According to Owen Flanagan (2000), there are four major philosophical questions about dreaming:
1. How can I be sure I am not always dreaming?
2. Can I be immoral in dreams?
3. Are dreams conscious experiences that occur during sleep?
4. Does dreaming have an evolutionary function?
These interrelated questions cover philosophical domains as diverse as metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, scientific methodology, and the philosophy of biology, mind and language. This article covers the four questions and also looks at some newly emerging philosophical questions about dreams:
5. Is dreaming an ideal scientific model for consciousness research?
6. Is dreaming an instance of hallucinating or imagining?
Section 1 introduces the traditional philosophical question that Descartes asked himself, a question which has championed scepticism about the external world. How can I be sure I am not always dreaming, or dreaming right now? Philosophers have typically looked for features that distinguish dreams from waking life and one key debate centres on whether it is possible to feel pain in a dream.
Section 2 surveys the ethics of dreaming. The classical view of Augustine is contrasted with more abstract ethical positions, namely, those of the Deontologist, the Consequentialist and the Virtue Ethicist. The notion of lucid dreaming is examined here in light of the question of responsibility during dreaming and how we treat other dream characters.
Sections 3 covers the various different positions, objections and replies to question 3: the debate about whether dreaming is, or is not, a conscious state. The challenges from Malcolm and Dennett are covered. These challenges question the authority of the common-sense view of dreaming as a consciously experienced state. Malcolm argues that the concept of dreaming is incoherent, while Dennett puts forward a theory of dreaming without appealing to consciousness.
Section 4 covers the evolutionary debate, where empirical work ultimately leaves us uncertain of the extent to which natural selection has shaped dreaming, if at all. Early approaches by Freud and Jung are reviewed, followed by approaches by Flanagan and Revonsuo. Though Freud, Jung and Revonsuo have argued that dreaming is functional, Flanagan represents a view shared by many neuroscientists that dreaming has no function at all.
Section 5 looks at questions 5 and 6. Question 5 is about the cutting edge issue of precisely how dreaming should be integrated into the research program of consciousness. Should dreaming be taken as a scientific model of consciousness? Might dreaming play another role such as a contrast analysis with other mental states? Question 6, which raises a question of the exact qualitative nature of dreaming, has a longer history, though it is also receiving contemporary attention. The section outlines reasons favouring the orthodox view of psychology, that dream imagery is perceptual (hallucinatory), and reasons favouring the philosophical challenge to that orthodoxy, that dreams are ultimately imaginative in nature.
Descartes strove for certainty in the beliefs we hold. In his Meditations on First Philosophy he wanted to find out what we can believe with certainty and thereby claim as knowledge. He begins by stating that he is certain of being seated by the fire in front of him. He then dismisses the idea that this belief could be certain because he has been deceived before in dreams where he has similarly been convinced that he was seated by a fire, only to wake and discover that he was only dreaming that he was seated by a fire. How can I know that I am not now dreaming? is the resulting famous question Descartes asked himself. Though Descartes was not the first to ask himself this question (see Zhuangzi’s eponymous work, Plato’s Theaetetus and Aristotle’s Metaphysics) he was the first philosopher to doggedly pursue and try to answer the question. In answering the question, due to the sensory deception of dreams, Descartes believes that we cannot trust our senses in waking life (without invoking a benevolent God who would surely not deceive us).
The phenomenon of dreaming is used as key evidence for the sceptical hypothesis that everything we currently believe to be true could be false and generated by a dream. Descartes holds the common-sense view that dreams, which regularly occur in all people, are a sequence of experiences often similar to those we have in waking life (this has come to be labelled as the “received view” of dreaming). A dream makes it feel as though the dreamer is carrying out actions in waking life, for during a dream we do not realize that it is a dream we are experiencing. Descartes claims that the experience of a dream could in principle be indistinguishable from waking life – whatever apparent subjective differences there are between waking life and dreaming, they are insufficient differences to gain certainty that I am not now dreaming. Descartes is left unsure that the objects in front of him are real – whether he is dreaming of their existence or whether they really are there. Dreaming was the first source for motivating Descartes’ method of doubt which came to threaten perceptual and introspective knowledge. In this method, he would use any means to subject a statement or allegedly true belief to the most critical scrutiny.
Descartes’ dream argument began with the claim that dreams and waking life can have the same content. There is, Descartes alleges, a sufficient similarity between the two experiences for dreamers to be routinely deceived into believing that they are having waking experiences while we are actually asleep and dreaming. The dream argument has similarities to his later evil demon argument. According to this later argument, I cannot be sure anything I believe for I may just be being deceived by a malevolent demon. Both arguments have the same structure: nothing can rule out my being duped into believing I am having experience X, when I am really in state Y, hence I cannot have knowledge Z, about my current state. Even if the individuals happen to be right in their belief that they are not being deceived by an evil demon and even if individuals really are having a waking life experience, they are left unable to distinguish reality from their dream experiences in order to gain certainty in their belief that they are not now dreaming.
Since the Meditations on First Philosophy was published, Descartes’ argument has been replied to. One main claim that has been replied to is the idea that there are no certain marks to distinguish waking consciousness from dreaming. Hobbes believed that an absence of the absurd in waking life was a key difference (Hobbes, 1651: Part 1, Chapter 2). Though sleeping individuals are too wrapped up in the absurdity of their dreams to be able to distinguish their states, an individual who is awake can tell, simply because the absurdity is no longer there during wakefulness. Locke compared real pain to dream pain. He asks Descartes to consider the difference between dreaming of being in the fire and actually being in the fire (Locke, 1690: Book 4, Chapter 2, § 2). Locke’s claim is that we cannot have physical pain in dreams as we do in waking life. His claim, if true, undermines Descartes’ premise that there are no certain marks to distinguish dreaming from waking life such that we could ever be sure we are in one or the other states.
Descartes thought that dreams are protean (Hill, 2004b). By “protean”, Hill means that dream experience can replicate the panoply of any possible waking life experience; to put it negatively, there is no experience in waking life that could not be realistically simulated (and thereby be phenomenally indistinguishable) in dreams. This protean claim was necessary for Descartes to mount his sceptical argument about the external world. After all, if there was even one experience during waking life which simply could not occur during dreaming, then, in that moment at least, we could be sure we are awake and in contact with the external world, rather than dreaming. Locke alleged that he had found a gap in this protean claim: we do not and cannot feel pain in dreams. The notion of pain occurring in a dream has now been put to the test in a number of scientific studies through quantitative analysis of the content of dream diaries in the case of ordinary dreams and also by participating lucid dreamers. The conclusion reached independently by these various studies is that the occurrence of sharply localized pains can occur in dreams, though they are rare (Zadra, and others 1998; LaBerge & DeGracia, 2000). According to the empirical work then, Locke is wrong about his claim, though he might still query whether really agonizing and ongoing pain (as in his original request of being in a fire) might not be possible in dreams. The empirical work supports Descartes’ conviction that dreams can recapitulate any waking state, meaning that there is no essential difference between waking and dreaming thereby ruling out certainty that this is not now a dream.
Another common attempt to distinguish waking life from dreaming is the “principle of coherence” (Malcolm, 1959: Chapter 17). We are awake and not asleep dreaming if we can connect our current experiences to the overall course of our lives. Essentially, through using the principle of coherence, we can think more critically in waking life. Hobbes seems to adhere to something like the principle of coherence in his appeal to absurdity as a key feature of dreams. Though dreams do have a tendency to involve a lack of critical thinking, it still seems possible that we could wake with a dream connecting to the overall course of our lives. It is generally accepted that there is no certain way to distinguish dreaming from waking life, though the claim that this ought to undermine our knowledge in any way is controversial.
For an alternative response to Descartes’ sceptical dream argument see Sosa (2007), who says that “in dreaming we do not really believe; we only make-believe.” He argues that in dreaming we actually only ever imagine scenarios, which never involve deceptive beliefs, and so we have no reason to feel our ordinary waking life beliefs can be undermined. Descartes relied on a notion of belief that was the same in both dreaming and waking life. Of course, if I have never believed, in sleep, that I was seated by the fire when I was actually asleep in bed, then none of my dreams challenge the perceptual and introspective beliefs I have during waking life. Ichikawa (2008) agrees with Sosa that in dreams we imagine scenarios (rather than believe we are engaged in scenarios as though awake), but he argues in contrast to Sosa, that this does not avoid scepticism about the external world. Even when dreams trade in imaginings rather than beliefs, the dreams still create subjectively indistinguishable experiences from waking experience. Due to the similarity in experience, it would be “epistemically irresponsible” to believe that we are engaged in waking experiences when we think we are on the sole basis that we imagine our dream experiences and imaginings are not beliefs. I still cannot really tell the difference between the experiences. The new worry is whether the belief I have in waking life is really a belief, rather than an imagining during dreaming and so scepticism is not avoided, so Ichikawa claims.
Since the late twentieth century, discussion of the moral and criminal responsibility of dreaming has been centred on sleep walking, where sleep-walkers have harmed others. The assessment has typically been carried out in practical, rather than theoretical, settings, for example law courts. Setting aside the notion of sleepwalking, philosophers are more concerned with the phenomenology of ordinary dreams. Does the notion of right and wrong apply to dreams themselves, as well as actions done by sleepwalkers?
Saint Augustine, seeking to live a morally perfect life, was worried about some of the actions he carried out in dreams. For somebody who devoted his life to celibacy, his sexual dreams of fornication worried him. In his Confessions (Book X; Chapter 30), he writes to God. He talks of his success in quelling sexual thoughts and earlier habits from his life before his religious conversion. But he declares that in dreams he seems to have little control over committing the acts that he avoids during the waking day. He rhetorically asks “am I not myself during sleep?” believing that it really is him who is the central character of his dreams. In trying to solve the problem Augustine appeals to the apparent experiential difference between waking and dreaming life. He draws a crucial distinction between “happenings” and “actions.” Dreams fall into the former category. Augustine was not carrying out actions but was rather undergoing an experience which happened to him without choice on his part. By effectively removing agency from dreaming, we cannot be responsible for what happens in our dreams. As a result, the notion of sin or moral responsibility cannot be applied to our dreams (Flanagan, 2000: p.18; pp. 179 – 183). According to Augustine, only actions are morally evaluable. He is committed to the claim that all events that occur in dreams are non-actions. The claim that actions do not occur during sleep is brought into question by lucid dreams which seem to involve genuine actions and decision making processes whereby dreaming individuals can control, affect and alter the course of the dream. The success of Augustine’s argument hinges on there being no actions in dreams. Lucid dreaming is therefore evidence against this premise. We have now seen Augustine’s argument that moral notions never apply to dreams fail (because they can involve actions rather than happenings). In the next section we will see what the two main ethical positions might say on the issue of right and wrong in dreams.
Dreaming is an instance of a more general concern about a subset of thoughts – fantasies – that occur, potentially without affecting behaviour We seem to carry out actions during dreams in simulated realities involving other characters. So perhaps we ought to consider whether we are morally responsible for actions in dreams. More generally, are we morally obliged to not entertain certain thoughts, even if these thoughts do not affect our later actions and do not harm others? The same issue might be pressed with the use of violent video games, though the link to later behaviour is more controversial. Some people enjoy playing violent video games and the more graphic the better. Is that unethical in and of itself? Why should we excuse people’s thoughts – when, if they were carried out as actual actions they would be grossly wrong? Dreaming is perhaps a special instance because in ordinary dreams we believe we are carrying out actions in real life. What might the two main moral theories say about the issue, with the assumption in place that what we do in dreams does not affect our behaviour in waking life?
Consequentialism is a broad family of ethical doctrines which always assesses an action in terms of the consequences it has. There are two separate issues – ethical and empirical. The empirical question asks whether dreams, fantasies and video games are really without behavioural consequence towards others. To be clear, the Consequentialist is not arguing that dreams do not have any consequences, only that if they really do have no consequences then they are not morally evaluable or should be deemed neutral. Consequentialist theories may well argue that, provided that dreams really do not affect my behaviour later, it is not morally wrong to “harm” other dream characters, even in lucid dreaming. The more liberal Consequentialists might even see value in these instances of free thought. That is, there might be some intrinsic good in allowing such freedom of the mind but this is not a value that can be outweighed by actual harm to others, so the Consequentialists might claim. If having such lucid dreams makes me nicer to people in waking life, then the Consequentialist will actually endorse such activity during sleep.
Consequentialists will grant their argument even though dream content has an intentional relation to other people. Namely, dreams can often have singular content. Singular content, or singular thought, is to be contrasted with general content (the notion of singular thought is somewhat complex. Readers should consult Jeshion, 2010). If I simply form a mental representation of a blond Hollywood actor, the features of the representation might be too vague to pick out any particular individual. My representation could equally be fulfilled by Brad Pitt, Steve McQueen, a fictional movie star or countless other individuals. If I deliberately think of Brad Pitt, or if the images come to me detailed enough, then my thought does not have general content but is about that particular individual. Dreams are not always about people with general features (though they can be), but are rather often about people the sleeping individual is actually acquainted with – particular people from that individual’s own life – family, friends, and so forth.
Deontological theories, in stark contrast to Consequential theories, believe that we have obligations to act and think, or not act and think, in certain ways regardless of effects on other people. According to Deontological moral theories, I have a duty to never entertain certain thoughts because it is wrong in itself. Deontological theories see individuals as more important than mere consequences of action. Individuals are “ends-in-themselves” and not the means to a desirable state of affairs. Since dreams are often actually about real people, I am not treating that individual as an end-in-itself if I chose to harm their “dream representative”. The basic Deontological maxim to treat someone as an end rather than a means to my entertainment can apply to dreams.
As the debate between Deontologists and Consequentialists plays out, nuanced positions will reveal themselves. Perhaps there is room for agreement between the Consequentialist and Deontologist. Maybe I can carry out otherwise immoral acts on dream characters with general features where these characters do not represent any particular individuals of the waking world. Some Deontologists might still be unhappy with the notion that in dreams one crucial element of singular content remains – we represent ourselves in dreams. The arch-Deontologist Kant will argue that one is not treating oneself as an end-in-itself but a means to other ends by carrying out the acts; namely, there is something inherently wrong about even pretending to carry out an immoral action because in doing so we depersonalize ourselves. Other Deontologists might want to speak about fantasies being different from dreams. Fantasies are actions, where I sit down and decide to indulge my daydreams, whereas dreams might be more passive and therefore might respect the Augustinian distinction between actions and happenings. On this view, I am not using someone as a means to an end if I am just passively dreaming whereas I am if I start actively thinking about that individual. So maybe the Deontologist case only applies to lucid dreaming, where Augustine’s distinction would still be at work. This might exempt a large number of dreams from being wicked, but not all of them.
Deontology and Consequentialism are the two main moral positions. The third is Virtue Ethics, which emphasizes the role of character. This moral approach involves going beyond actions of right and wrong, avoiding harm and maximizing pleasure, and instead considers an individual for his or her overall life, how to make it a good one and develop that individual’s character. Where might dreaming fit in with the third moral position – that of the Virtue Ethicist? Virtue Ethics takes the question “what is the right action?” and turns it into the broader question: “how should I live?” The question “can we have immoral dreams?” needs to be opened up to: “what can I get out of dreaming to help me acquire virtuousness?”
The Virtue Ethics of dreaming might be pursued in a Freudian or Jungian vein. Dreams arguably put us in touch with our unconscious and indirectly tell us about our motives and habits in life:
“[I]t is in the world of dreaming that the unconscious is working out its powerful dynamics. It is there that the great forces do battle or combine to produce the attitudes, ideals, beliefs, and compulsions that motivate most of our behavior Once we become sensitive to dreams, we discover that every dynamic in a dream is manifesting itself in some way in our practical lives—in our actions, relationships, decisions, automatic routines, urges, and feelings.” (Johnson, 2009: p.19)
“Studying our own dreams can be valuable in all sorts of ways. They can be reveal our inner motivations and hopes, help us face our fears, encourage growing awareness and even be a source of creativity and insight.” (Blackmore, 2004: p.338)
In order to achieve happiness, fulfilment and developing virtuousness we owe it to ourselves to recall and pay attention to our dreams. However, this line of argument relies on the claim that dreams really do function in a way that Freud or Jung thought they do, which is controversial: dream analysis of any kind lacks scientific status and is more of an art. But then social dynamics and the development of character is more of an art than a science. Virtue Ethics is perhaps the opposite side of the coin of psychotherapy. The former focuses on positive improvement of character, whereas the latter focuses on avoiding negative setbacks in mind and behaviour Whether psychotherapy should be used more for positive improvement of character is a question approached in the philosophy of medicine. These considerations touch on a further question of whether dreams should be used in therapy.
Certain changes people make in waking life do eventually “show up” in dreams. Dreams, as unconsciously instantiated, capture patterns of thought from waking life. New modes of thinking can be introduced and this is the process by which people learn to lucid dream. By periodically introducing thoughts about whether one is awake or not during the day, every day for some period of time, this pattern of thinking eventually occurs in dreams. By constantly asking “am I awake?” in the day it becomes more likely to ask oneself in a dream, to realize that one is not awake and answer in the negative (Blackmore, 1991). With the possibility that dreams do capture waking life thinking and the notion that one can learn to lucid dream one may ask whether Augustine tried his hardest at stopping the dreams that troubled him and whether he was really as successful at quelling sexual urges in waking life as he thought he was.
Ordinary dreams are commonly thought to not actually involve choices and corresponding agency. Lucid dreaming invokes our ability to make choices, often to the same extent as in waking life. Lucid dreaming represents an example of being able to live and act in a virtual reality and is especially timely due to the rise in number of lucid dreamers (popular manuals on how to lucid dream are sold and actively endorsed by some leading psychologists; see LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990; Love, 2013) and the increase of virtual realities on computers. Whereas Deontologists and Consequentialists are likely to be more interested in the content of the dreams, the Virtue Ethicist will likely be more interested in dreaming as an overall activity and how it fits in with one’s life. Stephen LaBerge is perhaps an implicit Virtue Ethicist of dreaming. Though humans are thought to be moral agents, we spend a third of our lives asleep. 11% of our mental experiences are dreams (Love, 2013: p.2). The dreams we experience during sleep are mostly non-agentic and this amounts to a significant unfulfilled portion of our lives. LaBerge argues that by not cultivating lucid dreams, we miss out on opportunities to explore our own minds and ultimately enrich our waking lives (LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990: p.9). Arguably then, the fulfilled virtuous person will try to develop the skill of lucid dreaming. One could object that the dreamer should just get on with life in the real world. After all, learning to lucid dream for most people takes time and practice, requiring the individual to think about their dreams for periods of time in their waking life. They could be spending their time instead doing voluntary work for charity in real life. In reply, the Virtue Ethicist can show how parallel arguments can be made for meditation: individuals are calmer in situations that threaten their morality and are working on longer-term habits. Similarly, the lucid dreamer is achieving fulfilment and nurturing important long term traits and habits. By gaining control of dreams, there is the opportunity to examine relationships with people by representing them in dreams. Lucid dreams might aid in getting an individual to carry out a difficult task in real life by allowing them to practice it in life-like settings (that go beyond merely imagining the scenario in waking life). Lucid dreams may then help to play a role in developing traits that people otherwise would not develop, and act as an outlet for encouraging the “thick moral concepts” of oneself – courage, bravery, wisdom, and so forth. Lucid dreaming helps in developing such traits and so can be seen as a means to the end of virtuousness or act as a supplementary virtue. Human experience can be taken as any area in which a choice is required. At the very least then, lucid dreaming signifies an expansion of agency.
There is an implicit, unquestioned commitment in both Descartes’ dream argument and Augustine’s argument on the morality of dreaming. This is the received view, which is the platitudinous claim that a dream is a sequence of experiences that occur during sleep. The received view typically adheres to a number of further claims: that dreams play out approximately in real time and do not happen in a flash. When a dream is successfully remembered, the content of the dream is to a large extent what is remembered after waking (see Fig. 1 below), and an individual’s dream report is taken as excellent evidence for that dream having taken place.
The received view is committed to the claim that we do not wake up with misleading memories. Any failure of memory is of omission rather than error. I might wake unable to recall the exact details of certain parts of a dream, but I will not wake up and believe I had a dream involving contents which did not occur (I might recall details A – G with D missing, but I will not wake and recall content X, Y, Z). The received view is not committed to a claim about exactly how long a dream takes to experience, in correlation to how long it takes to remember, but dreams cannot occur instantaneously during sleep. The received view is committed to the claim that dreams are extended in time during sleep. The content does not necessarily have to occur just before waking; another graph detailing possible experience and later recollection of dream content on the received view might show A – G occurring much earlier in sleep (with the recalled A* – G* in the same place). A – G can represent any dream that people ordinarily recall
We can appear to carry out a scope of actions in our dreams pretty similar to those of waking life. Everything that we can do in waking life, we can also do in dreams. The exact same mental states can occur in dreams just as they do in waking life. We can believe, judge, reason and converse with what we take to be other individuals in our dreams. Since we can be frightened in a dream we can be frightened during sleep.
The received view is attested by reports of dreams from ordinary people in laboratory and everyday settings. Every dreamer portrays the dream as a mental experience that occurred during sleep. The received view is hence a part of folk psychology which is the term given to denote the beliefs that ordinary people hold on matters concerning psychology such as the nature of mental states. When it comes to dreaming, the consensus (folk psychology, scientific psychology and philosophy) agree that dreams are experiences that occur during sleep.
Malcolm stands in opposition to received view – the implicit set of claims about dreams that Descartes, Augustine and the majority of philosophers, psychologists and ordinary people are committed to. It will be worth separating Malcolm’s challenge to the received view into three arguments: #1 dream reports are unverifiable; #2 sleep and dreaming have conflicting definitions; #3 communication and judgements cannot occur during sleep.
According to Malcolm’s first argument, we should not simply take dream reports at face value, as the received view has done; dream reports are insufficient to believe the metaphysical claim that dreaming consciously takes place during sleep. When we use introspection after sleeping to examine our episodic memories of dreams and put our dream report into words, these are not the dream experiences themselves. Malcolm adds that there is no other way to check the received view’s primary claim that dreams are consciously experienced during sleep. Importantly, Malcolm states that the sole criterion we have for establishing that one has had a dream is that one awakes with the impression of having dreamt (that is, an apparent memory) and that one then goes on to report the dream. Waking with the impression does not entail that there was a conscious experience during sleep that actually corresponds to the report. Malcolm views dream reports as inherently first personal and repeatedly claims that the verbal report of a dream is the only criterion for believing that a dream took place. He adds that dreams cannot be checked in any other way without either showing that the individual is not fully asleep or by invoking a new conception of dreaming by relying on behavioural criteria such as patterns of physiology or movement during sleep. Behavioral criteria too, are insufficient to confirm that an individual is consciously experiencing their dreams, according to Malcolm. The best we can get from that are probabilistic indications of consciousness that will never be decisive. If scientists try to show that one is dreaming during sleep then those scientists have invoked a new conception of dreaming that does not resemble the old one, Malcolm alleges. He believes that where scientists appeal to behavioural criteria they are no longer inquiring into dreaming because the real conception of dreaming has only ever relied on dream reports. A dream is logically inseparable from the dream report and it cannot be assumed that the report refers to an experience during sleep. Malcolm thereby undermines the received view’s claim that “I dreamed that I was flying” entails that I had an experience during sleep in which I believed I was flying. Hence there is no way of conclusively confirming the idea that dreaming occurs during sleep at all.
Malcolm’s claim that the received view is unverifiable is inspired by a statement made by Wittgenstein who alludes to the possibility that there is no way of finding out if the memory of a dream corresponds to the dream as it actually occurred (Wittgenstein, 1953: part 2, § vii; p.415). Wittgenstein asks us what we should do about a man who has an especially bad memory. How can we trust his reports of dreams? The received view is committed to a crucial premise that when we recall dreams we recall the same content of the earlier experience. But Wittgenstein’s scenario establishes the possibility that an individual could recall content that did not occur. The question then arises as to why we should believe that somebody with even a good day-to-day memory is in any better position to remember earlier conscious experiences during sleep after waking.
In drawing attention to empirical work on dreams, Malcolm says that psychologists have come to be uncertain whether dreams occur during sleep or during the moment of waking up. The point for Malcolm is that it is “impossible to decide” between the two (Malcolm, 1956: p.29). Hence the question “when, in his sleep, did he dream?” is senseless. There is also a lack of criterion for the duration of dreams, that is how long they last in real time. Malcolm states that the concept of the time of occurrence of a dream and also how long a dream might last has no application in ordinary conversation about dreams. “In this sense, a dream is not an ‘occurrence’ and, therefore, not an occurrence during sleep” (Malcolm: 1956, p.30). Malcolm’s epistemic claim has a metaphysical result, namely, that dreaming does not take place in time or space. The combination of the waking impression and the use of language has misled us into believing that dreams occur during sleep; “dreams” do not refer to anything over and above the waking report, according to Malcolm. This is why Malcolm thinks that the notion of “dreaming” is an exemplar of Wittgenstein’s idea of prejudices “produced by ‘grammatical illusions’” (Malcolm, 1959: p. 75).
According to Malcolm’s second argument, he accuses the received view of contradicting itself and so the claim that dreams could consciously occur during sleep is incoherent. Sleep is supposed to entail a lack of experiential content, or at least an absence of intended behaviour, whereas dreaming is said to involve conscious experience. Experience implies consciousness; sleep implies a lack of consciousness; therefore the claim that dreams could occur during sleep implies consciousness and a lack of consciousness. So the received view results in a contradiction. This alleged contradiction of sleep and dreaming supports Malcolm’s first argument that dreams are unverifiable because any attempt to verify the dream report will just show that the individual was not asleep and so there is no way to verify that dreams could possibly occur during sleep. One might object to Malcolm that the content of a dream report could coincide well with a publicly verifiable event, such as the occurrence of thunder while the individual slept and thunder in the reported dream later. Malcolm claims that in this instance the individual could not be sound asleep if they are aware of their environment in any way. He alleges that instances such as nightmares and sleepwalking also invoke new conceptions of sleep and dreaming. By “sleep” Malcolm thinks that people have meant sound sleep as the paradigmatic example, namelessly, sleeping whilst showing no awareness of the outside environment and no behaviour.
Malcolm takes communication as a crucial way of verifying that a mental state could be experienced. His third argument rules out the possibility of individuals communicating or making judgements during sleep, essentially closing off dreams as things we can know anything about. This third argument supports the first argument that dreams are unverifiable and anticipates a counter-claim that individuals might be able to report a dream as it occurs, thereby verifying it as a conscious experience. Malcolm claims that a person cannot say and be aware of saying the statement “I am asleep” without it being false. It is true that somebody could talk in his sleep and incidentally say “I am asleep” but he could not assert that he is asleep. If he is actually asleep then he is not aware of saying the statement (and so it is not an assertion), whilst if he is aware of saying the statement then he is not asleep. Since a sleeping individual cannot meaningfully assert that he is asleep, Malcolm concludes that communication between a sleeping individual and individuals who are awake is logically impossible.
As inherently first personal and retrospective reports, or so Malcolm alleges, the dream report fails Wittgensteinian criteria of being potentially verified as experiences. Malcolm alleges that there could be no intelligible mental state that could occur during sleep; any talk about mental states that could occur during sleep is meaningless. Malcolm assumes the Wittgensteinian point that talk about experiences gain meaning in virtue of their communicability. Communicability is necessary for the meaningfulness of folk psychological terms. Malcolm appeals to the “no private language argument” to rebut the idea that there could be a mental state which only one individual could privately experience and understand (for more on the private language argument, see Candlish & Wrisley, 2012).
The claim that there is a lack of possible communicability in sleep is key for Malcolm to cash out the further claim that one cannot make judgements during sleep. He does not believe that one could judge what they cannot communicate. According to Malcolm, since people cannot communicate during sleep, they cannot make judgements during sleep. He further adds that being unable to judge that one is asleep underlies the impossibility of being unable to have any mental experience during sleep. For, we could never observe an individual judge that he was asleep. This point relies on Malcolm’s second argument that the definitions of sleep and dreaming are in contradiction. There is nothing an individual could do to demonstrate he was making a judgement that did not also simultaneously show that he was awake. Of course, it seems possible that we could have an inner experience that we did not communicate to others. Malcolm points out that individuals in everyday waking instances could have communicated their experiences, at least modally. There is no possible world though, in which a sleeping individual could communicate with us his experience – so one cannot judge that one is asleep and dreaming. If Malcolm’s argument about the impossibility of making judgements in sleep works then his attack is detrimental to the received view’s premise that in sleep we can judge, reason, and so forth.
Malcolm thinks that his challenge to the received view, if successful, undercuts Cartesian scepticism Descartes’ scepticism got off the ground when he raised the following issue: due to the similarity of dreams and waking experiences, my apparent waking experience might be a dream now and much of what I took to be knowledge is potentially untrue. A key premise for Descartes is that a dream is a sequence of experiences, the very same kind we can have whilst awake. This premise is undermined if dreams are not experiences at all. If the received view is unintelligible then Descartes cannot coherently compare waking life experiences to dreams: “if one cannot have thoughts while sound asleep, one cannot be deceived while sound asleep” (Malcolm: 1956, p.22). Descartes, championing the received view, failed to notice the incoherence in the notion that we can be asleep and aware of anything. Whenever we are aware of anything, whether it be the fire in front of us or otherwise, this is firm evidence that we are awake and that the world presented to us is as it really is.
Part of Malcolm’s challenge to empirical work was his claim that the researchers have invoked new conceptions of sleep and dreaming (without realizing it) because of the new method of attempted verification. According to Malcolm’s charge, researchers are not really looking into dreaming as the received view understands the concept of dreaming. This was crucial for his attempt to undermine all empirical work on dreaming. Instead of relying on an individual’s waking report scientists may now try to infer from rapid eye movements or other physiological criteria that the individual is asleep and dreaming. For Malcolm, these scientists are working from a new conception of “sleep” and “dreaming” which only resembles the old one. Putnam objects to Malcolm’s claim, stating that science updates our concepts and does not replace them: the received view seeks confirmation in empirical work. In general, concepts are always being updated by new empirical knowledge. Putnam cites the example of Multiple Sclerosis (MS), a disease which is made very difficult to diagnose because the symptoms resemble those of other neurological diseases and not all of the symptoms are usually present. Furthermore, some neurologists have come to believe that MS is caused by a certain virus. Suppose a patient has a paradigmatic case of MS. Saying that the virus is the cause of the disease changes the concept because it involves new knowledge. On Malcolm’s general account, it would be a new understanding with a new concept and so the scientists would not be talking about MS at all (Putnam, 1962: p.219). Putnam believes that we should reject Malcolm’s view that future scientists are talking about a different disease. Analogously, we are still talking about the same thing when we talk about new ways of verifying the existence of dreams. If Putnam’s attack is successful then the work that scientists are doing on dreaming is about dreaming as the received view understands the concept, namely, conscious experiences that occur during sleep. If Putnam is right that scientists are not invoking a new conception of sleep and dreaming, then we can find other ways to verify our understanding of dreaming and the received view is continuous with empirical work.
David Rosenthal develops some conceptual vocabulary (Rosenthal: 2002, p.406), which arguably exposes a flaw in Malcolm’s reasoning. “Creature consciousness” is what any individual or animal displays when awake and responsive to external stimuli. “Creature unconsciousness” is what the individual or animal displays when unresponsive to external stimuli. “State consciousness,” on the other hand, refers to the mental state that occurs when one has an experience. This may be either internally or externally driven. I may have a perception of my environment or an imaginative idea without perceptual input. Malcolm evidently thinks that any form of state consciousness requires some degree of creature consciousness. But such a belief begs the question, so a Rosenthalian opponent of Malcolm might argue. It does not seem to be conceptually confused to believe that one can be responsive to internal stimuli (hence state conscious) without being responsive to external stimuli (hence creature unconscious). If, by “sleep” all we have meant is creature unconsciousness, then there is no reason to believe that an individual cannot have state conscious at the same time. An individual can be creature unconscious whilst having state consciousness, that is to say, an individual can be asleep and dreaming.
There are various reasons to believe that creature consciousness and state consciousness can come apart (and that state consciousness can plausibly occur without creature consciousness): the mental experience of dreaming can be gripping and the individual’s critical reasoning poor enough to be deceived into believing his dream is reality; most movement in sleep is not a response to outside stimuli at all but rather a response to internal phenomenology; the sleeping individual is never directly aware of his own body during sleep. Recall that Malcolm thought that sleep scientists cannot correlate movement in sleep with a later dream report because it detracted from their being fully asleep because creature consciousness and state consciousness can coexist. Malcolm is arguably wrong, then, to think that an individual moving in sleep detracts from their being fully asleep. This may block Malcolm’s appeal to sound sleep as the paradigmatic example of sleep. With the Rosenthalian distinction, we have reason to believe that even if an individual moves around in sleep, they are just as asleep as a sleeping individual lying completely still. The distinction may also count against Malcolm’s third argument against the possibility of communication in sleep. Of course, if creature consciousness is a necessary condition for communication then this distinction is not enough to undermine Malcolm’s third argument that communication cannot occur during sleep. A view where state consciousness alone suffices for communication will survive Malcolm’s third argument, on the other hand.
The apparent contradiction in sleep and dreaming that Malcolm claims existed will be avoided if the kind of consciousness implied by sleep is different to the kind Malcolm thinks is implied. The distinction might allow us to conclude that corroboration between a waking report and a publically verifiable sound, for example, can demonstrate that an individual is dreaming and yet asleep. Some dream content, as reported afterwards, seems to incorporate external stimuli that occurred at the same time as the dream. Malcolm calls this faint perception (Malcolm, 1956: p.22) of the environment and says that it detracts from an individual’s being fully asleep. Perhaps an objector to Malcolm can make a further, albeit controversial claim, in the Rosenthalian framework, to account for such dreams. For example, if there is thunder outside and an individual is asleep he might dream of being struck by Thor’s hammer. His experience of the thunder is not the same sort of experience he would have had if he were awake during the thunder. The possible qualia are different. So Malcolm may be wrong in alleging that an individual is faintly aware of the outside environment if corroboration is attempted between a report and a verifiable sound, for example. Malcolm argued that such dreams are examples of individuals who are not fully asleep. But we can now see within the Rosenthalian framework how an individual could be creature unconscious (or simply “asleep” on the received view) and be taking in external stimuli unconsciously whilst having state consciousness that is not directly responsive to the external environment because he is not even faintly conscious of the external world.
See Nagel (1959), Yost (1959), Ayer (1960; 1961), Pears (1961), Kramer (1962) and Chappell (1963), for other replies to Malcolm.
Dennett begins his attack on the received view of dreaming (the set of claims about dreams being consciously experienced during sleep) by questioning its authority. He does this by proposing a new model of dreaming. He is flexible in his approach and considers variations of his model. The crucial difference between his theory and the received view is that consciousness is not present during sleep on, what we might call Dennett’s uploading of unconscious content model of dreaming. Dennett does not say much about how this processing of unconscious material works, only that different memories are uploaded and woven together to create new content that will be recalled upon waking as though it was experienced during sleep, although it never was. Dennett is not repeating Malcolm’s first argument that dreaming is unverifiable. On the contrary, he believes that the issue will be settled empirically, though he claims that there is nothing to favour the received view’s own claim that dreams involve conscious experiences.
On the received view, the memory of an earlier dream is caused by the earlier dream experience and is the second time the content is experienced. On Dennett’s model, dream recall is the first time the content is experienced. Why believe that dreaming involves a lack of consciousness during sleep? One might cite evidence that the directions of rapid eye movements during sleep have been well correlated with the reports of dream content. An individual with predominantly horizontal eye movements might wake up and report that they were watching a tennis match in their dream. Dennett accommodates these (at the time) unconfirmed findings by arguing that even if it is the case that eye movement matches perfectly with the reported content, the unconscious is uploading memories and readying the content that will be experienced in the form of a false memory. The memory loading process is not conscious at the time of occurrence. Such findings would almost return us back to the received view – that the content of the dream does occur during sleep. It may be that the unconscious content is uploaded sequentially in the same order as the received view believes. We do not have proof that the individual is aware of the content of the dream during sleep. That is to say, the individual may not be having a conscious experience, even though the brain process involves the scenario which will be consciously experienced later, as though it was consciously experienced during sleep. Movement and apparent emotion in sleep can be accounted for too; a person twitches in their sleep as a memory with content involving a frightening scenario is uploaded and interwoven into a nightmarish narrative. It does not necessarily follow that the individual is conscious of this content being uploaded. This account is even plausible on an evolutionary account of sleep. The mind needs time to be unconscious and the brain and body needs to recalibrate. Thus, during sleep, the body is like a puppet, its strings being pulled by the memory loading process – although individuals show outward sign of emotion and bodily movement, there is nothing going on inside. Sometimes, though, what is remembered is the content being prepared, similar to the received view, only the individual is not aware of the content during sleep – this is why there can be matches between dream content reported and the direction of eye movement. Both sides of the debate agree that when dream content is being prepared some parts of the body move about as though it was a conscious experience, only Dennett denies that consciousness is present at the time and the received view believes that it is present.
Dennett also considers possibilities where the content of dream recall does not match the content that is uploaded. The content of the uploading during sleep might involve, say, window shopping in a local mall, yet the content that is recalled upon waking might recall flying over Paris. Having outlined the two theories – the received view and his own unconscious alternative – Dennett is merely making a sceptical point that the data of dream reports alone will not decide between them. What is to choose between them? Dennett believes that there is further evidence of a specific type of dream report that might decide the issue in favour of his own model.
Any scientific theory must be able to account for all of the data. Dennett believes that there exists certain dream reports which the received view has failed to acknowledge and cannot account for. There exists anecdotal evidence that seems to suggest that dreams are concocted at the moment of waking, rather than experienced during sleep and is therefore a direct challenge to the received view. The most well-known anecdotal example was noted by French physicist Alfred Maury, who dreamt for some time of taking part in the French Revolution, before being forcibly taken to the Guillotine. As his head was about to be cut off in the dream, he woke up with the headboard falling on his neck (Freud, 1900: Chapter 1; Blackmore, 2005: p. 103). This anecdotal type of dream is well documented in films – one dreams of taking a long romantic vacation with a significant other, about to kiss them, only to wake up with the dog licking their face. In Dennett’s own anecdotal example, he recalls dreaming for some time of looking for his neighbour’s goat. Eventually, the goat started bleating at the same time as his alarm clock went off which then woke him up (Dennett: 1976, p.157). The received view is committed to the claim that dreams, that is, conscious experiences, occur whilst an individual is asleep. The individual then awakes with the preserved memory of content from the dream. But the anecdotes pose a potentially fatal problem for the received view because the entire content of the dream seems to be caused by the stimulus that woke the individual up. The anecdotes make dreams look more like spontaneous imaginings on waking than the real time conscious experiences of the received view. Dennett argues that precognition is the only defense the received view can take against this implication. Given the paranormal connotations, this defense is redundant (Dennett: 1976, p. 158). Dennett provides a number of other anecdotal examples that imply that the narrative to dreams is triggered retrospectively, after waking. The content of the dream thematically and logically leads up to the end point, which is too similar to the waking stimulus to be a coincidence. The difficulty for the received view is to explain how the content could be working towards simultaneously ending with the sound, or equivalent experience, of something in the outside environment. Figures 2 and 3 depict the attempts to explain the new data on the received view and Dennett’s model.
If Dennett is right that the received view can only explain the anecdotes by appeal to precognition then we would do well to adopt a more plausible account of dreaming. Any attempt to suggest that individuals have premonitions about the near future from dreams would have little credibility. Dennett’s alternative unconscious uploading account might also allow for the retro-selection of appropriate content on the moment of waking. This theory allows for two ways of dreaming to regularly occur, both without conscious experience during sleep. The first way: dreams play out similar to the received view, only individuals lack consciousness of the content during sleep. Specifically, Dennett argues that during sleep different memories are uploaded by the unconscious and woven together to create the dream content that will eventually be experienced when the individual wakes. During sleep the content of the dream is gathered together by the brain, without conscious awareness, like recording a programme at night which is consciously played for the first time in waking moments. The second way: perhaps when one is woken up dramatically, the brain selects material (relevant to the nature of the waking stimulus) at the moment of waking which is threaded together as a new story, causing the individual to have a “hallucination of recollection” (Dennett, 1976: p.169). It might be that the unconscious was preparing entirely different content during sleep, which was set to be recalled, but that content is overwritten due to the dramatic interruption.
On Dennett’s unconscious uploading/retro-selection theory, “it is not like anything to dream, although it is like something to have dreamed” (Dennett, 1976: p.161). Consciousness is invoked on waking as one apparently remembers an event which had never consciously occurred before. On the above proposal, Dennett was not experiencing A – G, nor was the content for that dream even being prepared (though it might have been material prepared at an earlier date and selected now). Dennett also alludes to a library in the brain of undreamed dreams with various endings that are selected in the moments of waking to appropriately fit the narrative connotations of the stimuli that wakes the individual (Dennett, 1976: p. 158). His account is open to include variations of his model: perhaps various different endings might be selected – instead of a goat, other content may have competed for uploading through association – it may have been a dream involving going to the barbers and getting a haircut, before the buzzing of the clippers coincided with the alarm clock, or boarding a spaceship before it took off, had the sound of the alarm clock been more readily associated with these themes. Alternatively, the same ending might get fixed with alternative story-lines leading up to that ending. Dennett could have had a dream about going to his local job centre and being employed as a farmer, rather than searching for his neighbour’s goat, though the same ending of finding a bleating goat will stay in place.
As Dennett notes, if any of these possibilities turn out to be true then the received view is false and so they are serious rivals indeed. For all the evidence we have (in 1976), Dennett believes his unconscious uploading model is better placed to explain the data than the received view because the anecdotes prove that sometimes the conscious experience only occurs after sleep – an alien idea to the received view. Moreover, the received view should have no immediate advantage over the other models. Dennett separates the memory from the experience – the memory of a dream is first experienced consciously when it is recalled. The result is the same as Malcolm’s – the received view is epistemologically and metaphysically flawed. If there is nothing it is like to have a dream during sleep, then the recall of dreams does not refer to any experience that occurred during sleep.
It might seem that lucid dreaming is an immediate objection to Malcolm and Dennett’s arguments against the received view. Lucid dreaming occurs when an individual is aware during a dream that it is a dream. Lucid dreaming is therefore an example of experiencing a dream whilst one is asleep, therefore dreams must be experiences that occur during sleep. In replying to this objection, Dennett argues that lucid dreaming does not really occur. For, the waking impression might contain “the literary conceit of a dream within a dream” (Dennett: 1976, p.161). The recalled dream might just have content where it seems as though the individual is aware they are having a dream. Even this content might have been uploaded unconsciously during sleep. It might now seem that we have no obvious way of testing that the individual who reports having had a lucid dream is aware of the dream at the time. Dennett’s reply is undermined by a series of experiments carried out by Stephen LaBerge. LaBerge asked individuals who could lucid dream to voluntarily communicate with him in their lucid dreams by using the match in content of the dream to the direction of eye movements, thereby challenging Dennett’s claim that individuals are not conscious during sleep. The participants made pre-arranged and agreed eye movements. One might think that if lucid dreaming is really occurring, and the direction of REM might be linked to the content of the dream as it occurs, then one could pre-arrange some way of looking around in a lucid dream (that stands out from random eye movement) in order to test both theories. Stephen LaBerge carried out this experiment with positive results (LaBerge, 1990). The meaning of certain patterns of intended and previously arranged eye movement, for example, left-right-left-right can be a sleeping individual’s way of expressing the fact that they are having a dream and aware that they are having a dream (see figure below).
In figure 4 above, the graph correlates with the reported dream content. The participant wakes and gives a dream report which matches the eye movement. The participant claims to have made five eye signals as agreed. The written report confirms the eye movements and the participant is not shown any of the physiological data until his report is given. He alleges to have gained lucidity in the first eye movement (1, LRLR). He then flew about in his dream, until 2, where he signalled that he thought he had awakened (2, LRx4). 2 is a false awakening which he then realized and went on to signal lucidity once again in 3. Here, he made too many eye signals and went on to correct this. This corroborates with the participant’s report. The participant accurately signals in the fifth set of eye movements that he is awake which coincides with the other physiological data that the participant is awake (participants were instructed to keep their eyes closed when they thought they had awoken).
The important implication of LaBerge’s experiment for Malcolm and Dennett’s arguments is that they can no longer dismiss the results of content matching with eye movement as merely “apparent” or “occasional” (as they took the content-relative-to-eye-movement claim at the time they wrote). Predictability is a hallmark of good science and these findings indicate that sleep science can achieve such status. The content-relativity thesis is confirmed by the findings because it is exactly what that thesis predicts in LaBerge’s experiment. The opposing thesis – that eye movement is not relative to content, cannot explain why the predicted result occurred. Namely, if we believe that eye content might match the content of the dream (and that lucid dreaming really can occur, contra Dennett), then if sleep scientists asked participants to do something in their dream (upon onset of lucidity) that would show that they are aware – this is what we would expect.
The received view gains further confirmation because in order to make sense of the communication as communication, one has to employ the notion that the direction of eye movement was being voluntarily expressed. If one is convinced by LaBerge’s arguments, then the notion of communicating during sleep undercuts Malcolm’s privilege of the dream report and his claim that individuals could never communicate during sleep. We can empirically demonstrate, then, that the waking impression and the dream itself are logically separable. We need an account of why a sleeping individual would be exhibiting such systematic eye movements in LaBerge’s experiments. One reasonable conclusion is that the participant is mentally alert (has state consciousness) even though they are not awake (are not displaying creature consciousness). The most important implication of LaBerge’s study is that communication can arguably occur from within the dream without waking the individual up in any way. This supports the claim of the received view that we can be asleep and yet having a sequence of conscious experiences at the same time. The content of the dream occurs during sleep because the content is matched to the expected, systematic eye movement beyond coincidence. The systematic eye movement occurs exactly as predicted on the received view. Although Dennett could account for matched content to eye movement – he could not account for what seems like voluntary communication, which requires that an individual is conscious. This arguably leaves us in a position to cash out dreaming experience as verifiable as any other waking state.
The “content relative to eye movement” thesis can be accepted uncontroversially. Much dream content really does occur during sleep and this can be taken advantage of via participants communicating and thereby demonstrating conscious awareness. If LaBerge’s participants communicating with sleep scientists convinces, then the received view is right to think that the content of dreams does occur during sleep and that the dream content during sleep matches the memory of dream content. The findings are significant insofar as the participants influenced the dream content and thereby influenced eye movement through an act of agency within the dream.
The most important potential implication of LaBerge’s findings, though the more controversial implication, is that communication can occur from within the dream without the individual waking up in any way, thereby confirming the received view. The content of the dream occurs during sleep because the study confirms that eye movement during sleep really does match up with the content of the dream as reported after sleep. LaBerge chose agreed eye movements rather than speech, because in this way, the individual would remain asleep. The experiment also challenges Malcolm’s claim that dreams cannot be communicated and were therefore logically unverifiable.
There exists a possible objection to the received view cashing in the results from LaBerge’s experiments, which can be raised in line with Dennett’s unconscious memory-loading process. The objector might argue that the unconscious takes care of the pending task of looking around in the dream in the pre-arranged manner. If, according to Dennett’s retro-selection model, the unconscious uploads memories from the day, then it follows that one of the memories it might upload could be of the participant discussing with LaBerge the specific eye movements to be made. So the unconscious might carry out the eye movements, misleading scientists into believing the sleeping individual is conscious. Once we start to credit the unconscious with being able to negotiate with waking memories during sleep and to make judgements, we either have to change our picture of the unconscious or conclude that these individuals are consciously aware during sleep.
LaBerge carried out a further experiment in which the timing of dreams was measured from within the dream. The experiment used lucid dreamers again who made the agreed signal. They then counted to 10 in their dream and then made the eye signal again. They were also asked to estimate the passing of 10 seconds without counting (see fig. 5 below). LaBerge has concluded from his experiments that experience in dreams happens roughly at the same time as in waking life. This second experiment carried out by LaBerge further blunts the Dennettian objection from unconsciously uploading the task. For, it seems to require agency (rather than unconscious processing) to negotiate how much time is passing before carrying out an action.
There is still room for scepticism towards dreams being consciously experienced during sleep. For, the sceptic could bite the bullet and say that lucid dreams are a special, anomalous case that does not apply to ordinary dreaming. Indeed, there is evidence that different parts of the brain are accessed, or more strongly activated, during lucid dreaming (pre-frontal brain regions, pre-cuneus and front polar regions). So there still remains the possibility that lucid dreaming is an example of consciously “waking up within a dream” whilst ordinary dreams are taken care of entirely by the unconscious (thus there is not anything-it’s-like to have an ordinary dream occur during sleep). It might be useful to look at one report of the memory of a lucid dream:
In a dangerous part of San Francisco, for some reason I start crawling on the sidewalk. I start
to reflect: this is strange; why can’t I walk? Can other people walk upright here? Is it just me
who has to crawl? I see a man in a suit walking under the streetlight. Now my curiosity is
replaced by fear. I think, crawling around like this may be interesting but it is not safe. Then I
think, I never do this – I always walk around San Francisco upright! This only happens in
dreams. Finally, it dawns on me: I must be dreaming! (LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990: p.35)
Notice that this is not just the memory-report of a lucid dream. Rather, it is the memory-report of an ordinary dream turning into a lucid dream. The report demonstrates an epistemic transition within the dream. With this in mind, it is difficult to maintain that lucid dreams are anomalous, or that lucid dreams bring about conscious experience. For, there is a gradual process of realization. We might want to also thus accept that the preceding ordinary dream is conscious too because whenever individuals gain lucidity in their dreams, there is a prior process of gradual realization that is present in the dream report. When an individual acquires lucidity in a dream, they are arguably already conscious but they begin to think more critically, as the above example demonstrates. Different parts of the brain are activated during lucidity, but these areas do not implicate consciousness. Rather, they are better correlated to the individual thinking more critically.
The gradual transition from ordinary dream to lucid dream can be more fully emphasized. It is possible to question oneself in a dream whilst failing to provide the right answer. One might disbelieve that one is awake and ask another dream character to hit oneself, apparently feel pain and so conclude that one is awake. It is important here to highlight the existence of partial-lucid dreams in order to show that dreams often involve irrationality and that there are fine-grained transitions to the fuller lucidity of critical thinking in dreams. A lucid dream, unlike ordinary dreams, is defined strictly in terms of the advanced epistemic status of the dreamer – the individual is having a lucid dream if they are aware that he or she is dreaming (Green, 1968: p.15). Lucid dreaming is defined in the weak sense as awareness that one is dreaming. Defined more strongly, lucid dreams involve controllability and a level of clarity akin to waking life. As stated, individuals can come close to realizing they are dreaming and miss out – they might dream about the nature of dreaming or lucid dreaming without realizing that they are currently in a dream themselves. Hence the norms of logical inference do not apply to ordinary dreams. One might look around in one’s dream and think “I must remember the people in this dream for my dream journal” without inferring that one is in a dream and acquiring lucidity. In another dream an individual might intend to tell another person in real life, who is featured in the dream, something they have learned just as soon as they wake up. In a dream, the dreamer could be accused by dream character Y of carrying out an action A – the dreamer thinks “I must wake up to tell Y that I did not carry out this action.” Implicitly, the dreamer knows it is a dream to make sense of the belief that they need to wake up, but they have not realized that Y will not have a continuation of the beliefs of their dream representative. The dream here involves awareness of the dream state without controllability over the dream (for they still seem to be going along with the content as though it were real). There is another type of common, partial-lucid dream in which people wake up from a dream and are able to return to it upon sleeping and change the course of the dream. This type of dream seems to involve controllability without awareness – they treat it as real and do not treat it as an acknowledged dream but are able to have much more control over the content than usual. Lucid dreamers used in experimental settings are much more experienced and have lucid dreams in the strongest sense – they are aware they are dreaming (and can maintain this awareness for a significant duration of time), have control over the content and have a level of clarity of thinking akin to waking life.
There are a number of further implications of LaBerge’s findings for various philosophical claims. The existence of communication during lucid dreaming challenges Augustine’s idea that dreams are not actions. If we can gain the same level of agency we have in waking life during lucid dreaming, then it might be the case that even ordinary dreams carry some, albeit reduced, form of agency. We might want to believe this new claim if we accept that agency is not suddenly invoked during lucidity, but is rather enhanced. The findings also open up the possibility to test the claim that somebody who is dreaming cannot tell that they are not awake, further undermining Descartes’ claim that dreaming and waking experiences are inherently indistinguishable. Previously, philosophers who wanted to resist the sceptical argument would say that someone who is dreaming might be able unable to distinguish the state they were in but not that someone awake is unable to distinguish, for example, Locke’s point that if we are in pain then we must be in an awake state. Had Descartes been a lucid dreamer, then when he was sat by the fire, his phrase might have come out as “I am now seated by the fire but I have also been deceived in dreams into believing I have been seated by the fire … though on occasion I have realized that I was just dreaming when apparently seated by the fire and so was not deceived at all!” It is surely a contingent fact that people rarely have lucid dreams. If people lucidly dreamt much more often, then Descartes’ sceptical dream argument would have had little to motivate it. Work on communicative lucid dreaming might also open up the possibility to test further phenomenally distinguishing features between the two states via individuals communicating statements about these features.
Dennett had cited an interesting type of dream report where the ending of the dream was strongly implied by the stimulus of awakening. For example: having a dream of getting married end with the sound of church bells ringing, which coincides with the sound of the alarm clock. These seemingly precognitive dreams are sometimes referred to in the literature as “the anecdotes” because of their generally non-experimental form. Though they are remote from scientific investigation, the mere existence of the anecdotes at all caused trouble for the received view and requires explanation. They provide extra evidence for Dennett’s proposed paradigm shift of dreaming. On the other hand, if there is enough evidence to claim that dreams are consciously experienced during sleep then the anecdotal data of dreams will not be a powerful enough counterexample; they will not warrant a paradigm shift in our thinking about dreams. The biggest challenge the anecdotes represent is that on occasion the memory can significantly deviate from the actual experience. On this view, false memories overriding the actual content of the dream does occur, but these experiences are the exception rather than the rule.
Though LaBerge’s experiments suggest that the content of dreams consciously occurs during sleep, the findings on their own are insufficient to draw the conclusion that all dreams occur during sleep. The existence of the anecdotes blocks one from drawing that conclusion. But these anecdotes can be explained on the received view. It is already known that the human species has specific bodily rhythms for sleep. Further, there is a noted phenomenon that people wake up at the same time even when their alarm clocks are off. Dennett himself says that he had got out his old alarm clock that he had not used in months and set the alarm himself (Dennett, 1976: p.157) – presumably for a time he usually gets up at anyway. If the subconscious can be credited with either creating a dream world on the received view or a dream memory on the Dennettian view and the personal body clock works with some degree of automaticity during sleep, one may well ask why the dream’s anticipation (and symbolic representation) of this need be precognitive in a paranormal sense. Had Dennett woken up earlier, he may have lain in bed realizing that his alarm clock was going to go off, which is not considered an act of precognition. Had he thought this during sleep, the received view would expect it to be covered symbolically via associative imagery. Thus, perhaps Dennett is not being impartial in his treatment of dreams, and his argument begs the question since he is considering the received view’s version of dreaming to be inferior to his own theory by assuming that thought in dreaming is completely oblivious to the banalities of the future.
Arguably, the other anecdotes can be explained away. Recall the most famous anecdote, where Maury was dragged to the guillotine with the headboard falling on his neck, waking him up (Freud discusses the case of Maury in the first chapter of his Interpretation of Dreams). Maury may have had some ongoing and subconscious awareness of the wobbliness of his headboard before it fell (presumably it did not fall without movement on his part – possibly in resistance to being beheaded. Maury’s could thus be a type of dreaming involving self-fulfilling prophecy) that is left out of the overall account. Dennett’s account agrees that any unconscious awareness of the outside environment is represented differently in the dream. Maury would have had enough time to form the simple association of his headboard being like a guillotine from the French Revolution. If he had some awareness of the looseness of his headboard, then the thought: “if this headboard falls on me it will be like being beheaded,” would be appropriately synchronized into the dream.
Though it is possible to provide alternative explanation for some of the anecdotes, it might be worth dividing Dennett’s anecdotes into hard and soft anecdotes. A hard anecdote is outlined by Dennett: a car backfires outside and an individual wakes up with the memory of a dream logically leading up to being shot. The soft anecdotes, those already mentioned (such as Maury’s and Dennett’s own examples), can at least be alternatively explained. The hard anecdotes, on the other hand, cannot simply be explained by appeal to body clocks and anticipation in sleep. The hard anecdotes reveal that the dreamer has no idea what will wake them up in the morning, if anything (maybe the alarm will not actually go off; or the truck backfiring could occur at any point). The soft anecdotes might involve outside stimuli being unconsciously incorporated into the dream. The only hard anecdote mentioned in Dennett’s paper is made up by Dennett himself to outline his theory, rather than representing a genuine example of a dream. Notice that a hard anecdote could favour the received view – if experimenters switched off an alarm that a participant had set and that individual woke with a dream which seemed to anticipate the alarm going off at the set time (for example, had Dennett’s goat dream occurred despite his alarm not going off) then we might do best to conclude that the dream consciously occurred during sleep in a sequential order leading up to the awakening. Dennett is right that the issue is worth empirically investigating. If a survey found that hard anecdote-like dreams (such as a truck back-firing and waking with a dream thematically similar) occur often, then the received view is either dis-confirmed or must find a way to make room for such dreams.
Dennett might reply that he does not need to wait for the empirical evidence to reveal that the hard anecdotes are common. He might simply deny that the alternative explanation of the soft anecdotes is not credible. If the attempt to explain the soft anecdotes are not credible (as a Dennettian might object), they at least draw attention to the extraneous variables in each of the anecdotes. Dennett’s sole reason for preferring his retro-selection theory over the received view is so an explanation can account for the anecdotal data. But Dennett uses his own alarm clock which he himself set the night before; Maury uses his own bed; Dennett of course admits that the evidence is anecdotal and not experimental. In one of the few actual experiments carried out, water is slowly dripped onto a sleeping participant’s back to wake them up, but this is not timed and is akin to a soft anecdote. More empirical work needs to be done to clarify the issue and for the debate to move forward.
The anecdotes are a specific subclass of prophetic dreams. It is worth noting a related issue about dreams which are alleged to have a more prophetic nature. It seems from the subjective point of view that if one was to have had a dream about a plane crash the night before (or morning of) September 11th 2001 this would have been a premonitory dream. Or one might dream of a relative or celebrity dying and then wake to find this actually happens in real life. The probability of the occurrence of a dream being loosely (or even exactly) about an unforeseen, future event is increased when one has a whole lifetime of dreams – a lifetime to generate one or two coincidences. The dreams which are not premonitory are under-reported and the apparently prophetic dreams are over-reported. The probability of having a dream with content vaguely similar to the future is increased by the fact that a single individual has many dreams over a lifetime. Big events are witnessed and acknowledged by large numbers of people which increases the probability that someone will have a dream with similar content (Dawkins, 1998: p.158). No doubt when the twin towers were attacked some people just so happened to have dreams about plane crashes, and a few might have even had dreams more or less related to planes crashing into towers, or even the Twin Towers. Billions of dreams would have been generated the night prior, as they are every night around the world, and so some would have invariably “hit the mark.” Dennett’s anecdotes are somewhat different, but they too may have the same problem of being over-reported in this way. At the same time, they may also suffer from being under-reported because they are not always obviously related to the stimulus of awakening, particularly where someone pays attention to the content of the dream and forgets how they awakened. Hence, the extent to which we experience anecdote-like dreams is currently uncertain, though they can be explained on the received view.
The function of dreaming – exactly why we dream and what purpose it could fulfil in helping us to survive and reproduce – is explained in evolutionary terms of natural selection. Natural selection is best understood as operating through three principles: Variation, Heredity and Selection. A group of living creatures within a species vary from one another in their traits, their traits are passed on to their own offspring, and there is competition for survival and reproduction amongst all of these creatures. The result is that those creatures that have traits better suited for surviving and reproducing will be precisely the creatures to survive, reproduce and pass on the successful traits. Most traits of any organism are implicated in helping it to survive and thereby typically serve some purpose. Although the question of what dreaming might do for us has to this day remained a mystery, there has never been a shortage of proposed theories. The most sustained first attempt to account for why we dream comes from Freud (1900), whose theory was countered by his friend and later adversary Carl Jung. An outline of these two early approaches will be followed by a leading theory in philosophical and neuro-biological literature: that dreaming is an evolutionary by-product. On this view, dreaming has no function but comes as a side effect of other useful traits, namely, cognition and sleep. A contemporary theory opposing the view that dreaming has no function, in comparison, holds that dreaming is a highly advantageous state where the content of the dream aids an organism in later waking behaviour that is survival-enhancing by rehearsing the perception and avoidance of threat.
The psychoanalytic approach, initiated by Freud, gives high esteem to dreams as a key source of insight into, and the main method of opening up, the unconscious (Freud, 1900: §VII, E, p.381). Psychoanalysis is a type of therapy aimed at helping people overcome mental problems. Therapy often involves in depth analyses of patient’s dreams. In order to analyse dreams though, Freudian psychoanalysis is committed to an assumption that dreams are fulfilling a certain function. Freud explicitly put forward a theory of the function of dreams. He believed that dreams have not been culturally generated by humans, as Malcolm thought, but are rather a mental activity that our ancestors also experienced. During sleep, the mind is disconnected from the external world but remains instinctual. The psychoanalytic take on dreaming is better understood in terms of Freud’s overall picture of the mind, which he split into id, ego and super-ego. The id is an entirely unconscious part of the mind, something we cannot gain control of, but is rather only systematically suppressed. It is present at birth, does not understand the differences between opposites and seeks to satisfy its continually generated libidinal instinctual impulses (Storr, 1989: p.61). The id precedes any sense of self, is chaotic, aggressive, unorganised, produces no collective will and is incapable of making value judgements As the child develops and grows up his instinctual needs as a baby are repressed and covered up (Storr, 1989: p.63). If humans were guided only by the id they would behave like babies, trying to fulfil their every need instantly, without being able to wait; the id has no conception of time. It is the id that will get an individual into social trouble. The super-ego is the opposing, counterbalance to the id, containing all of our social norms such as morality. Though we grow up and develop egos and super-egos, the id constantly generates new desires that pressurize us in our overall psychologies and social relations. The work of repression is constant for as long as we are alive. The super-ego is mostly unconscious. In the case of dreams, the work of censorship is carried out by the super-ego. The ego was initially conceived by Freud as our sense of self. He later thought of it more as planning, delayed gratification and other types of thinking that have developed late in evolution. The ego is mostly conscious and has to balance the struggle between the id and the super-ego and also in navigating the external and internal worlds. This means that we experience the continual power struggle between the super-ego and the id. The ego has to meet a quota of fulfilling some of the id’s desires, but only where this will marginally affect the individual.
Freud’s first topographical division of the mind consisted of the conscious, pre-conscious and unconscious (the pre-conscious is that which is not quite conscious but could quite easily be brought into conscious awareness). His second division of the mind into id, ego and super-ego explains how consciousness can become complicated when the two topographies are superimposed upon one another. Mental content from the unconscious constantly struggles to become conscious. Dreams are an example of unconscious content coming up to the conscious and being partially confronted in awareness, although the content is distorted. Dreaming is an opportunity for the desires of the id to be satisfied without causing the individual too much trouble. We cannot experience the desires of the id in naked form, for they would be too disturbing. The super-ego finds various ways of censoring a dream and fulfilling the desires latently. Our conscious attention is effectively misdirected. What we recall of dreams is further distorted as repression and censorship continues into attempted recollections of the dream. The resulting dream is always a compromise between disguise and the direct expression of the id’s desires. The censorship is carried out in various ways (Hopkins, 1991: pp. 112-113). Images which are associated with each other are condensed (two people might become one, characters may morph based on fleeting similarities) and emotions are displaced onto other objects. Dreams are woven together in a story-like element to further absorb the dreamer in the manifest content.
It is better that these wishes come disguised in apparently nonsensical stories in order to stop the dreamer from awakening in horror (Flanagan: 2000, p.43). The content of the dream, even with some censorship in place, still might shock an individual on waking reflection and is therefore further distorted by the time it reaches memory, for the censor is still at work. Malcolm positively cited a psychoanalyst who had claimed that the psychoanalyst is really interested in what the patient thought the dream was about (that is, the memory of the dream) rather than the actual experience (Malcolm, 1959: pp. 121-123, Appendix).
Though Freud was not an evolutionary biologist, his theory of dreams can be easily recast in evolutionary terms of natural selection. Freud thought that we dream in the way we do because it aids individuals in surviving and so is passed on and therefore positively selected. Individuals who dreamt in a significantly different way would not have survived and reproduced, and their way of dreaming would have died with them. But how does dreaming help individuals to survive? Freud postulates that dreaming simultaneously serves two functions. The primary function at the psychological level is wish fulfilment (Storr, 1989: p.44). During the day humans have far too many desires than they could possibly satisfy. These are the desires continually generated by the id. Desire often provides the impetus for action. If acted upon, some of these desires might get the individual killed or in social trouble, such as isolation or ostracism which may potentially result in not reproducing. Since wish fulfilment occurring during sleep is a mechanism that could keep their desires in check, the mechanism would be selected for. Freud claims that, having fulfilled the multifarious desires of the id in sleep, they can remain suppressed during the following days. The individual no longer needs to carry the action out in waking life, thereby potentially stopping the individual from being killed or having fitness levels severely reduced. This provides reason as to why we would need to sleep with conscious imagery. Freud only applied his theory to humans but it could be extrapolated to other animals that also have desires – for example, mammals and other vertebrates, though the desires of most members of the animal kingdom will surely be less complex than that of human desire.
The primary function at the physiological level is to keep an individual asleep while satisfying unconscious desires (Freud, 1900: §V, C, p.234). Also, it is clear that keeping an individual asleep and stopping him or her from actually carrying out the desires during sleep is beneficial to survival. So though the individual has their desires satisfied during sleep, it is done so in a disguised manner. Here, Freud separates the dream into manifest and latent content. The manifest content is the actual content that is experienced and recalled at the surface level (a dream of travelling on a train as it goes through a tunnel). The latent content is the underlying desire that is being fulfilled by the manifest content (a desire for sexual intercourse with somebody that will land the dreaming individual in trouble). The individual is kept asleep by the unconscious disguising the wishes.
What about dreams where the manifest content seems to be emotionally painful, distressing, or a good example of an anxiety dream, rather than wish fulfilment? How can our desires be satisfied when our experiences do not seem to involve what we wanted? Freud suggests that these can be examples where the dream fails to properly disguise the content. Indeed, these usually wake the individual up. Freud was aware of an early study which suggested that dream content is biased towards the negative (Freud, 1900: pp. 193-194) – a study which has been subsequently confirmed. Freud’s distinction between manifest and latent content explains away this objection. The underlying, latent content carries the wish and dreams are distorted by a psychological censor because they will wake an individual up if they are too disturbing, and then the desire will remain unsuppressed. Perhaps dreams operate with an emotion which is the opposite of gratification precisely to distract the sleeping individual from the true nature of the desire. Wish fulfilment might be carried out in the form of an anxiety dream where the desire is especially disturbing if realized. Other anxiety dreams can actually fulfil wishes through displacement of the emotions. Freud uses an example of one of his own dreams where a patient is infected but it fulfils the wish of alleviating the guilt he felt that he could not cure her (the dream of Irma’s injection). The dream allowed the blame to be lifted away from himself and projected onto a fellow doctor who was responsible for the injection. Despite the displeasure of the dream, the wish for the alleviation guilt was fulfilled.
The dream for Freudians relies on a distinction between indicative and imperative content. An indicative state of mind is where my representational systems show the world to be a certain way. The exemplar instance of indicative representations is belief. I might accurately perceive and believe that it is raining and I thus have an indicative representational mental state. Imperative states of mind, on the other hand, are ones in which I desire the world to be a certain way – a way that is different to the way it currently is. I might desire that it will snow. A dream is an instance of an indicative representation replacing an imperative one in order to suppress a desire. We see something in a dream and believe it is there in front of us. This is what we want and what we desired, so once we believe we have it, the desire is vanquished, making it unlikely we will try to satisfy the desire in waking life.
Trying to provide even a simple exposition of Freud’s or Jung’s theories of dreams will not please all scholars and practitioners that adhere to the thinkers’ traditions. Drawing out the differences or similarities between their views is an exegetical task and the resulting statements about their theories are thus always debatable. Many working in the tradition of psychoanalysis or analytical psychology opt for a synthesis between their views. At the risk of caricaturing Jung’s theory of dreams, the differences in their views will be emphasized to contrast with Freud’s.
Like Freud, Jung also believed that dream analysis is a major way of gaining knowledge about the unconscious – a deep facet of the mind that has been present in our ancestors throughout evolutionary history. But Jung’s evolutionary story of dreaming differs from Freud’s. Whereas Freud understood dreams as using memory from the days preceding the dream (particularly the “day residue” of the day immediately leading up to the dream) and earlier childhood experiences, Jung thought the dream also worked with more distant material: the collective unconscious. The collective unconscious is where the ancestral memories of the species are stored and are common to all people. Some philosophers, such as Locke, had believed the mind is a blank slate. Jung believed that the collective unconscious underlies the psychology of all humans and is even identical across some different species. The collective unconscious is especially pronounced in dreaming where universal symbols are processed, known as the archetypes. The distinction between signs and symbols is an important one (Jung, 1968: p.3). Signs refer to what is already known, whereas symbols contain a multiplicity of meanings (Mathers, 2001: p.116). More, indeed, than can be captured, thereby always leaving an unknowable aspect, and hence always requiring further work to think about the dream, thereby hinting at future perspectives one may take toward oneself and one’s dreams (Mathers, 2001: p.116).
Jung saw dreaming as playing an integral role in the overall architecture of the mind and conducive to surviving in the world for during the process of dreaming the day’s experiences are connected to previous experiences and our whole personal history. Whereas Freud thought that the adaptive advantage to dreams was to distract us and thereby keep us asleep, Jung thought the reverse: we need to sleep in order to dream and dreaming serves multiple functions. What does dreaming do for us, according to Jung? Dreams compensate for imbalances in the conscious attitudes of the dreamer. Psychology depends upon the interplay of opposites (Jung, 1968: p.47). By dreaming of opposite possibilities to waking life, such as a logical individual (with a strong thinking function) having dreams which are much more feeling–based, the balance is restored (Stevens, 1994: p.106). “Dreams perform some homeostatic or self-regulatory function … they obey the biological imperative of adaptation in the interests of personal adjustment, growth, and survival” (Stevens, 1994: p.104). They play a role in keeping the individual appropriately adapted to their social setting. Dreaming also carries out a more general type of compensation, concerning the psychology of gender. The psyche is essentially androgynous and so dreams provide an opportunity to balance the overall self to an individual’s opposite gender that make up their personality and mind. Hence dreams are not the mere “guardians of sleep” as Freud thought, but are rather a necessary part to maintaining psychological well being and development. When the conscious is not put in touch with the unconscious, homeostasis is lost and psychological disturbance will result (Jung, 1968: p.37). Dreams serve up unconscious content that has been repressed, ignored or undervalued in waking life. Although he emphasized an objective element to dreaming (that the unconscious often makes use of universal and culturally shared symbols), Jung was opposed to the possibility of a fixed dream dictionary because the meaning of symbols will change depending on the dreamer and over time as they associate images with different meanings.
Jung agrees with Freud that there are a wealth of symbols and allegorical imagery that can stand in for the sexual act, from breaking down a door to placing a sword in a sheath. In the course of his analysis, Freud would gradually move from manifest content to the latent content, though he did encourage the dreamer to give their own interpretations through free association. Jung believed that the unconscious choice of symbol itself is just as important and can tell us something about that individual (Jung, 1968: p.14). Alternatively, apparent phallic symbols might symbolize other notions – a key in a lock might symbolize hope or security, rather than anything sexual. The dream imagery, what Freud called the manifest content, is what will reveal the meaning of the dream. Where Freud had asked “What is the dream trying to hide?” Jung asks: “What is the dream trying to express or communicate?” because dreams occur without a censor: they are “undistorted and purposeful” (Whitmont & Perera, 1989: p.1).
Another function of dreaming that distinguishes Jung’s from Freud’s account is that dreams provide images of the possibilities the future may have in store for the sleeping individual. Not that dreams are precognitive in a paranormal sense, Jung emphasized, but the unconscious clearly does entertain counter-factual situations during sleep. Those possibilities entertained are usually general aspects of human character that are common to us all (Johnson, 2009: p.46). Dreams sometimes warn us of dangerous upcoming events, but all the same, they do not always do so (Jung, 1968: p.36). The connection of present events to past experience is where dreams are especially functional (Mathers, 2001: p.126). Freud and Jung’s theories clearly overlap here. But whereas Freud assessed dreams in terms of looking back into the past, especially the antagonisms of childhood experience, dreaming for Jung importantly also lays out the possibilities of the future. This clearly has survival value, since it is in the future where that individual will eventually develop and try to survive and reproduce. Dreaming for Jung is like “dreaming” in the other sense – that of aspiring, wishing and hoping. Dreams point towards our future development and individuation. The notion of personal development brought about by dreaming might depend upon regularly recalling a dream, which is something that Freud’s claim of wish fulfilment need not be committed to, and it is not clear how this deals with animal’s dreaming.
Dreams are a special instance of the collective unconscious at work, where we can trace much more ancient symbolism. The collective unconscious gives rise to the archetypes: “the universal patterns or tendencies in the human unconscious that find their way into our individual psyches and form us. They are actually the psychological building blocks of energy that combine together to create the individual psyche” (Johnson, 2009: p.46). Dreams demonstrate how the unconscious processes thought in “the language of symbolism” (Johnson, 2009: p.4). The most important function of dreams is teaching us how to think symbolically and deal with communication from the unconscious. Dreams always have a multiplicity of meanings, can be re-interpreted and new meanings discovered. Jung believed that “meaning making enhances survival” (Mathers, 2001: p.117). According to Flanagan, it is much harder to construe Jung’s theory of dreams as adhering to the basic tenets of evolutionary biology than Freud’s, for two fundamental reasons. Firstly, why would the collective unconscious expressing symbols relevant to the species have any gains in terms of reproductive success? Secondly, Jung’s theory is more often interpreted in Lamarckian, and not Darwinian, terms, which leaves it out in the cold in regards to accepted evolutionary biology (Flanagan, 2000: p.44). According to Lamarck’s conception of evolution, traits developed during a lifetime can then be subsequently passed onto the next generation. Hence Lamarck believed that the giraffe got its long neck because one stretched its neck during its lifetime to reach high up leaves and this made the neck longer, a trait which was passed onto its offspring. According to the widely favoured Darwinian view of evolution, those giraffes that just so happened to have a longer neck would have had access to the source of food over those with shorter necks, and would have been selected. Jung’s theory is interpreted as Lamarckian rather than Darwinian because symbols that are learned during an individual’s particular historical period can be genetically encoded and passed on (Flanagan, 2000: p.64). Perhaps one could reply in Jungian-Darwinian terms that those individuals who just so happened to be born with a brain receptive to certain symbols having certain meanings (rather than learning them), survived over those individuals that did not. But then Flanagan’s first reason remains as an objection – what advantage would this have in terms of surviving? Others have argued that the collective unconscious is actually much more scientifically credible than critics have taken it to be. According to the line of argument, the collective unconscious essentially coincides with current views about innate behaviours, in fields such as socio-biology and ethology (Stevens, 1994: p.51). Appropriate environmental (or cognitive) stimuli trigger patterns of behaviours or thought that are inherited, such as hunting, fighting and mothering. In humans, there are, for example, the universal expressions of emotion (anger, disgust, fear, happiness, sadness, surprise). Humans and other mammals have an inbuilt fear of snakes that we do not need to learn. These patterns can be found in dreams. The dream images are generated by homologous neural structures that are shared amongst animals, not merely passed on to the next generation as images. The Jungian can dodge the accusation of Lamarckism by arguing that dreams involve inherited patterns of behaviour based on epigenetic rules (the genetically inherited rules upon which development then proceeds for an individual) and arguing that epigenetics does not necessarily need to endorse Lamarckism (epigenetics is a hot topic in the philosophy of biology. For a cogent introduction, readers can consult Jablonka & Lamb, 2005). Alternatively, in light of epigenetics, the Jungian can defend a Lamarackist view of evolution – a re-emerging but still controversial position.
To rehearse the differences: Freud believed that dreams are the result of a power struggle between the id’s constantly generating desires and the super-ego’s censorship of the exact nature of these desires; various techniques are employed by the censor, including emotional displacement, weaving together a narrative to pay attention to and reworking the latent desires into the manifest content we experience and eventually and occasionally recollect; dreams are a distraction to keep us asleep; dreaming is a mechanism that has been selected to provide social stability amongst individuals. Dreams essentially deal with one’s relationship to their past. Jung thought dreams point towards the future development of the individual. The experiences which process symbols shared amongst the species are a form of compensation to keep the individual at a psychological homeostasis. Dreams do not especially deal with sexuality but have a more general attempt for the individual to understand themselves and the world they exist in.
Flanagan represents a nuanced position in which dreaming has no fitness-enhancing effects on an organism that dreams, but neither does it detract from their fitness. Dreams are the by-products of sleep. The notion of evolutionary by-product, or spandrel (see figures 6 and 7), was first introduced by the evolutionary Pluralists Gould and Lewontin in “The Spandrels of San Marco and Panglossian Paradigm” where the authors borrowed the term from the field of architecture. Evolutionary Pluralism claims that traits in the natural world are not always the result of natural selection, but potentially for a plurality of other reasons. The debate between Adaptationists and Pluralists centres on the pervasiveness of natural selection in shaping traits. Pluralists look for factors other than natural selection in shaping a trait, such as genetic drift and structural constraints on development. One important example is the spandrel. Some traits might be necessary by-products of the design of the overall organism.
The two separate architectural examples, figures 6 and 7, display spandrels as roughly triangular spaces. The point that Gould and Lewontin are making by introducing the notion of spandrel is that some aspects of the design of an object inevitably come as a side-effect. Perhaps the architect only wanted archways and a dome. In producing such a work of architecture, spandrels cannot be avoided. If architecture can tell us something about metaphysical truths, then might dreams be such spandrels, lodged in between thought and sleep? Flanagan, an evolutionary Pluralist, argues that there is no fitness-enhancing function of dreaming. Though, as a matter of structure, we cannot avoid dreaming for dreams sit in between the functioning of the mind and sleep, like spandrels between two architecturally desired pillars in an archway. Hence Flanagan’s argument is that in evolutionary biological terms, dreaming is not for anything – it just comes as a side effect to the general architecture of the mind. He states more strongly that “so long as a spandrel does not come to detract from fitness, it can sit there forever as a side effect or free rider without acquiring any use whatsoever” (Flanagan, 2000: p.108). Dreaming neither serves the function of wish-fulfilment or psychological homeostasis. Flanagan emphasizes the disorganized nature of dreaming, something which can clearly be appealed to given any individual’s experience of dreams. To be sure, wish-fulfilment and apparent psychological compensation sometimes appear in dreams, but this is because we are just thinking during sleep and so a myriad of human cognition will take place. Another reason put forward by Flanagan for the view that dreams are spandrels is that, unlike for sleep, there is nothing close to an ideal adaptation explanation for dreaming (Flanagan, 2000: p.113). The ideal explanation lays out what evidence there is that selection has operated on the trait, gives proof that the trait is heritable, provides an explanation of why some types of the trait are better adapted than others in different environments and amongst other species and also offers evidence of how later versions of the trait are derived from earlier ones. The spandrel thesis about dreaming is more plausible, then, because trying to argue that dreams have function ends up as nothing more than a “just-so” story, the result of speculation and guess work that cannot meet the standards of an ideal adaptation explanation.
Antti Revonsuo stands in opposition to Flanagan by arguing that dreaming is an adaptation. He also stands in opposition to Freud and Jung in that the function of dreams is not to deliver wish fulfilment whilst keeping the individual asleep or to connect an individual to the symbolism of the collective unconscious. Revonsuo strives to deliver an account that meets the stringent criteria of a scientific explanation of the adaptation of dreaming. Though there have been many attempts to explain dreaming as an Adaptation, few come close to the ideal adaptation explanation, and those functional theories favoured by neurocognitive scientists (for example, dreams are for consolidating memories or for forgetting useless information) cannot clearly distinguish their theory of the function of dreams from the function of sleep, that is, the spandrel thesis. The Threat Simulation Theory account can be clearly distinguished from the spandrel thesis. According to Revonsuo, the actual content of dreams is helpful to the survival of an organism because dreaming enhances behaviours in waking life such as perceiving and avoiding threat. Revonsuo’s Threat Simulation Theory presents dreams as specializing in the recreation of life-like threatening scenarios. His six claims are as follows: Claim 1: Dream experience is more an organized state of mind than disorganized; Claim 2: Dreaming is tailored to and biased toward simulating threatening events of all kinds found in waking life; Claim 3: Genuine threats experienced in waking life have a profound effect on subsequent dreaming; Claim 4: Dreams provide realistic simulacra of waking life threatening scenarios and waking consciousness generally; Claim 5: Simulation of perceptual and motor activities leads to enhanced performance even when the rehearsal is not recalled later; Claim 6: Dreaming has been selected for (Revonsuo, 2000).
The Threat Simulation Theory is committed to a certain conception of dreams as a realistic and organized state of consciousness, as implied by Claim 1. This claim motivates the challenge to any spandrel thesis of dreams by asking why dreams would show the level of organization that they do, namely, the construction and engagement of virtual realities, if they were just mere “mental noise” as a spandrel thesis might imply or be committed to. Dreaming is allegedly similar to waking life and is indeed experienced as waking life at least at the time of the dream (Valli & Revonsuo, 2009: p.18). These features of dreams are essential in putting in motion the same sort of reaction to threat that will occur during waking life and aid survival. Hence the dream self should be able to react in the dream situation with reasonable courses of action to combat the perceived threat in ways that would also be appropriate in real life. Revonsuo appeals to phenomenological data where a significant proportion of dreams involve situations in which the dreamer comes under attack. We do indeed generally have more negative emotions during an REM related dream. This claim is well supported by experiential examples of dreaming, where anxiety is the most frequent emotion in dreaming, joy/ elation was second and anger third (Hobson, 1994: p.157), making two thirds of dream emotion negative. That dreams process negative emotions likely occurs because the amygdala is highly activated. The amygdala is also the key brain part implicated in the “fight or flight” sympathetic nervous system response to especially intense life-threatening situations. During waking hours this part of the brain is used in handling unpleasant emotions like anxiety, intense fear or anger. This is well explained by the Threat Simulation Theory. We experience more threats in dreams (and especially demanding ones) than in waking life because it is selected to be especially difficult, leaving the individual bestowed with a surplus of successful threat avoidance strategies, coping skills and abilities to anticipate, detect and out-manoeuvre the subtleties of certain threats.
Though Revonsuo claims that dreams specialize in the full panoply of threatening scenarios that will effect overall survival, the most obvious example is the “fight or flight” response. All instances of stress in waking life occur when an individual feels threatened and this will feed back into the system of acknowledging what is dangerous and what is not. In waking life, the fight or flight response essentially involves making a snap decision in a life or death situation to fight a predatory enemy or flee from the scene. The activation of the Sympathetic Nervous System – the stress response implicated in the fight or flight response – is an involuntary, unconsciously initiated process. One might object to Claims 1 and 4, that many dreams simply do not seem realistic representations of threatening scenarios such as those requiring the fight or flight response. One study found, for example, that many recurrent dreams are unrealistic (Zadra et al, 2006). Revonsuo has some scope for manoeuvre for he believes that dreams may no longer be adaptive due to the dramatic environmental changes, and the possible adaptation for human dream consciousness was when humans were hunter-gatherers in the Pleistocene environment over a period of hundreds of thousands of years; so dream content may now no longer seem to have the same function, given that we live in a radically different environment. Dreams are then comparable to the human appendix – useful and adaptive in times when our diet was radically different, but now an essentially redundant and, occasionally, maladaptive vestigial trait.
Dreams may have also become more lax in representing threatening content in the Western world, since life and death threatening situations are no longer anywhere near as common as in the evolutionary past. This will be the case because a lack of exposure to threat in waking life will not activate the threat simulation system of dreaming as it did in earlier times. Revonsuo uses evidence of ordinary dream reports from the population but he also cites cases of psychopathology such as the dreams of individuals with post-traumatic stress disorder (PTSD), where, crucially, their traumatic and threatening experiences dramatically affects what they dream about. Thus the relationship between dreaming and experiencing threats in waking life is bi-directional: Dreams try to anticipate the possible threats of waking life and improve the speed of perceiving and ways of reacting to them. At the same time, any perceived threats that are actually experienced in waking life will alter the course of later dreaming to re-simulate those threats perceived. This feedback element dovetails with Claim 4 for an accurate picture will be built as information is constructed from the real world.
Perhaps the updating element of the Threat Simulation Theory (Claim 4 – that individuals learn from what is threatening and this gets passed onto offspring) suffers from the same accusation of Lamarckism that faces Jung’s theory. Revonsuo believes that dreaming during sleep allows an individual to repetitively rehearse the neurocognitive mechanisms that are indispensable to waking life threat perception and avoidance. Flanagan asks why behaviour that is instinctual would need to be repetitively rehearsed, but what is provided by Revonsuo is an explanation of how instinct is actually preserved in animals. But not all of our dreams are threatening. This fact surely helps the Threat Simulation Theory to show that there is variation amongst the trait and that the threatening type comes to dominate. The neural mechanisms, or hardware, underlying the ability to dream are transferred genetically and became common in the population. Those individuals with an insufficient number of threatening dreams were not able to survive to pass on the trait because they were left ill prepared for the trials and tribulations of the real world’s evolutionary environment. One might still object that survival – the avoidance of threat – is only one half of propagating a trait. Individuals also have to reproduce for the trait to be passed on. So dreams ought to also specialize in enhancing behaviours that help individuals to find mates. Animals and humans have many and varied courting rituals, requiring complicated behaviours If dreaming can, and does, make any difference to behaviour in waking life as Revonsuo must claim, then why would the presence of mate selection behaviours not make up a big factor in dreams? In humans, no more than 6% of adult dreams contain direct sexual themes (Flanagan, 2000: p.149). There is also a slight gender difference in that males tend to dream more of male characters than female characters. Given that many threats would have occurred from same sex individuals within one’s own species, this fares well for the claim that dreams are for threat perception and rehearsal, but not for courtship rituals that could help pass on the trait. There are ways around this objection, however. Threatening and sexual encounters are such polar opposites that different parts of the nervous system deal with them – the sympathetic and parasympathetic – dramatically alternating between the two could potentially disrupt sleep. Clearly, simply surviving is prioritized over reproducing.
Visual awareness has been used as the model system in consciousness research. It is easy to manipulate and investigate. Humans are predominantly visual creatures and so visual awareness is an excellent paradigm of conscious experience, at least for humans. A good example of the virtues of using paradigm cases to study, from biological science, is drosophila melanogaster (the common fruit fly). This organism is often used in experiments and routinely cited in papers detailing experiments or suggesting further research. A scientific model is a practical necessity and the fruit fly has such a fast reproduction rate that it allows geneticists to see the effects of genes over many generations that they would not see in their own lifetime in, say, humans. The fruit fly also has enough genetic similarity to humans such that the findings can be extrapolated. Hence, a model system has something special about it – some ideal set of features for empirically investigating. Model systems are good because they ideally also display the phenomena being investigated in an “exceptionally prominent form” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.73-74).
Revonsuo (2006) argues that dreaming should also have a place alongside visual awareness, as a special instance of consciousness and therefore a worthy model to be studied. Revonsuo argues that the dreaming brain also captures consciousness in a “theoretically interesting form” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.73). The claim is that dreaming is an unusually rare example of “pure” consciousness, being as it is devoid of ongoing perceptual input and therefore might deserve special status in being scientifically investigated. The system is entirely dependent on internal resources (Metzinger, 2003: p.255) and is isolated from the external world. Representational content changes much quicker than in the waking state, and this is why Metzinger claims that dreams are more dynamic (Metzinger, 2003: p.255). Whereas Malcolm and Dennett had argued that dreams are not even plausibly conscious states, Revonsuo and Metzinger argue that dreams may reveal the very essence of consciousness because of the conditions under which dream consciousness takes place. Crucially, there is a blockade of sensory input. Only very rarely will sensory input contribute to information processing during dreaming, (Metzinger, 2003: p.257) for example in dreams where the sound of the alarm clock is interwoven into a narrative involving wedding bells. This means that most other dreams are “epistemically empty” with regard to the external environment. At no other time is consciousness completely out of synch with the environment, and, so to speak, left to its own devices. Dreaming is especially interesting and fundamentally similar to waking consciousness because it entails consciousness of a world which we take to be the real one, just as we do during waking consciousness. “Only rarely do we realize during the dream that it is only a dream. The estimated frequency of lucid dreams varies in different studies. Approximately 1 to 10% of dream reports include the lucidity and about 60% of the population have experienced a lucid dream at least once in their lifetime (Farthing, 1992; Snyder & Gackenbach, 1988). Thus, as many as 90 to 99% of dreams are completely non-lucid, so that the dream world is taken for real by the dreamer” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.83).
Revonsuo does not so much argue for the displacement of visual awareness qua a model system, as arguing that dreaming is another exemplary token of consciousness. Dreaming, unlike visual awareness, is both untainted by the external world and behavioural activity (Revonsuo, 2006: p.75). Dreams also reveal the especially subjective nature of consciousness: the creation of a “world-for-me”.
Another reason that might motivate modelling dreaming is that it might turn out to be a good instance for looking at the problem of localization in consciousness research. For example, during dreaming the phenomenology is demonstrably not ontologically dependent on any process missing during dreaming. Any parts of the brain not used in dreaming can be ruled out as not being necessary to phenomenal consciousness (Revonsuo, 2006: p.87).
During dreams there is an output blockade (Revonsuo, 2006: p.87; Metzinger, 2003: p.257), making dreaming an especially pure and isolated system. Malcolm had argued that dreaming was worthy of no further empirical work for the notion was simply incoherent, and Dennett was sceptical that dreams would turn out to even involve consciousness. The radical proposal now is that dreaming ought to be championed as an example of conscious experience, a mascot for scientific investigation in consciousness studies. It is alleged that dreams can recapitulate any experience from waking life and for this reason Revonsuo concludes that the same physical or neural realization of consciousness is instantiated in both examples of dreaming and waking experience (Revonsuo, 2006: p.86).
The argument of Windt & Noreika (2011) firstly lays out the alleged myriad of problems with taking dreaming as a scientific model in consciousness research and then proposes positive suggestions for the role dreaming can play in consciousness studies. They reject dreaming as a model system but suggest it will work better as a contrast system to wakefulness. The first major problem with using dreaming as a model of consciousness is that, whilst, for example, in biology everybody knows what the fruit fly is, there are a number of different conceptions and debates surrounding key features and claims about dreaming. Hence there is no accepted definition of dreaming (Windt, 2010: p.296). Taking dreaming as a model system of course requires and depends upon exactly what dreaming is characterized as. Revonsuo simply assumes his conception of dreaming is correct. He believes that dreaming can be a model of waking consciousness because dreams can be identical replicas of waking consciousness involving all possible experiences. Windt & Noreika believe that dreams tend to be different to waking life in important ways.
There are further problems with modelling dreams. Collecting dream reports in the laboratory might amount to about five reported dreams a night. This is not practical at all compared to visual awareness where hundreds of reportable experiences can occur in minutes without interference (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1099). Scientists do not even directly work with dreams themselves, but rather descriptions of dreams. There is also the added possibility of narrative fabrication (the difference between dream experience and dream report). During the dream itself, it is known that we do not have clarity of awareness as in waking life and we do have a poor memory during the dream experience. Though lucid dreaming is an exception to this rule, it differs from ordinary dreaming and lucid dreaming has not been proposed as a model. The laboratory is needed to control and measure the phenomenon properly but this in itself can influence the dream content and report and so the observer effect and interviewer biases are introduced.
It is not clear that these are insurmountable methodological problems. It might be very difficult to investigate dreams but this comes with the territory of trying to investigate isolated consciousness. Revonsuo is also not suggesting removing visual awareness as the paradigm model, only that dreaming ought to be alongside it. The fact remains, however, that despite suggestions from Revonsuo and others, dreaming being used as a model has simply not yet taken place (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1091), regardless of the theoretical incentives.
The problems with the modelling approach point us toward the more modest contrast analysis approach. Windt & Noreika argue that the contrast analysis of dreaming with other wake states should at least be the first step in scientific investigation, even if we wanted to establish what ought to be a model in consciousness research (Windt, 2011: p.1102). What are the reasons for endorsing the positive proposal of using dreams in a contrast analysis with waking life? Though waking consciousness is the default mode through which individuals experience the world, dreaming is the second global state of consciousness. As displayed in reports, dreams involve features which are markedly different to that of waking life – bizarreness and confabulation being key hallmarks of dreaming but not waking consciousness. The two states of waking and dreaming are mediated by radically different neurochemical systems. During wakefulness, the aminergic system is predominantly in control and for dreaming the cholinergic system takes over (Hobson, 1994: pp. 14-15; Hobson, 2005: p.143). This fundamental difference offers an opportunity to examine the neurology and neurochemistry that underpins both states of consciousness. The contrast analysis does not ignore dreaming, but proposes a more modest approach. With research divided between waking consciousness, dreaming and a comparison of the two states, this more practical approach will yield better results, so Windt and Noreika argue. By using the proposed method, we can see how consciousness works both with and without environmental input. Surely both are as equally important as each other, rather than trying to find reason to privilege one over the other. After all, both are genuine examples of consciousness. This approach also means that the outcome will be mutually informative as regards the two types of consciousness with insights gained in both directions. It is important to compare dreaming as an important example of consciousness operating with radically changed neural processing to waking consciousness (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1101). With the contrastive analysis there is the prospect of comparing dream consciousness to both pathological and non-pathology waking states, and there is thereby the promise of better understanding how waking consciousness works and how it can also malfunction. We spend about a tenth of our conscious lives dreaming, and yet it is one of the most difficult mental states to scientifically investigate. The contrast analysis is put forward as a possible solution to the problem of how to integrate dreams into consciousness studies. Windt and Noreika add the further proposal that dreams can be more specifically contrasted with pathological, non-pathological and altered states of consciousness. Unlike the modelling option, the contrast analysis seems to be how dreams have been hitherto investigated and so has already proven to be a viable option. This should not definitively preclude the modelling option, however. Perhaps modelling dreams really would be ideal simply because it involves isolated consciousness and the practicality concerns may be overcome in the future.
It remains the case that “one of the central desiderata in the field of empirical dream research is a commonly accepted definition of dreaming” (Windt, 2010: p.296). There are also examples of consciousness at the periphery of sleep that makes it difficult to delineate the boundaries of what does and does not count as a dream (Mavromatis, 1987: p.3; ‘hypnagogic’ experiences are the thoughts, images or quasi-hallucinations that occur prior to and during sleep onset whilst ‘hypnopompic’ experiences are thoughts, images or quasi-hallucinations that occur during or just after waking; these states are now known collectively as hypnagogia). This is a problem that both the modelling and the contrast analysis approach both must confront.
Some believe that dreaming involves mental imagery of both hallucinatory and imagistic nature (Symons: 1993: p.185; Seligman & Yellen, 1987). However, other philosophers such as Colin McGinn believe that dreams should only be thought of in terms of images (the imagination) or percepts (perceptual experience). It is better to not inflate our ontology and invoke a third category that dreams are sui generis (of their own kind) if we do not need to. There are reasons why we should not believe dreams are a unique mental state. It would be strange, McGinn claims, if “the faculties recruited in dreaming were not already exploited during waking life” (McGinn, 2004: p.75). So he believes that dreaming is an instance of a psychological state we are already familiar with from waking life: perception (hallucination) or the imagination. There is a separate epistemic question of whether dreams involve beliefs or imaginings (Ichikawa, 2009). This debate comes apart from the psychological one as to whether the phenomenology of dreaming is percept or imagining because all four possible combinations can be held: A theorist might claim that dreams are hallucination which involve belief; another theorist might claim that dreams involve hallucinations which we do not generate belief, but we are rather always entertaining our dream hallucinations as imagined possibilities. Alternatively, dreams might involve the psychological state of the imagination and yet we happen to believe in our imaginings as though they were real; finally, dreams might involve imaginings which we recognize as such, imaginings and not beliefs. Though the two debates come apart, in waking life the psychological state of imagining is usually accompanied by the propositional attitude of imagining that something is the case, rather than believing that the something (psychologically imagined) is the case. Perception, or hallucination, usually triggers belief that what is perceived is the case, rather than merely imagining that what is perceived is the case. So if dreams are psychologically defined in terms of percepts, we can expect that dreams likely also involve belief because percepts usually trigger belief. This is not always the case, however. For example, a schizophrenic might come to realize that his hallucinations do not really express a way the world is and so no longer believe what he perceives. If dreams are propositionally imagined, then we would usually expect our imaginings to be recognized as not being real and therefore triggering the propositional attitude of imagining rather than believing that what we are imaging (in the psychological sense) that something is the case. There are more nuanced views than the four possible combinations. McGinn claims that dreaming involves the imagination and quasi-belief. When we dream we are immersed in the fictional plot, as we are in creative writing or film.
It is worth noting that the psychological literature assumes that dreams are hallucinations that occur during sleep. It is the typically unquestioned psychological orthodoxy that dreams are perceptual/ hallucinatory experiences. Evidence can be cited for dreams as percepts from neuroscience:
The offline world simulation engages the same brain mechanisms as perceptual consciousness and seems real to us because we are unaware that it is nothing but a hallucination (except very rarely in lucid dreams). (Valli & Revonsuo, 2009: p.19)
In REM sleep, when we are lying still due to muscle paralysis, the motor programs of the brain are nonetheless active. Phenomenologically, our dream selves are also highly active during dreams. As the content of a dream reveals, we are always on the move. Apart from the bodily paralysis, physiologically the body acts as though it perceives a real world, and continually reacting to events in that apparently real world. It is known that individuals will carry out their dream actions if the nerve cells that suppress movement are surgically removed or have deteriorated due to age, as demonstrated in people with REM Sleep Behavior Disorder. This suggests that dreaming involves the ordinary notion of belief because it is tied to action in the usual way and it is only because of an additional action-suppressing part of the brain that these actions are not carried out. We know that percepts ordinarily trigger belief and corresponding action, whereas the imagination does not.
The claim that dreams are hallucinations can find support in the further claim that dreaming replicates waking consciousness. Many philosophers and psychologists make note of the realistic and organized nature of dreams, and this has been couched in terms of a virtual reality, involving a realistic representation of the bodily self which we can feel. Consider false awakenings, where an individual believes they have woken up in the very place they went to sleep, yet they are actually still asleep in dreaming. False awakenings can arguably be used in support of the view that dreaming is hallucinatory because such dreams detail a realistic depiction of one’s surroundings. Dreams fit the philosophical concept of hallucination as an experience intrinsically similar to legitimate perceptual states with the difference that the apparent stimulus being perceived is non-existent (Windt, 2010: pp. 298-299). It is the job of perceptual states to display the self in a world.
Empirical evidence suggests that pain can be experienced in dreams, which is perceptual in nature and which the imagination can arguably not replicate. So dreams must be hallucinatory, according to this line of reasoning. It is not clear though whether this rules out dreams as mainly imaginative with occasional perceptual elements introduced. Pain is, after all, a rarity in dreaming.
We can plausibly speculate that human ancestors fell prey to a major metaphysical confusion and thought that their dreams involved genuine experiences in the past, including visitations from the dead and entering a different realm. Though few believe this today, we can sympathize with our ancestors’ mistake which is further supported by the occasional everyday feeling where we can be hesitant to categorize a memory of an experience as a dream or a waking event. We usually decide, not based on introspection, but on logical discrepancies between the memory and other factors. These two reasons suggest that we cannot always easily distinguish between dream experience and waking experience, because they are another instance of percepts.
Finally, we seem to have real emotions during dreams which are the natural reaction to our perceptions. According to the percept view of dreams, we dream that we are carrying actions out in an environment, but our accompanying emotions are not dreamed and play out alongside the rest of the dream content. The intensity of the emotions, actually felt, is what the percept theorist will take as support for the content of the dream not being merely imagined, but the natural response of realistic, perceptual-like experience.
A number of philosophers believe that dreaming is just the imagination at work during sleep (Ichikawa, 2008; Sosa, 2007; McGinn, 2004, 2005). Any conscious experiences during sleep are imagistic rather than perceptual. McGinn puts forward some reasons in favour of believing that dreams are imaginings. Firstly, he introduces The Observational Attitude: if we are perceiving (or hallucinating), say, two individuals having a conversation then we might need to strain our senses to hear or see what they are discussing. During dreams of course, the body is completely relaxed and the sleeping individual shows no interest in his or her surroundings. When imagining in waking life, I try to minimize my sensory awareness of the surrounding environment in order to get a better and more vivid picture of what it is I am imagining. For example, if I want to imagine a new musical tune, I do best to switch the radio off or cover my ears. Dreaming is the natural instance of shutting out all of our sensory awareness of the outside world, arguably to entirely engage the imagination. This suggests that the dreamer is hearing with their mind’s ear and seeing with their mind’s eye. They are entertaining images, not percepts. Secondly, McGinn claims that percepts and images can coexist in the mind in waking life. We can perceive at the same time as imagining. The novel presupposes that the reader can perceive the text at the same time as imagining its content. It ought to be possible, McGinn argues, that if dreams are hallucinatory, we should be able to imagine at the same time. If I am surfing in a dream, I should be able to imagine the Eiffel tower at the same time. In dreams we cannot do this, there is just the dream, McGinn claims, with no further ability to simultaneously imagine other content. Related to the Observational Stance is the notion of Recognition in dreams. In dreams we seem to already know who all of the characters are, without making any effort to find out who they are (without using any of our senses). This might suggest that in dreams we are partly in control of the content (even if we fail to realize it) because we allegedly summon up the characters that we want to. We recognize who dream characters are, such as relatives, even when they look drastically different. It is not clear, on the other hand, that we really are in control of other dream characters and that we accurately recognize them, for example, Gerrans (2012) has claimed that the same mechanism of misidentification is present in dreams as in certain delusional states where the feeling of familiarity of a person is over-active and aimed at the wrong individuals (as in Fregoli delusion). On this view, we do not accurately bring to mind certain dream characters, we try to identify them and make mistakes. This would be an alternative way of accommodating the evidence.
In the 1940’s and 1950’s, a survey found that a majority of Americans thought that their own dreams, and dreams more generally, occurred in black and white. Crucially, people have thought prior to and after this period that dreams occur in colour. This period coincided with the advent of black and white television. According to Schwitzgebel, the most reasonable conclusion to draw is that dreams are more like imagining written fiction, sketchy and without any colour; I can read a novel without summoning any definite imagery to mind (Schwitzgebel, 2002: p.656). Perhaps this is akin to reading a novel quickly and forming vague and indefinite imagery. Ichikawa also argues that dreaming involves only images and is indeterminate to colour because images can be indeterminate to colour, but to hallucinate would require some determinacy in colour, whether black and white or in full colour Crucially, even outside of Schwitzgebel’s findings, people have raised the question whether we dream in colour or black and white – something needs to explain the very possibility of such a dispute; “the imagination model may provide the best explanation for disagreement about colour sensation in dreams” (Ichikawa, 2009: p.109). McGinn also believes that dreams can be indeterminate to colour, and they can be coloured in during the waking report, which can be affected by the current media.
University of Bristol
Last updated: July 27, 2013 | Originally published: