certainly be important in developing a complete theory about doxastic voluntarism. This amended description of belief should be sufficient, however, for our introductory discussion.

Second, let us make a preliminary and, again, necessarily cursory clarification about the nature of voluntary control. Take a moment to visualize the White House or to imagine the melody of your favorite song. Such mental activities are not difficult. Assuming your mental faculties are functioning properly, if you choose to perform these actions, they will happen immediately. They are things over which you have, what we will call, direct voluntary control. Suppose, however, that you want to learn either to play a particular song on a musical instrument on which you are currently untrained or to say a particular phrase in a foreign language that you do not currently speak. You will not acquire these abilities immediately after choosing to do so. Rather, you will have to choose to engage in a series of acts (for example, attending lessons, practicing, etc.) that will eventually result in your acquiring of these abilities. So, you do not have direct voluntary control over whether you can play a musical instrument or learn a foreign language. Nonetheless, acquiring abilities such as these is something that you choose to do. Thus, it is something over which you have a form of voluntary control—namely, what we will call, indirect voluntary control.

As with the nature of belief, at this point one could raise a number of subtle and controversial issues regarding the nature of voluntary control, and addressing such issues would surely be important in developing a complete theory about doxastic voluntarism. (For related discussions of these issues, see, for example, Alston 1989, Steup 2000, Nottelmann 2006.) Nonetheless, this distinction between direct and indirect voluntary control should be sufficient for our introductory discussion.

Corresponding to this distinction between direct and indirect voluntary control, philosophers distinguish between direct doxastic voluntarism and indirect doxastic voluntarism. The former is concerned with answering the question: to what extent, if any, do people have direct voluntary control over their beliefs? The latter is concerned with answering the question: to what extent, if any, do people have indirect voluntary control over their beliefs? Since the debate about indirect doxastic voluntarism is less contentious, let us examine it first.

2. Indirect Doxastic Voluntarism

Is indirect doxastic voluntarism true? Consider the following cases. First, suppose you walk into a room that is dark but has a working light that you can turn on by flipping the switch on the wall. When you walk into the room, you believe the proposition the light in the room is off. You realize, though, that you could change your belief by flipping the switch, so you flip the switch. The light comes on, and subsequently, you believe the proposition the light in the room is on. Second, suppose a usually trustworthy friend tells you that Paul David Hewson is one of the most popular singers of all time. You have no idea who this Hewson fellow is, but you would like to know whether you should trust your friend and, hence, believe the proposition Paul David Hewson is one of the most popular singers of all time. So, you do some research and discover that Paul David Hewson is the legal name of the incredibly popular lead singer for the Irish rock band U2. Consequently, you come to believe that Paul David Hewson is one of the most popular singers of all time. Thus, there are at least two cases in which someone has indirect voluntary control over his or her beliefs.

These cases, however, are not unique. The first illustrates that people have indirect voluntary control over whether they will believe any proposition, if they have voluntary control over the evidence confirming or disconfirming the proposition. The second illustrates that people have indirect voluntary control over whether they will believe many propositions, provided that they can discover evidence confirming or disconfirming these propositions, that they choose to seek out this evidence, and that they form their beliefs according to the evidence.

The significance of cases such as these is widely recognized among participants in the debate about doxastic voluntarism. (For summaries of such cases, see, for example, Alston 1989, Feldman 2001.) In fact, they are so widely accepted that philosophers seem to have reached a consensus on one aspect of the debate, recognizing that indirect doxastic voluntarism is true. In light of this consensus, they focus the majority of their attention on the more contentious question of direct doxastic voluntarism, to which we will now turn.

3. Direct Doxastic Voluntarism

Is direct doxastic voluntarism true? On this issue, philosophers are divided. Many argue that it is not, but some argue that it is. To each position, however, there are important challenges. Let us consider the most influential arguments and counterarguments in some detail, beginning with arguments against direct doxastic voluntarism.

a. Arguments against Direct Doxastic Voluntarism

i. The Classic Argument

Bernard Williams (1970) offers two arguments against direct doxastic voluntarism. Call the first “The Classic Argument,” since it is, perhaps, the locus classicus of the debate. Call the second “The Empirical Belief Argument,” since the notion of empirical belief is its essential feature.

The Classic Argument runs as follows: If people could believe propositions at will, then they could judge propositions to be true regardless of whether they thought the propositions were, in fact, true. Moreover, they would know that they had this power—that is, the power to form a judgment regarding a proposition regardless of whether they thought it was true. For instance, direct doxastic voluntarism seems to imply that, at this very moment, Patti could form the belief that Oswald killed Kennedy regardless of whether, at this very moment, she regards the proposition Oswald killed Kennedy as true or as false. Moreover, if direct doxastic voluntarism is correct, then it seems that Patti would know that she has the power to form a judgment regarding the proposition Oswald killed Kennedy regardless of whether she considers the proposition to be true. This phenomenon, however, is at odds with the nature of belief for the following reason. If a person believes that a proposition is true, then he or she would be surprised (or experience some related form of cognitive dissonance) to discover that the proposition is false. Similarly, if a person believes that a proposition is false, then he or she would be surprised (or experience some related form of cognitive dissonance) to discover that the proposition is true. For instance, if Patti believes that Oswald killed Kennedy, then she would experience some form of cognitive dissonance upon discovering that C.I.A. operatives killed Kennedy. Similarly, if Patti believes that Oswald did not kill Kennedy, then she would experience some form of cognitive dissonance upon discovering that he did. Thus, people could not seriously think of the beliefs they set out to acquire at will as beliefs—such as the things that “purport to represent reality.” Thus, Williams continues,

With regard to no belief could I know—or, if all this is to be done in full consciousness, even suspect—that I had acquired it at will. But if I can acquire beliefs at will, I must know that I am able to do this; and could I know that I was capable of this feat, if with regard to every feat of this kind which I had performed I necessarily had to believe that it had not taken place? (1970, 108)

Williams suggests that the answer to his rhetorical question is clear: ‘no’. It follows that such a person would not know that he or she is capable of acquiring beliefs at will and, hence, that such a person could not acquire beliefs at will. Therefore, Williams suggests, direct doxastic voluntarism is not merely false; rather it is conceptually impossible (1970, 108).

Critics, however, argue that The Classic Argument has at least three major flaws. First, they suggest that there is a difference between belief acquisition and belief fixation. It is at least possible that at one moment a person could will, in full consciousness, to acquire a belief concerning a proposition merely for practical reasons, regardless of the truth of the proposition. Once the person does this, however, he or she might perceive the evidence for the proposition differently than before—such that he or she comes to perceive some fact, which previously seemed like a terrible evidence for the proposition, as conclusive evidence for the proposition. In which case, the person’s belief would be fixed for theoretical reasons that are concerned with the truth of the proposition. Thus, the person might perceive his or her previous position as a kind of doxastic blindness, in which he or she failed to recognize the evidence for what it really is—namely, conclusive evidence. Hence, it is possible that at one moment a person could will, in full consciousness, to acquire a belief regardless of the truth of the proposition, and in the next moment regard his or her belief as a belief and believe that his or her belief was acquired at will just a moment ago. Therefore, critics conclude, The Classic Argument fails (cf. Johnston 1995, 438; Winters 1979, 253; see also Scott-Kakures 1994).

Second, they contend that a person could know, in general, that he or she had the ability to acquire beliefs at will without knowing that any particular belief was acquired at will. Jonathan Bennett illustrates the objection nicely with a thought experiment involving a group of fictional characters called ‘Credamites’. According to Bennett’s tale,

Credam is a community each of whose members can be immediately induced to acquire beliefs. It doesn’t happen often, because they don’t often think: ‘I don’t believe that p, but it would be good if I did.’ Still, such thoughts come to them occasionally, and on some of those occasions the person succumbs to temptation and will himself to have the desired belief. […] When a Credamite gets a belief in this way, he forgets that this is how he came by it. The belief is always one that he has entertained and has thought to have some evidence in its favour; though in the past he has rated the counter-evidence more highly, he could sanely have inclined the other way. When he wills himself to believe, that is what happens: he wills himself to find the other side more probable. After succeeding, he forgets that he willed himself to do it. (1990, 93)

To understand, more clearly, how Bennett’s Credamites can exercise direct voluntary control over their beliefs, consider a particular (hypothetical) case. Suppose there is a Credamite who is very ill and who finds it possible, but less than likely, that she will recover from her illness. Nonetheless, her chances of recovery will increase if she believes that she will recover from her illness, and she is aware of this connection between her beliefs and her illness. So, as any rational Credamite might, she simply chooses to believe that she will recover and, consequently, forgets that she willed herself to form the belief. Thus, Bennett’s thought experiment suggests that, contrary to what Williams claims, there could be beings who have the ability to form beliefs at will, choose to exercise that ability on a specific occasion, and immediately forget that they exercised their ability on that occasion (see also Scott-Kakures 1994, 83; Winters 1979, 255). Therefore, he and sympathetic critics conclude, The Classic Argument fails.

Third, they contend that a person could possess an ability without knowing that he or she possesses the ability (see, for example, Winters 1979, 255). Thus, a person could have the ability to acquire beliefs at will even if it were impossible for her to know that he or she had this kind of ability. Therefore, the critics conclude, The Classic Argument fails.

ii. The Empirical Belief Argument

The Empirical Belief Argument against direct doxastic voluntarism runs as follows. A person can have an empirical belief concerning a proposition only if the proposition is true and the person’s perceptual organs are working correctly to cause the belief. For example, a woman can have an empirical belief, say, that the walls in her office are white only if the walls in her office are, in fact, white and her eyes are working correctly to cause the belief. In cases of believing empirical matters at will, “there would be no regular connection between the environment, the perceptions,” and the belief. Thus, believing at will would fail to satisfy the necessary conditions of ‘empirical belief’. Therefore, believing empirical matters at will is conceptually impossible (Williams 1970, 108).

Critics suggest that there are at least two problems with The Empirical Belief Argument. First, people believe all sorts of things about empirical matters that are not caused by the state of affairs obtaining and their perceptual organs functioning properly (cf. Bennett 1990, 94-6). For instance, one might believe that a tower in the distance is round because it seems round to one whose perceptual organs are functioning properly—even though at this distance square towers appear round. Hence, the argument seems to rely on a false premise. Second, even if the argument were sound, it would show only that it is impossible for people to will to believe some propositions. Therefore, the critics contend, even if The Empirical Belief Argument were sound, it would show only that certain beliefs are not within one’s voluntary control, not that direct doxastic voluntarism is false, let alone conceptually impossible.

The problem, however, might seem merely to be Williams’ suggestion that a person can have an empirical belief concerning a proposition only if the proposition is true. Supporters of The Empirical Belief Argument, however, could reject that claim and offer a revised version of the argument. In fact, Louis Pojman has offered such an argument, which runs as follows (Pojman 1999, 576-9). Acquiring a belief is typically a happening in which the world forces itself on a subject. A happening in which the world forces itself on a subject is not a thing the subject does or chooses. Therefore, acquiring a belief is not typically something a subject does or chooses.

Critics contend, however, that there are at least two problems with Pojman’s version of the argument. First, they contend that people do have some direct form of voluntary control over their beliefs they form in light of sensory experiences. For instance, someone might have a very strong sensory experience suggesting that there is an external world and, nonetheless, not judge that there is an external world. Rather, one might suspend judgment about the matter (see, for example, Descartes’s First Meditation). Similarly, someone like John Nash, the M.I.T and Princeton professor portrayed in “A Beautiful Mind,” might have a very strong sensory experience as if he or she is in the presence of another person and, nevertheless, not judge that he or she is in the presence of another person. Rather, such a person might judge that he or she is alone and that the sensory experience is a hallucination. Thus, critics conclude, even if people cannot control the information provided to them by their senses, they can control whether they believe (so to speak) “what their senses tell them.” Second, they contend that like Williams’ original version of the argument, Pojman’s revised version would demonstrate, at best, that it is impossible for people to will to believe some propositions. Thus, they conclude that it does not demonstrate that direct doxastic voluntarism is false, let alone conceptually impossible.

iii. The Intentional Acts Argument

Dion Scott-Kakures (1994) offers another kind of argument that attempts to show that direct doxastic voluntarism is conceptually impossible. The argument uses an analysis of the nature of intentional acts to suggest that direct doxastic voluntarism is impossible. It goes as follows. If direct doxastic voluntarism is true, then believing is an act that is under people’s direct voluntary control. Moreover, any act that is under a person’s direct voluntary control is guided and monitored by an intention. For instance, steering one’s car through a left turn signal is an act that is under one’s direct voluntary control, and it is an act that is guided and monitored by one’s intention to turn left. Acquiring a belief, however, is different. It is, by its very nature, not the kind of act that can be guided and monitored by an intention. Thus, acquiring a belief is not under a person’s direct voluntary control. Therefore, direct doxastic voluntarism is conceptually impossible.

The critical premise in the argument is the claim that acquiring a belief is, by its very nature, not the kind of act that can be guided and monitored by an intention. Why, though, should we think that that claim is true? Suppose someone wants to form a belief at will. Let’s take a particular case. Suppose Dave wants to will himself to believe that God exists. The problem, according to Scott-Kakures, is that Dave has a certain perspective on the world, which includes his other beliefs, his desires, etc., and that perspective is incompatible with Dave believing that God exists. Thus, so long as Dave maintains that perspective, he cannot form an intention that could succeed in guiding and monitoring an act of believing that God exists. This problem, however, is not unique to Dave. Any person who wants to will himself or herself to believe a proposition faces the same obstacle. The perspective the person has of the world will not allow him or her to form an intention that is compatible with the belief he or she wants to form. Therefore, as long as the person maintains that perspective, it is simply not possible for him or her to form an intention that could guide and monitor the act of willing himself or herself to believe. Hence, acquiring a belief is, by its very nature, not the kind of act that can be guided and monitored by an intention.

Critics, however, suggest that the perspective of a person who attempts to believe at will might be compatible with the proposition he or she attempts to believe (Radcliffe 1997). They argue as follows. Consider Dave’s case. Because of his isolated background, he may be ignorant both of the standard arguments for and of the standard arguments against the existence of God. Nonetheless, he might understand the proposition God exists and desire to believe it for pragmatic purposes. For instance, reading Pascal’s Pensées may have persuaded him that the potential benefits of believing that God exists outweigh the potential detriments of not believing that God exists. From this perspective, he might form the intention to acquire at will the belief that God exists; however, nothing in the perspective that generates his intention is incompatible with believing that God exists. Hence, the perspective from which Dave generates his intention to believe that God exists is not necessarily incompatible with believing that God exists. Moreover, Dave’s case is not unique. Other people can find themselves in similar circumstances. Thus, at the moment a person attempts to acquire a belief at will, his or her perspective might be compatible with the proposition he or she wants to believe. Hence, the critics conclude, Scott-Kakures’s argument fails to show that direct doxastic voluntarism is conceptually impossible.

iv. The Contingent Inability Argument

Some philosophers, such as Edwin Curley, contend that regardless of whether direct doxastic voluntarism is conceptually impossible, it is false. Curley, specifically, argues as follows (1975, 178). If direct doxastic voluntarism is true, then people should be able to believe at will at least those propositions for which the evidence is not compelling. Let us test the doctrine empirically. Consider the recent meteorological conditions on Jupiter. We do not have compelling evidence either confirming or disconfirming the proposition it rained three hours ago on Jupiter, so it is a proposition about which we ought to be able to form a belief at will. Curley, however, suggests that he cannot form a belief about the proposition and suggests that his readers cannot either, unless they have strikingly different minds than his. Thus, he suggests, there is at least one (and probably many other) clear counterexamples to the claim that people have direct voluntary control over their beliefs. Therefore, he suggests, regardless of whether direct doxastic voluntarism is conceptually impossible, it is false.

Critics could grant that the argument seems to succeed in showing that there are propositions with respect to which we stand, like Buridan’s Ass, unable to decide between our options—in this case, affirming or denying a proposition. They would contend, however, that the argument’s success is limited and that it shows, at most, that there are some propositions with respect to which people do not have direct voluntary control (cf. Ryan 2003, 62-7). Therefore, they would conclude, the argument does not show that direct doxastic voluntarism is false.

b. Arguments for Direct Doxastic Voluntarism

i. The Observed Ability Argument

According to Carl Ginet, there are a number of cases in which people can will to believe certain propositions, provided that their evidence regarding the propositions is inconclusive (2001, 64-5; cf. Ryan 2003, 62-7). He offers a number of examples. Let us consider two. The first involves a person deciding to believe a proposition so that she can stop worrying. The scenario is as follows:

Before Sam left for his office this morning, Sue asked him to bring from his office a particular book that she needs to use for preparing her lecture the next day, on his way back home.. Later Sue wonders whether Sam will remember to bring the book. She recalls that he has sometimes, though not often, forgotten such things. But, given the thought that her continuing to wonder whether he’ll remember to bring the book will make her anxious all day, she decides to stop fretting and decides to believe that he will remember to bring the book she wanted.

The second involves a road trip taken by Ginet and his wife. He says,

We have started on a trip by car, and 50 miles from home my wife asks me if I locked the front door. I seem to remember that I did, but I don’t have a clear, detailed, confident memory impression of locking that door (and I am aware that my unclear, unconfident memory impressions have sometimes been mistaken). But, given the great inconvenience of turning back to make sure the undesirability of worrying about it while continuing on, I decide to continue on and believe that I did lock it.

According to Ginet, a person decides to believe a proposition when he or she stakes something on the truth of the proposition, where to “stake something” on the truth of a proposition is understood as follows:

In deciding to perform an action, a person staked something on its being that case that a certain proposition, p, was true if and only if when deciding to perform the action, the person believed that performing the action was (all things considered) at least as good as other options open to him or her if and only if the proposition, p, was true.

Thus, on Ginet’s account, in deciding not to remind Sam to bring the book she needed, Sue staked something on the truth of the proposition Sam will bring the book and, hence, decided to believe that Sam would bring it. If Sue had decided to remind Sam to bring the book she needed, Sue would have staked something on the truth of the proposition Sam will not bring the book and, hence, decided to believe that Sam would not bring it. Thus, on Ginet’s account, Sue could have decided to believe that Sam will bring the book or that Sam will not bring the book. Similarly, in deciding to continue on his road trip without worrying, Ginet staked something on the truth of the proposition I locked the door and, hence, decided to believe that he locked the door. If Ginet had decided to pull off the road to call and ask his neighbor to check Ginet’s front door, then Ginet would have staked something on the truth of the proposition I did not lock the door and, hence, decided to believe that he did not lock the door. Thus, on Ginet’s account, he could have decided to believe that he did lock the door or that he did not lock the door. Therefore, direct doxastic voluntarism is a thesis that describes an observed ability that people have.

Ginet surely seems correct in noting that people have experiences in which they are (at least moderately) anxious about the truth of some proposition, when the evidence they have for the proposition is ambiguous, and they alleviate their anxiety by electing to act as if the proposition is true (or false). Thus, to rebut Ginet’s argument, critics would have to show that what people do in such cases is not decide to believe. But how else such cases can be described? If such people are not deciding to believe, then what are they deciding to do? A quick survey of the philosophical literature on the nature of belief suggests two possible lines of reply. First, someone might be able to rebut Ginet’s argument by showing that that the kind of cases to which Ginet refers are cases not of believing a proposition, but of accepting a proposition. According to this line of rebuttal, the person understands the proposition and decides to act as if the proposition is true for some practical purpose, but (unlike in cases of believing) the person neither affirms nor denies the proposition (see, for example, Buckareff 2004; cf. Bratman 1999; Cohen 1989, 1992). Second, someone might be able to rebut Ginet’s argument by showing that the kind of cases to which he refers are cases not of believing a proposition, but of acting as if a proposition is true (see, for example, Alston 1989, 122-7; cf. Steup 2000). According to this second line of rebuttal, the person decides to act as if the proposition is true for some practical purpose(s), regardless of whether the person understands the proposition, and of whether he or she affirms, denies, or suspends judgment about the proposition. (For a related discussion of another of Ginet’s cases, see Nottelmann 2006.)

i. The Action Analogy Argument

James Montmarquet offers the following, analogical argument for direct doxastic voluntarism (1986, 49). “[R]easons for action play a role in the determination of action which is analogous to the role played by reasons for thinking-true in the determination of beliefs.” Hence, if the controlling influence of reasons on actions is compatible with the voluntariness of the action, the same is true with respect to the influence of reasons for thinking-true on beliefs. The controlling influence of reasons on actions is compatible with the voluntariness of action. Therefore, the controlling influence of reasons on beliefs is compatible with the voluntariness of belief. Hence, direct doxastic voluntarism is no more problematic than voluntarism about people’s other actions, and since we regard voluntarism as true with respect to people’s other actions, we should also regard direct doxastic voluntarism as true. (For discussions of related arguments, see, for example, Nottelmann 2006, Ryan 2003, Steup 2000.)

Granting that the inferences are warranted, there are two lines of objection open for a possible rebuttal. First, one might be able to rebut the argument by showing that there is a significant difference between the role that reasons play in determining action and the role that reasons play in determining beliefs. For instance, one could undermine Montmarquet’s argument if one could show that there is a problem with the analogy on which it depends: the controlling influence of reasons on acting is to the voluntariness of acting as the controlling influence of reasons on believing is to the voluntariness of believing. What, though, is wrong with that analogy? One possibility is that the controlling influence of reasons on people’s actions is often resistible in a way that the controlling influence of reasons on people’s beliefs is not. For example, it seems to make sense that a person would say, “I have overwhelming evidence that I should not smoke, but I still smoke.” Does it make sense, however, for a person to say, similarly, that she has overwhelming evidence that a proposition is false but that she believes it is true? Some would answer negatively, pointing to claims like, “I have overwhelming evidence that lead does not float in water, but I still believe that it does.” Others would answer affirmatively, pointing to claims like, “I have overwhelming evidence that my son has been killed in action in the war—for example, he has been M.I.A. for years, the rescue team recovered his bloody uniform—nonetheless, I still believe that he is alive” (cf. Meiland 1980). The challenge for those who take this first strategy in attempting to undermine Montmarquet’s argument is to show that the cases of those who answer affirmatively are not cases of choosing to believe, but cases of something else—for example, accepting that a proposition is true or acting as if a proposition is true (cf. Bratman 1999; Cohen 1989, 1992, as well as Alston 1989, 122-7, Buckareff 2004).

Second, one might be able to rebut the argument by showing that the controlling influence of reasons on actions is incompatible with the voluntariness of actions. For instance, one could undermine Montmarquet’s argument if one could show that as the influence of people’s reasons on their actions become stronger, their performance of the actions becomes less voluntary. Why, though, might we think that the influence of reasons on people’s actions would have this effect? One type of possibility includes cases of coercion (cf. Aquinas, Summa Theologicae, I-II, Q. 6, aa. 6-7). Suppose a person gave her money to a mugger who threatened her with a loaded gun, yelling, “Your money or your life!” Did she give the money voluntarily? Some would argue that she did not. At this point, the debate becomes rather subtle. On the one hand, she did choose (that is, she did ‘will’) to perform the action. On the other hand, her act of willing seems to lack the requisite freedom such that we would say she had direct voluntary control over that act in the way that we would say, for instance, that she had direct voluntary control over her act of writing a check to charity earlier that morning. Thus, a second strategy for undermining Montmarquet’s argument requires one both (i) to show that there are cases of acting with respect to which people lack direct voluntary control and (ii) to demonstrate why cases of believing are like such cases of acting.

4. Significance: Ethical, Epistemological, Political, and Religious

The issue of doxastic voluntarism has three particularly significant philosophical implications. The first concerns an issue at the intersection of ethics and epistemology: specifically, the possibility of an ethics of belief. The second concerns political philosophy: specifically, the extent of intellectual (and especially religious) freedom. The third concerns philosophy of religion: specifically, the doctrine of hell.

Each relies on a certain moral principle. Call it the Blameworthiness Principle:

People are morally blameworthy only for those actions they perform (or for those dispositions they acquire) voluntarily.

Proponents suggest that the truth of this principle is intuitively evident in light of commonsense examples. For instance, proponents contend, we can hold people morally blameworthy for acts like murder or dispositions like being cruel only if they killed an innocent person or developed the disposition to be cruel voluntarily. If a person committed murder or developed a disposition to be cruel because he or she was under the control of an evil demon, or a nefarious neurosurgeon, or some other such manipulative agent, we would blame the manipulative agent, not the person who committed the act or caused the development of the disposition. We would do so, proponents argue, because we recognize, intuitively, the truth of the Blameworthiness Principle.

In light of this principle, some philosophers argue, as follows, that an ethics of belief is untenable (see, for example, Price 1954, especially, p. 11; for a related debate, see, for example, Chisholm 1968, 1991, Firth 1998a, 1998b, Haack 2001). Direct doxastic voluntarism is false: people do not have direct voluntary control over their beliefs. Moreover, since the Blameworthiness Principle is true, people are not morally blameworthy for their beliefs. Thus, although we might hold people morally responsible for being intellectually lazy or intellectually cowardly (for example, by failing to gather evidence or by failing to consider evidence), there is no such thing as an ethics of belief per se—that is, an ethical evaluation of a person for judging that a particular proposition is true (or false).

Some political philosophers have traditionally utilized the preceding type of argument against the possibility of an ethics of belief in their arguments for toleration (see, for example, Bayle 2005; Locke 1983; Mill 1974; Spinoza 2001). The general line of thought is as follows. People can control whether they conduct an inquiry and whether they evaluate a body of evidence, so they are certainly responsible for inquiring and examining evidence. However, since the Blameworthiness Principle is true and since believing (or, more specifically, judging) is not the sort of thing over which people have voluntary control, if people examine a body of evidence in good conscience and form a belief regarding a proposition, the state has no right to punish them for holding that belief. Thus, for instance, although the state may demand that people hear the evidence for a particular religion, it has no right to punish people for failing to believe the tenets of that religion.

Some philosophers of religion have suggested that the same kind of argument applies to questions of justice not only regarding human affairs, but also regarding divine affairs. For example, they contend that it follows from the falsity of direct doxastic voluntarism and the truth of the Blameworthiness Principle that not even God could punish people, in this life or in the next, for failing to believe the tenets of a certain religion. Thus, they contend that a just God could not torment people eternally in hell, for failing to believe the tenets of a certain religion. Those who wish to deny this line of argument seem compelled to choose among the following strategies. First, they could attempt to show that direct doxastic voluntarism is true. Second, they could attempt to demonstrate that the Blameworthiness Principle is false. Third, they could attempt to show that God holds people accountable not for failing to form certain judgments about a particular set of religious principles, but for some other fault(s)—for example, failing to conduct an adequate investigation into or failing to be open to the truth of the tenets of a certain religion.

5. Conclusion

Thus, the debate about doxastic voluntarism is particularly intriguing and important for two reasons. First, it requires us to form a deeper understanding about vital aspects of human nature. For instance, it entails that we do further research in philosophy of mind, action theory, and moral psychology so that we can understand both the nature of belief and the nature of the will, or (more specifically) the nature of voluntary control. Second, the outcome of the debate has direct and significant practical implications for our understanding of the scope of ethical and of epistemic obligations, our understanding of the relationship between personal rights and state responsibility, and our understanding both of the nature of God and of divine justice.

6. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Rico Vitz
Email: rico.vitz@unf.edu
University of North Florida
U. S. A.