Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868—1963)

duboisW. E. B. Du Bois was an important American thinker: a poet, philosopher, economic historian, sociologist, and social critic. His work resists easy classification. This article focuses exclusively on Du Bois’ contribution to philosophy; but the reader must keep in mind throughout that Du Bois is more than a philosopher; he is, for many, a great social leader. His extensive efforts all bend toward a common goal, the equality of colored people. His philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity. Du Bois’ pragmatist philosophy, as well as his other work, underlies and supports this larger social aim. Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. He envisioned communism as a society that promoted the well being of all its members, not simply a few. Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy for the situation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. General Philosophical Orientation
  3. Double Consciousness
  4. Second Sight
  5. Critique of White Imperialism
  6. Later Marxism
  7. Du Bois’ Significance Today
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Du Bois was born in Great Barrington, Massachusetts, on February 23, 1868. He had a happy early childhood, largely unaware of race prejudice, until one day, as he records in Souls of Black Folk, a student in his class refused to exchange greeting cards with him simply because he was black (Souls, 2). This experience made Du Bois feel for the first time that he was different, in that he was both inside the white world (since he lived within it) and outside of it (since he was perceived in the white world through the lens of race prejudice). Throughout his life after this event, Du Bois was continually made to feel, as he says, that he was both an American and an African, but never an African-American, with his own distinct, coherent identity in the American world. “One ever feels his two-ness,” he explains (Souls, 2).

Du Bois refused to become depressed by his new realization, and in fact made it his life’s work to combat race prejudice and to find a way to achieve coherent personhood for blacks in America. Du Bois, it turns out, was just the right person for the job, since he had it in his character to affirm himself as a matter of course. He was a bold, courageous youth, willing to fight for himself and his peers. All his life Du Bois was self-assertive without being aggressive, assuming without hesitation the right to equality of all people.

Knowing his mission early on, Du Bois headed to school to become educated adequately to realize it (a task not without struggle in the virulently racist world of the times). He attended Fisk University as an undergraduate student and Harvard University as a graduate student as well as studied abroad in Germany. He was the first African-American to be awarded a Ph.D. from Harvard. At Harvard, he studied philosophy under William James, George Santayana, and Josiah Royce. Du Bois learned a lot from his philosophy teachers, especially James, but he came to reject academic philosophy, referring to it as “lovely but sterile” (Lewis, Biography 92). He turned to history and sociology instead.

Du Bois’ dissertation reflects this new direction. It is entitled The Suppression of the African Slave Trade to the United States of America, 1638-1870. Du Bois began to turn his energies to a socio-economic analysis of the African-American situation. His efforts were guided by the belief that a proper understanding of this situation would help eliminate racism; if people only understood properly what African-Americans were going through, Du Bois felt, they would appreciate better the circumstances that they face and would work toward their full liberation and flourishing. This line of thought led to the publication of The Philadelphia Negro in 1899.

Du Bois’ most important work, The Souls of Black Folk, was published in 1903, and reflects an important new direction of his thinking. This is the work for which he is most renowned, the work in which he declared, famously, that “the problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color-line” (Souls, V). About this work, Du Bois’ biographer writes, “It was one of those events epochally dividing history into a before and an after” (Lewis, Biography 277). What makes this work so important, culturally, is the way in which it speaks out passionately and uncompromisingly about the spirit of African-Americans, emphasizing their humanity and strength despite centuries of the worst oppression. In addition, Du Bois in this book dared to challenge the most famous African-American intellectual of the day, Booker T. Washington, and to assert an opposing principle to Washington’s belief that industrial education alone would lead to equality. Du Bois argued instead that African-Americans must be given the chance to attain the most sophisticated, higher education as well, so that they might partake of the goods of civilization as well as be fit candidates to educate other African-Americans in turn (a task not to be left fully to whites).

The Souls of Black Folk is a work rich in philosophical content, as will be discussed in more detail below. For now, however, it should be noted that Du Bois shifts direction in this work and takes a novel approach from his previous work. Still trying to build understanding and sympathy for the situation of African-Americans, especially in the period after Reconstruction, Du Bois now combines socio-economic research with poetry, song, story, and philosophy. A new, multi-faceted voice grips Du Bois, allowing him, in what can only be called a great and profound piece of literature, to pierce the mind of his readers and to make them feel overwhelmingly the significance of being black in America.

In his middle works, most notably Darkwater, published in 1919, Du Bois changes directions again, as Manning Marable notes (Marable, vi). This time, instead of trying to make the reader gently understand, Du Bois lambastes the reader for failing to understand. Darkwater is a fiery, accosting work, in which Du Bois makes such claims as that “white Christianity is a miserable failure” because of its racism (Darkwater, 21), and that white civilization is to a large extent “mutilation and rape masquerading as culture” (Darkwater, 21). Du Bois’ new approach consists of the attempt to wake up the reader from their racist slumber, to force them to see the racism wherever it is for what it is.

This work, in which Du Bois asserts that, “a belief in humanity is a belief in colored men” (Darkwater, 27), has become particularly important for later, critical race theory (see below). It is worth noting about the work for now that again Du Bois blends philosophy, poetry, literature, history, and sociology in a unique, energizing manner that was to remain his stylistic trademark.

Du Bois’ later works include Dusk of Dawn (1940), his “autobiography of a concept of race.” It also includes Black Folk, Then and Now: An Essay in the History and Sociology of the Negro Race (1939), in which he endorses a form of Marxist critique, and the posthumously published Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois (1968), which contains reflections on his life in its last decade.

Throughout his life, in addition to writing, Du Bois worked as an activist for social causes. He was editor of the journal, Crisis (1910-1919), which explored contemporary racial problems and how to combat them. He helped found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People (NAACP) as well as the Pan African Congress. He ran for the U.S. Senate in order to help improve the plight of African Americans. Later in life, as the chair of the Peace Information Center, he called for banishing atomic weapons and making them illegal (Lewis; Hynes).

In 1959, after a lifetime of combating rampant racism in the U.S., Du Bois had enough and expatriated to Ghana, Africa. He spent his time in Africa working on an Encyclopedia of African Peoples and refining his social analysis, which had come to include Marxist elements (he became an official member of the U.S. Communist Party before his departure). Du Bois died in Accra, Ghana, on August 27, 1963—immediately before the March on Washington that inaugurated the civil rights movement in America, as several commentators have observed (Lewis; Hynes).

2. General Philosophical Orientation

Philosophically speaking, Du Bois’ work is difficult to characterize, since he lived and wrote for such a long time and refined his position over so many years. Eugene C. Holmes has described Du Bois as a materialist and a social philosopher (Holmes, 80-1). According to Holmes, “with Dr. Du Bois…it was always the problem of getting the truth about race by means of a scientific approach” (Holmes, 77).

Recent scholarship has adopted a more nuanced perspective. Cornel West puts Du Bois decidedly in the camp of the pragmatists, that is, in the camp of someone who works in the “Emersonian tradition” of evading traditional philosophical problems altogether and turning instead to the empowerment of individuals and communities. What Du Bois adds to the pragmatists, according to West, is an impassioned and focused concern for “the wretched of the earth” and for thinking about how one can alleviate their plight (West, 138). Other more recent approaches tend to see Du Bois as a highly important critical theorist, or someone whose work is inherently and purposefully interdisciplinary in nature, drawing on multiple disciplines as needed to critique power, especially white power (Rabaka, 2). This view would seemed to be confirmed by Du Bois’ biographer, who concludes his painstakingly thorough account of Du Bois’ life and work by noting that Du Bois, in essence, “attempted virtually every possible solution to the problem of twentieth century racism—scholarship, propaganda…international communism” (Lewis, The Fight for Equality, 571). Hence, the traditional view of Du Bois as always concerned with getting at the truth about race through science would seem to be contradicted by recent scholarship, which holds that Du Bois tried multiple, irreconcilable approaches (even propaganda) to achieve his ends.

Even so, there remains important recent scholarship that sees Du Bois as a more traditional philosopher, concerned with the ideals of truth, goodness, and beauty. According to Keith Byerman, for example, Du Bois possesses “confidence in his grasp of truth,” and his autobiographies, for one, are stories in which he always gains “a fuller view of truth” (Byerman, 7). The truth that Du Bois realizes, according to Byerman, is that there is a “Law of the Father,” which “challenges the corrupt father… By supplanting the father, the son can install an “empire” of reason, morality, and beauty to replace arbitrary power and self-interest” (Byerman, 7-8). On this reading, which is Platonic in many ways, truth, goodness, and beauty are ideal qualities by appeal to which Du Bois judges and condemns the corrupt world of racial inequality.

Overall, then, we can see that the general interpretation of Du Bois’ philosophy is contested ground, and that no clear-cut, agreed-upon definition of it emerges from the scholarship. Some Continental Philosophers have even identified Du Bois as Hegelian in a crucial respect (or at least as having “held out as ideal” one of Hegel’s main goals) (Higgins, 58). The point is made that, like Hegel, the Du Boisian self is also torn asunder, divided within itself, only to have to struggle to attain a higher synthesis of identity in a new formation. Materialist, Pragmatist, Critical Theorist, Platonist, Hegelian—Du Bois’ general philosophical orientation is far from having been finally determined.

3. Double Consciousness

Whatever turns out to be the best general account of Du Bois’ philosophy, it seems the significance of his thought only really shows up in the specific details of his works themselves, especially in The Souls of Black Folk. It is here that he first develops his central philosophical concept, the concept of double consciousness, and spells out its full implications.

The aim of Souls of Black Folk is to show the spirit of black people in the United States: to show their humanity and the predicament that has confronted their humanity. Du Bois asserts that “the color line” divides people in the States, causes massive harm to its inhabitants, and ruins its own pretensions to democracy. He shows, in particular, how a veil has come to be put over African-Americans, so that others do not see them as they are; African-Americans are obscured in America; they cannot be seen clearly, but only through the lens of race prejudice. African-Americans feel this alien perception upon them but at the same time feel themselves as themselves, as their own with their own legitimate feelings and traditions. This dual self-perception is known as “double consciousness.” Du Bois’ aim in Souls is to explain this concept in more specific detail and to show how it adversely affects African-Americans. In the background of Souls is always also the moral import of its message, to the effect that the insertion of a veil on human beings is wrong and must be condemned on the grounds that it divides what otherwise would be a unique and coherent identity. Souls thus aims to make the reader understand, in effect, that African-Americans have a distinct cultural identity, one that must be acknowledged, respected, and enabled to flourish.

Souls contains a Forethought, fourteen chapters, and an Afterthought. Each chapter is preceded by a bar of African-American spiritual music coupled with a poem.

The Forethought tells us the plan of the work: to present “the spiritual world in which ten thousand Americans live and strive” (Souls, v). Chapter 1, “Of Our Spiritual Strivings,” is perhaps the most important chapter of the book from a strictly philosophical perspective. Here Du Bois lays out the basic concept of double consciousness, while the remainder of the work provides concrete instances of the concept. The Afterthought, rich and powerful in poetic imagery, implores the reader not to let Du Bois’ “leaves” fail to take root: it is an impassioned call to action based on the book’s insights.

“An American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings”—with these words from Chapter 1, Du Bois highlights the extreme tension involved in double consciousness (Souls, 2). Or, as he also expresses the point, “Why did God make me an outcast and a stranger in mine own house?” (Souls, 2). Double consciousness is the awareness of being a split person, a dual self whose different parts are at dire odds with one another. The American self in a person, such as America was then constituted, works against the Negro self; while the Negro self, resisting as it must such a constitution, works against the American self. In one person, therefore, we have two deeply divided tendencies.

Du Bois does not conceive this division to be a good thing; he conceives it, indeed, as positively unhealthy and problematic. He refers to it as “this waste of double aims, this seeking to satisfy two unreconciled ideals,” which “has wrought sad havoc with the courage and faith and deeds of ten thousand people” (Souls, 3). Not knowing which particular direction to turn, always fighting against oneself in either direction, what double consciousness prevents is the attainment of “self-conscious manhood,” a coherent sense of self and direction, the ability “to merge his double self into a better and truer self” (Souls, 2).

In Du Bois’ conception, the human self is thus capable of being cut or split, and at the same time capable of growing back together again and becoming, as he says, better and even more true. Of course, a truer self implies something like truth—and thus we can see that Du Bois holds to the idea of a more genuine ideal of a person, specifically of African-Americans. Du Bois’ idea is that African-Americans have in truth a unique, valuable identity but that current conditions keep this identity from forming or at least becoming fully active and available. We can see here, too, Du Bois’ famous call for allowing African-Americans to become genuine participants in American culture, “to be a co-worker in the kingdom of culture” (Souls, 3), in such a way that American culture could only benefit by the inclusion of its own genuine members. Du Bois does not wish to eliminate white American culture nor Negro culture in America. He wishes to fuse the two into a genuine new element, “in order that some day on American soil two world-races may give each to each those characteristics both so sadly lack” (Souls, 7). Through recognition of a place for African-Americans in American culture, Du Bois wishes to achieve a genuine American culture as well: “the ideal of human brotherhood, gained through the unifying ideal of Race” (Souls, 7).

In the remaining chapters of Souls, Du Bois provides some rather powerful (and tragic) instances of the struggles with dual selfhood that African-Americans have had to undergo. A key idea of Chapter 1 is to show what Reconstruction meant for African-Americans: the chance not only to be free, and educated, and to have the vote, but more importantly (as Du Bois argues it) to become whole human beings. Chapter 2 examines the aftermath of Reconstruction and shows how Reconstruction (in the form of the Freedmen’s Bureau) at first worked slowly toward, but then ultimately failed to achieve, this ideal. Chapter 3 continues to show how the ideal failed to develop by pointing to the slow and ineffective rise of leadership of African-Americans. It is in this chapter that Du Bois famously challenges Booker T. Washington for his call to lead blacks through industrial education without the inclusion of higher learning. How, Du Bois reasons, can African-Americans become “co-workers in the kingdom of culture” if they are only trained in the sterile practice of moneymaking? In Chapters 4 and 5, Du Bois takes his readers further into the idea of the veil, taking a look both inside it and outside in each chapter, respectively. By Chapter 6, we realize that the main problem in achieving coherent personhood for African-Americans is education. Chapters 7 and 8 outline the struggles that the masses of African-American workers, in particular, have undergone. Chapter 9 turns toward the present relations between African-Americans and white Americans. It focuses, in particular, on the manners and modes of segregation that keep the best of whites living apart from the best of African-Americans, thereby preventing a fruitful fusion of cultures. In Chapter 10, Du Bois purports to lift the veil, so that whites can see inside and especially appreciate the religious sense and striving of African Americans. He shows that the meaning of the religion is that it constitutes a special place where the kind of community and life for African-Americans can be attained that the white world denies them. Religion has had to become a refuge, but also at the same time a source of genuine freedom of expression and creativity. Chapter 11, which is very moving, recounts the birth (and loss) of Du Bois’ own son as an instance of his own struggle against white culture. Here Du Bois laments that his newborn, innocent son will soon have to cross into the color line of hateful American prejudice. Chapters 12 and 13 discuss the struggles that great African-American souls had to deal with to become more fully appreciated, including a narrative about a man named John who defended his sister against dishonor only to be met with horrible racism as a result. Chapter 14, the last chapter, closes with a rich discussion of African-American music in which Du Bois points to this music as an emblem of the possible brighter future in which African-Americans become co-workers in American culture. Such music is the symbol of this better future in which African-Americans contribute to the culture since it is, after all, he claims, the only genuinely beautiful music that has come out of America to date, and reveals what African-Americans can accomplish.

Thus, Du Bois provides us with multiple instances of double consciousness. In each case, African-Americans are shown to be struggling to achieve themselves, due to the enforced divisions and roadblocks of white culture. What Du Bois presents here are short, powerful looks at the struggle to be recognized as fully human, a struggle due to the horrible crime of racism. The concept of double consciousness plays itself out in a variety of ways—from the agonizing worry a father feels in raising his son in a white world to the failed policies of segregation and the creation of ghettos in American cities—always with the same devastating effect, the compromising of identity, and yet with a new identity that is forming and emerging. The African-American is forced to struggle to be him- or herself in America, Du Bois shows, but they have done so heroically and with deep humanity throughout their plight.

Some Du Bois interpreters (Higgins) have found parallels between Du Bois’ conception of double consciousness and Nietzsche’s conception of the free spirit, or the man who stands apart. The idea is that in both cases someone within the culture is at the same time able to stand outside of it. But as we have seen above, beyond this general notion, Du Bois clearly develops his concept of double consciousness in the context of African-Americans specifically. Nor does he favor this sense of division in the way that Nietzsche sometimes seems to do but rather he actively seeks to overcome it.

The overall implication of Souls is that such enforced separation of consciousness as occurs in the case of African-Americans is wrong; it violates something fundamental about the human condition, and it ruins our republic, by preventing us from forming the best use of our talents by drawing on the strengths of all races. We must work together to attain a greater sense of personhood for the members of our culture.

4. Second Sight

Du Bois’ other major philosophical concept is that of “second sight.” This is a concept he develops most precisely in Darkwater, a work, as we have seen, in which Du Bois changes his approach and takes up a stauncher stance against white culture.

Du Bois holds that due to their double consciousness, African-Americans possess a privileged epistemological perspective. Both inside the white world and outside of it, African-Americans are able to understand the white world, while yet perceiving it from a different perspective, namely that of an outsider as well.

The white person in America, by contrast, contains but a single consciousness and perspective, for he or she is a member of a dominant culture, with its own racial and cultural norms asserted as absolute. The white person looks out from themselves and sees only their own world reflected back upon them—a kind of blindness or singular sight possesses them. Luckily, as Du Bois makes clear, the dual perspective of African-Americans can be used to grasp the essence of whiteness and to expose it, in the multiple senses of the word “expose.” That is to say, second sight allows an African-American to bring the white view out into the open, to lay it bare, and to let it wither for the problematic and wrong-headed concept that it is. The destruction of “whiteness” in this way leaves whites open to the experience of African-Americans, as a privileged perspective, and hence it also leaves African-Americans with a breach in the culture through which they could enter with their legitimate, and legitimating, perspectives.

5. Critique of White Imperialism

In a particularly important essay of Dark Water, called “The Souls of White Folk,” Du Bois reveals some of the wisdom of his race’s privileged perspective. As Du Bois sees it, whites see themselves a certain way, namely as superior, civilized, perfect, beneficent, and called upon to help other peoples with their higher wisdom. But, in truth, as African-Americans can perceive quite plainly, whites are actually imperialistic, ugly, greedy, and corrupt in their practices. Whites are imprisoned in their own false self-conception. Their own seriousness with themselves contrasts sharply with the reality that African-Americans see. What they see, above all, is that white society consists not of higher wisdom but only of “mutilation and rape masquerading as culture” (Darkwater, 21).

Du Bois makes his claims more pointed and specific by noting that the concept of “whiteness” is what we might today call a social construct. It is a concept that developed in the late nineteenth century and in the twentieth century. Before that, various societies hardly made much of differences in skin color. What is significant about this fact is that it shows whiteness as a category to emerge simultaneously with the development of industrialism and its counterpart colonialism. Western peoples wanted the material resources of the third world, and so they invented the myth of their own superiority based on skin color, and the supposed inferiority of dark peoples, in order to assist them in their desire to steal.

Based on such maneuvers as these, the third world was conquered, dark peoples were murdered, raped, and exploited, and white culture became rich. This wealth and power in turn gave whites a sense of superiority. But this sense of superiority is undone by the tragic-comic self-conception whites have of themselves as superior simply because they are white, when in fact they are bound to a false, invented self-conception based on color, one that only serves to assist in murder and exploitation. The supposedly civilized concept of “whiteness” in truth sinks into barbarism and insatiable world conquest.

And it is this, precisely, that whites cannot see about themselves, but must learn to see, if the problem of the twentieth century, the problem of the color line, is to be overcome and the races are to create together a greater and truer democracy.

6. Later Marxism

Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. As he put it in his autobiography, “I now state my conclusion frankly and clearly: I believe in communism. I mean by communism, a planned way of life in the production of wealth and work designed for building a state whose object is the highest welfare of its people and not merely the profit of a part” (Autobiography, 57). Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy to the situation.

Du Bois was not simply a follower of Marx, however. He also added keen insights to the communist tradition himself. One of his contributions is his insistence that communism contains no explicit means of liberating Africans and African-Americans, but that it ought to focus its attentions here and work toward this end. “The darker races,” to use Du Bois’ language, amount to the majority of the world’s proletariat. Without their liberation and motive force in the production of communism, it cannot be achieved. In Black Folk, Then and Now, Du Bois writes: “the dark workers of Asia, Africa, the islands of the sea, and South and Central America…these are the one who are supporting a superstructure of wealth, luxury, and extravagance. It is the rise of these people that is the rise of the world” (Black Folk, 383).

A further contribution Du Bois makes is to show how Utopian politics such as communism is possible in the first place. Building on Engle’s claim that freedom lies in the acknowledgment of necessity, as Maynard Solomon argues (Solomon, “Introduction” 258), (because in grasping necessity we accurately perceive what areas of life are open to free action), Du Bois insists on the power of dreams. Admitting our bound nature (bound to our bellies, bound to material conditions), even stressing it, he nonetheless emphasizes our range of powers within these constraints. In a lecture called “The Nature of Intellectual Freedom” that he delivered to the Cultural and Scientific Conference for World Peace in 1949, using language that anticipates Jean-Paul Sartre, Du Bois calls attention to “the upsurging emotions,” the mind’s ability to go beyond what is present (259). Also like Sartre, Du Bois attempts to employ this power behalf of socialism. As Du Bois sees it, the human mind has the ability to take flight into “infinite freedoms” (“The Nature,” 259). This “upsurging” ability of mind is vital to bringing about socialism, for it allows us to dream of what life and social conditions might be as compared to what they currently are (Solomon, “Introduction,” 258). If properly cultivated, it allows us to see beyond the supposed necessity of the capitalist system, which everywhere presents itself, falsely, as the only way. Imagination surpasses untruth.

There is, as Du Bois points out (“The Nature,” 260), and Solomon confirms (Solomon, “Introduction,” 258), a “borderland” region in which compulsion and freedom meet. We must gain food, seek shelter, and raise our children. Necessity and liberty meet each other half way in this region, each pulling in their own direction, yet oftentimes working together. Our leaders take advantage of this region. They enforce necessity to work hard and to work in order to eat—in order, ultimately, to stifle individual freedom and its meanderings, its free decisions; and they promote ignorance of conditions in order to make us more beholden to them. However, there is hope in the fact that freedom also operates in this border region and that our minds can shape a part of what occurs in this region. Socialism must focus here and nurture this hope. It must promote, above all, “the dreaming of dreams by untwisted souls,” that our dreams might someday lead to better realities (“The Nature,” 260).

7. Du Bois’ Significance Today

Although difficult to characterize in general terms, Du Bois’ philosophy amounts to a programmatic shift away from abstraction and toward engaged, social criticism. In affecting this change in philosophy, especially on behalf of African-Americans and pertaining to the issue of race, Du Bois adds concrete significance and urgent application to American Pragmatism, as Cornel West maintains, a philosophy that is about social criticism, not about grasping absolute timeless truth.

Du Bois’ work has also been essential for Africana Critical Theory, and has influenced a host of thinkers in this tradition, as Rabaka has shown. Authors have often compared Du Bois’ work to that of Frantz Fanon in its call to overcome global race prejudice and to liberate Africa. In addition, Du Bois’ philosophy was a focus point for some of the work of Dr. Martin Luther King, Jr., among many other thinkers, who praised it highly for its commitment to truth about African-American experience and history (Rabaka, 35).

Du Bois’ philosophy has also contributed significantly to critical race theory, especially his article, “The Conservation of Races,” in which Du Bois argues, echoing Souls, that there is some real meaning to race, even if it is difficult precisely to define (Conservation, 84-85). As Robert Bernasconi makes clear, Du Bois is a central figure in the debate about the nature of race because he has triggered an intense discussion about the extent to which there is a biological basis to race and the extent to which social and cultural features define race as well (“Introduction,” 1-2).

With his concept of second sight, and the privileged perspective of minorities, Du Bois also anticipates, if not single handedly creates, Standpoint Theory in epistemology, which holds that minorities are better equipped to gain knowledge about the world than members of the dominant culture. Du Bois’ social philosophy also adds an important element to Marxism by focusing on the racial elements of oppression and their function in relation to class warfare. Moreover, his philosophy also anticipates certain French Feminists, such as Luce Irigaray, who demonstrate how culture mirrors back to us the image of our selves to the detriment of minorities.

Above all, however, Du Bois’ philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bernasconi, Robert. “Introduction,” in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Byerman, Keith E. Seizing the Word: History, Art, and Self in the Work of W. E. B. Du Bois (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Black Folk, Then and Now (Millwood, N.Y.: Kraus-Thomson Organization Limited, 1975).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept (New York: Schocken Books, 1968).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of its First Century (New York: International Publishers, 1980).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. “The Conservation of Races,” in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. “The Nature of Intellectual Freedom,” in Solomon, Maynard, ed., Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk (New York: Dover Publications, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. “The Talented Tenth.” 3/13/2006. <www.teachingamericanhistory.org/library/index.asp?documentprint=174>.
  • Harding, Sandra. The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader: Intellectual and Political Controversies (London: Routledge, 2003).
  • Higgins, Kathleen. “Double Consciousness and Second Sight,” in Critical Affinities: Nietzsche and African American Thought, ed., Jacqueline Scott and A. Todd Franklin (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006).
  • Holmes, Eugene C. “W. E. B. Du Bois: Philosopher,” in Black Titan: W. E. B. Du Bois (Boston: Beacon Press, 1970).
  • Hynes, Gerald C. “A Biographical Sketch of W. E. B. Du Bois.” 3/10/2006. http://www. Duboislc.org/html/DuBoisBio.html.
  • Irigaray, Luce. Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian G. Gill (New York: Cornell University Press, 1974).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: Biography of a Race: 1868-1919 (New York: Henry Holt, 1993).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: The Fight for Equality and the American Century: 1919-1963 (New York: Henry Holt, 2000).
  • Marable, Manning, “Introduction,” Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil. By W. E. B. Du Bois (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999), v-viii.
  • Marable, Manning. W.E.B. Du Bois: Black Radical Democrat (Boulder, Colorado: Paradigm Publishers, 2005).
  • Rabaka, Reiland. W. E. B. Du Bois and the Problems of the Twenty-First Century: An Essay on Africana Critical Theory (Lanham, MD.: Lexington Books, 2007).
  • Solomon, Maynard, “Introduction,” in Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary, Ed., Maynard Solomon (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • West, Cornel. The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism (Madison, WI: The University of Wisconsin Press, 1989).

Author Information

Donald J. Morse
Email: dmorse@webster.edu
Webster University
U. S. A.

Last updated: January 13, 2008 | Originally published: