Michael Dummett was one of the most influential British philosophers of his generation. His philosophical reputation is based partly on his studies of the history of analytical philosophy and partly on his own contributions to the philosophical study of logic, language, mathematics and metaphysics. The article deals first with the historical work, then with his on-going project, concluding with a brief discussion of his influence.
Of his historical work, it is his commentaries on Gottlob Frege that are of outstanding importance. Frege was primarily a mathematician, and Dummett has devoted a book to Frege’s philosophy of mathematics. More controversially, Dummett has argued that analytical philosophy is based on Frege’s insight that the correct way to study thought is to study language. He holds that Frege advocated a realist semantic theory. According to such a theory, every sentence (and thus every thought we are capable of expressing) is determinately true or false, even though we may not have any means of discovering which it is.
Dummett’s most celebrated original work lies in his development of anti-realism, based on the idea that to understand a sentence is to be capable of recognizing what would count as evidence for or against it. According to anti-realism, there is no guarantee that every declarative sentence is determinately true or false. This means that the realist and the anti-realist support rival systems of logic. Dummett argues that we should think in terms of a series of independent debates between realists and anti-realists, each concerned with a different type of language—so one might be an anti-realist about arithmetic but a realist, say, about the past. Dummett’s main philosophical project is to demonstrate that philosophy of language is capable of providing a definitive resolution of such metaphysical debates. His work on realism and anti-realism involves all of the following fields: philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of logic, philosophy of language and metaphysics.
Michael Dummett attended Sandroyd School and Winchester College, and served in the armed forces from 1943 to 1947. Although he was educated within the traditions of the Anglican Church at Winchester, by the age of 13 he regarded himself as an atheist. In 1944 however, he was received into the Roman Catholic Church, and he remains a practising Catholic. After his military service, he studied at Christ Church College, Oxford, graduating with First Class Honours in Philosophy, Politics and Economics in 1950 and then attained a fellowship at All Souls College. An All Souls fellowship is perhaps the ultimate academic prize open to Oxford graduates, providing an ideal opportunity to engage in research without any of the pressure that comes from having to teach, or to produce a doctoral thesis within a set period of time. From 1950 to 1951, Dummett was also Assistant Lecturer in Philosophy in Birmingham University. In Oxford, he was Reader in Philosophy of Mathematics from 1962 until 1974.
His first philosophical article was a book review, published in Mind in 1953. He has published many more articles since, most of which have been collected into three volumes. Several of the articles published in the 1950s and 1960s are considered by some to be classics, but, at this time, some members of the philosophical community worried that his published output would never match his true potential. This was partly because of his perfectionism, and partly because, from 1965 to 1968, he and his wife Ann chose to devote much of their time and energy to the fight against racism. In 1965, they helped to found the Oxford Committee for Racial Integration, which soon affiliated to a newly formed national organization, the Committee Against Racial Discrimination on whose national executive committee he served. However, CARD was wracked with internal divisions, and after an acrimonious annual convention in 1967 Dummett concluded that a white person could play only an ancillary role in the fight against racism. He did found a new organization, the Joint Council for the Welfare of Immigrants which focused specifically on immigration rights, but by 1969, his work as an activist had been reduced sufficiently to allow a return to philosophical research, and he resumed the task of writing his first major work, Frege: Philosophy of Language.
The book was eventually published in 1973 and it was a watershed in the study of Frege. Even so, the first edition was deficient in containing hardly any references to the text of Frege's work, a fault that was remedied in the second edition in 1981, published concurrently with The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy, a book whose title is self-explanatory.
Between the first and second editions of Frege: Philosophy of Language, Dummett also published Elements of Intuitionism in 1977 (a second edition was published in 2000), and his first collection of papers, Truth and Other Enigmas in 1978. In 1979, he accepted the position of Wykeham Professor of Logic at Oxford, which he held until his retirement in 1992. Although Dummett had been connected with Oxford for the whole of his professional career, he has also taught and studied outside England. He held various visiting positions at Berkeley, Ghana, Stanford, Minnesota, Princeton, Rockefeller, Munster, Bologna and Harvard. The William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard in 1976 were published in 1991 as The Logical Basis of Metaphysics, his most detailed study of the debates between realists and anti-realists. In the same year, he published his second collection of papers, Frege and Other Philosophers, and Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, his long-awaited sequel to Frege: Philosophy of Language. His third collection of papers, The Seas of Language, was published in 1993.
The lectures he delivered at Bologna in 1987, entitled Origins of Analytical Philosophy, were published in 1988 in the journal Lingua e Stile. A translation into German was made by Joachim Schulte, and this was published along with Schulte's interview with Dummett in 1988, as Ursprünge der analytischen Philosophie. The book was subsequently published in Italian in 1990, in French in 1991, and in English in 1993. In 1996-1997, he delivered the Gifford Lectures in St. Andrews University, and these were published as Thought and Reality in 2006. He also gave the John Dewey Lectures at Columbia University in 2002, which were published as Truth and the Past in 2004. In 2001, he published On Immigration and Refugees, which is in part a contribution to moral and political philosophy. He also published works on voting systems and the history of card games, all of them subjects on which he was an authority. He received a Knighthood in 1999 in recognition of his efforts to fight racism, as well as for his philosophical work.
There is an intimate connection between Dummett's studies of the history of analytical philosophy and his own contributions to the field. Much of his own work can only be understood as a response to other thinkers, who, he thinks, have set the agenda that analytical philosophers ought to follow. To understand anything of his work it is necessary to understand the significance that Wittgenstein, the intuitionists, and above all Gottlob Frege have for him.
Dummett states that early in his career (before he published the work on which his reputation rests), "I regarded myself, doubtless wrongly, as a Wittgensteinian" (Dummett, 1993a 171). The most important idea that Dummett took from the later works of Wittgenstein, is that "meaning is use". To know the meaning of a word is to understand that word, and to understand it is to be able to use it correctly. Of course, in order to be able to determine the significance of the claim that meaning is use, we must be able to spell out precisely what is involved in being able to use a word correctly: this is a task to which Dummett devoted a considerable amount of effort.
Wittgenstein also asserted in his later works that the task of philosophy is not to increase the sum of human knowledge, but to release us from the grip of confused metaphysical notions by drawing our attention to certain facts about meaning. Philosophy should limit itself to describing what we do in other areas of life, and should never attempt to alter our practices. Dummett states that, "I have never been able to sympathise with that idea," (Dummett, 1993a, 174) and, as he has noted, a Catholic philosopher could hardly be content to say that metaphysics is impossible (Dummett, 1978, 435). However, there seems to be a connection between Wittgenstein's suggestion that meaning is use and his rejection of metaphysics.
In Zettel, Wittgenstein asks the reader to consider two philosophers, one an idealist, the other a realist, who are raising their children to share their philosophical beliefs. An idealist holds that physical objects only exist in so far as they are perceived; talk of unperceived physical objects is merely a means to making predictions about future observations. The realist holds that physical objects exist independently of our capacity to perceive them. Wittgenstein suggests that both philosophers will teach their children how to use vocabulary about physical objects in exactly the same way, except, perhaps, that one child will be taught to say, "Physical objects exist independently of our perceptions," and the other will be taught to deny this. If this is the only difference between the two children, says Wittgenstein, "Won't the difference be one only of battle-cry?" (Wittgenstein, 1967, 74). For Wittgenstein, to understand the use of a word, in the manner that is relevant to philosophy, it is necessary to understand the role that sentences involving that word play in our lives. His claim in this case is that those sentences which philosophers take to express substantive statements about realism and idealism play no role whatsoever in our lives. The metaphysical sentences have no use, and so there is nothing to be understood—they are strings of words without a meaning. Wittgenstein's hope is that once we see that, in a given metaphysical dispute, both sides are divided by nothing more than their different battle cries, both parties will realize that there is nothing to fight about and so give up fighting.
The argument presented above for the conclusion that metaphysical disputes are arguments about nothing does not follow just from the doctrine that meaning is use: a necessary part of the argument was the controversial observation that one's stance on a particular metaphysical issue has no possible relevance to any practices in which one engages outside the arcane practice of arguing with other metaphysicians. This would have to be demonstrated for each metaphysical dispute in turn. Dummett accepts that meaning is use, but not that metaphysical problems need to be abandoned rather than solved. Therefore, he is faced with the challenge of explaining what content metaphysical statements have, by pointing out the exact connection between metaphysical doctrines and other practices in which we engage. Dummett met this challenge by focusing upon a disagreement in philosophy of mathematics, the dispute between intuitionists and Platonists.
In philosophy of mathematics, the term "platonism" is used to describe the belief that at least some mathematical objects (for example, the natural numbers) exist independently of human reasoning and perception. The Platonist is a realist about numbers. There are various forms of opposition to platonism. One form of anti-realism about mathematical objects is known as intuitionism.
Intuitionism was founded by L. E. J. Brouwer (1881-1966). The intuitionists argued that mathematical objects are constructed, and statements of arithmetic are reports by mathematicians of what they have constructed, each mathematician carrying out his or her own construction in his or her own mind. A concise statement of this case may be found in a lecture delivered by Brouwer in 1912 (Brouwer, 1983). This process of construction involves what Kant called "intuition", hence the name "intuitionism". Dummett does not, in fact, find the case presented by Brouwer very convincing, relying as it does on the idea that a mathematical construction is a process carried out by the individual mathematician within the privacy of his or her own mind. This seems to identify the meaning that one attaches to a mathematical term with a private mental object to which only that person has access. For Dummett, the significance of Brouwer lies not so much in the way that he and his immediate followers argued for their position, as in their exploration of the implications of their philosophical position for mathematical logic (Dummett, 1978, 215-247).
From an intuitionistic perspective, to claim that some mathematical proposition, P, is true is to claim that there is a proof of P, that is, that 'we' have access to a proof of P. It is the task of the mathematician to construct such proofs. To claim that the negation of P is true is to claim there is a proof that it is impossible to prove P. Of course, there is no guarantee that, for any arbitrary mathematical proposition, we will have either a proof of that proposition or a proof that no proof is possible. From the perspective of platonism, whether or not we have a proof, we know that P must be either true or false: mathematical reality guarantees that it has one of these two truth-values. From an intuitionist perspective, we have no such guarantee.
Consider, for example, Goldbach's conjecture, the conjecture that every even number is the sum of two primes. So far, nobody has discovered either a proof or a counter-example. It makes sense, from a realist perspective, to suppose that this conjecture might be true because every one of the infinite series of even numbers is a sum or two primes, even though there might be no proof to be discovered. As far as the intuitionist is concerned, the only thing that could make it true that all even numbers are the sum of two primes is that there be a proof. For all we know, according to the intuitionist, there might be no proof and no counter-example, in which case there is nothing to give the conjecture a truth-value.
The belief that every proposition is determinately true or false is the principle of bivalence. If we assert that the principle of bivalence holds of some set of propositions, even though we do not know whether, for every proposition in that set, there is sufficient evidence to confirm or refute that proposition, then our assertion of bivalence must be based on the belief that truth can transcend evidence. In dealing with mathematics, to have sufficient evidence to confirm a proposition is to have a proof of that proposition. So we see that, in the dispute between platonists (realists about numbers), and intuitionists (anti-realists about numbers), the realist affirms the principles of bivalence and that truth may transcend evidence, and the anti-realist denies these two principles.
Intuitionism is a doctrine that has clear implications for mathematical practice: the realist considers certain inferences to be valid which the intuitionist considers to be invalid. Suppose, for example, we have a proof that 'P implies R', and that 'not-P implies R'. In the form of logic favored by the realist, classical logic, we then have a proof of R, because we can apply the law of excluded middle, which tells us that 'P or not-P'. The intuitionist cannot appeal to the law of excluded middle. In order to derive R from 'P implies R' and 'not-P implies R', the intuitionist would also have to prove either P or not-P. In virtue of these clear implications for mathematical practice, the difference between the Platonist and the intuitionist can hardly be dismissed as merely one of battle-cry.
Dummett has suggested that certain other philosophical debates between realists and anti-realists should take the same form, once both sides properly understand the nature of the debate. The example taken from Wittgenstein concerned a debate between a realist and an idealist concerning physical objects. According to Dummett, the idealist's opposition to the view that physical objects exist independently of our perceptions of them should result in the rejection of both evidence-transcendent truth and bivalence. The idealist will be proposing some reform of classical logic, although it might not be exactly the same as that proposed by the intuitionist, since it will have to incorporate an account of what counts as sufficient evidence to confirm or refute a statement about physical objects. The important point to note is that the issue at stake will be which logical laws we should accept. If Dummett is correct, the great insight of the intuitionists was to realize that metaphysical disputes were really disputes about logical laws. However, we have also seen that he does not find the arguments of Brouwer and others in favor of this revision of classical logic to be compelling. He believed that the thinker who provided the tools that will enable us to solve such disputes was Gottlob Frege, not Brouwer.
Gottlob Frege (1848-1925) was a mathematician by profession, whose work on the foundations of mathematics carried him deep into philosophical territory. His ultimate goal, for most of his career, was to demonstrate that all truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical premises. This position is known as "logicism." Frege's attempted proof of logicism was a failure, and, thanks to Kurt Gödel, we know that no single axiomatic system can suffice for the proof of all truths of arithmetic. In Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics Dummett attempts to pinpoint exactly where Frege went wrong. For current purposes, it is more important to understand the extent to which Dummett approves of Frege's work. Dummett has probably been the most important commentator on Frege. His interpretation of Frege's work is by no means universally accepted, but serious students of Frege's work can hardly afford to ignore it.
According to Dummett, Frege's unsuccessful project had two important by-products. In order to vindicate his logicism, Frege had to invent a language in which numbers could be defined by means of a more primitive logical vocabulary, and by means of which statements of arithmetic could be either proved or disproved. This Frege achieved in 1879, the major technical innovation being the use of quantifiers to handle statements involving multiple generality. In other words, Frege invented a formal language in which it is possible to display the difference between "Everybody loves somebody", and "There is somebody whom everybody loves", and to demonstrate clearly how different conclusions can be derived from each these. This was a major achievement, and all current formal languages, rely upon Frege's method for expressing such statements. Consequently, Frege has been crowned as the founder of modern formal logic.
It is hardly surprising that, having used logic to investigate the foundations of mathematics, Frege should also have been interested in the nature of logic itself. Frege wrote a variety of papers on the nature of thought, meaning and truth; and on a number of occasions, he attempted to combine these into a comprehensive treatise on logic. Dummett adopts the label "philosophy of language" for this aspect of Frege's work, and he views it as the second important by-product of Frege's failed project (Dummett, 1981b, 37).
Why does Dummett reject Frege's own term for this field of study, "logic", and instead describe it as "philosophy of language", a label whose accuracy has been disputed? Dummett rejects the label "logic" because he prefers to use that word in the narrow Aristotelian sense of the study of principles of inference (Dummett, 1981b, 37). That alone does not explain why he chooses "philosophy of language" as an alternative label, rather than, for example, "philosophy of thought." This label is adopted because he thinks that Frege's work made it natural for philosophers to take the "linguistic turn", and thus to become analytical philosophers, although Dummett acknowledges that Frege himself did not explicitly make this turn, and that some of his statements seem to be antithetical to it (Dummett, 1993a, 7). According to Dummett, the linguistic turn is taken when one recognizes
[F]irst, that a philosophical account of thought can be attained through a philosophical account of language, and, secondly, that a comprehensive account can only be so attained. (Dummett, 1993a, 4)
As an example of how Frege's approach to philosophical questions anticipated the explicit acknowledgement of the priority of language over thought, Dummett refers to Frege's use of the context principle in Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, published in 1884. When faced with the question of what number words mean, Frege invokes the context principle, which is characterized by Dummett as
[T]he thesis that it is only in the context of a sentence that a word has a meaning: the investigation therefore takes the form of asking how we can fix the senses of sentences containing words for numbers. (Dummett, 1993a, 5)
It should be noted that the term that Dummett here translates as "sentence", Satz, is, in this passage, (p. x of Frege's original text) translated as "proposition" by J.L. Austin (Frege, 1980a, x) and Michael Beaney (Frege, 1997, 90). Dummett's translation is more favorable to his interpretation of the context principle as a linguistic principle than that of Austin and Beaney.
What is important, for Dummett, is that Frege does not approach the question of numbers by focusing on what is happening inside our heads when we think of a number. Frege, even if he did not explicitly embrace the linguistic turn, rejected psychologism—the view that would have us understand logic by studying private mental processes. Dummett holds that the rejection of psychologism leads more or less inevitably to the linguistic turn (Dummett, 1993a, 25).
On Dummett's view, the contrast between Brouwer and Frege could be put as follows. Brouwer introspected, and found that he had intuitions of proofs, but not of numbers. Frege focused on sentences containing numerical terms, asking whether the numerical terms functioned as names, and whether there was a guarantee that such sentences were all determinately true or false, holding that an affirmative answer to each of these two questions would be sufficient to establish that numbers are objects—the presence or absence of any private mental ideas or intuitions being irrelevant.
Even if the use Frege makes of the context principle in the Grundlagen makes a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, that need not in itself be seen as a contribution to philosophy of language. Indeed, Dummett himself writes as follows of the Grundlagen:
Realism is a metaphysical doctrine; but it stands or falls with the viability of a corresponding semantic theory. There is no general semantic theory in, or underlying the Grundlagen; the context principle repudiates semantics. That principle, as understood in the Grundlagen, ought therefore not to be invoked as underpinning realism, but as dismissing the issue as spurious. (Dummett, 1991a, 198)
Dummett holds that Frege did supply a semantic theory in his writings after the Grundlagen, indeed, a few lines after the paragraph cited above, he adds:
Full-fledged realism depends on—indeed, may be identified with—an undiluted application to sentences of the relevant kind a straightforward two-valued classical semantics: a Fregean semantics in fact.
A "straightforward two-valued classical semantics" involves a commitment to bivalence, and we have already seen why Dummett views this as the defining feature of realism. Commentators who do not accept Dummett's characterization of realism would not necessarily agree with his characterization of Frege as a realist, since it is not a label that Frege himself adopts. We must now consider what it was that Frege added to his philosophy after the Grundlagen that constitutes, on Dummett's view, a general semantic theory incorporating the principle of bivalence. If the Grundlagen can be used by Dummett as evidence that Frege's work made a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, it is to his later writings that he turns for evidence of Frege's contributions to philosophy of language.
Dummett describes Frege as a realist in virtue of his semantic theory. Frege never explicitly described himself as a realist, and never explicitly stated that he was advancing a semantic theory. Dummett's interpretation provides a framework for evaluating the views that Frege did explicitly advance. To understand Dummett's interpretation of Frege, it will be useful to see how this interpretation can be used to make sense of the views advanced in Frege's most influential paper, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" (Frege, 1892). The translation of Bedeutung has been a controversial question; a guide is given in Beaney's preface to (Frege, 1997, 36-46). Dummett's preferred translation is "reference" (Dummett, 1981a, 84), so that the title of the article would be "On Sense and Reference". The standard English translations (Frege, 1980b, 56-79 and Frege, 1997, 151-172) both include page references to the original text of 1892.
Frege introduces the distinction between sense and reference by the example of proper names. It is frequently informative to be told that two names stand for the same object: it was, for example, a significant discovery that the evening star is the morning star. In such a case, Frege says that we are discovering that two names that have a different sense have the same reference. They have the same reference because they stand for the same object, they have a different sense because, in each case, the object is presented in a different way (Frege, 1892, 26). Frege then asserts that, in indirect speech, rather than using a name to speak of the object referred to, as is usual, we speak about the sense. If "the morning star" and "the evening star" really do designate one and the same object, then any true statement that includes the phrase "the morning star" can be converted into a true statement in which the phrase "the evening star" is substituted for "the morning star" throughout. An obvious exception to this rule would be a statement such as "Before it was discovered by the Babylonians that the morning star is the evening star, people did not believe the evening star was visible in the morning" (Frege, 1892, 28). Frege's claim is that the sense is that which is understood by users of a word. When we talk about pre-Babylonian astronomical beliefs, what is relevant to the truth of what we say is the understanding people then had of "the morning star", and not, as is more usual, the morning star itself.
Frege is very clear that the sense of a word is something objective: two people grasp one and the same sense of a word, just as two people may view the moon through one and the same telescope (Frege, 1892, 31). Frege then introduces a new piece of terminology: a name designates its reference, but expresses its sense (Frege, 1892, 32).
Having introduced the distinction between sense and reference, Frege then asks whether a sentence has a reference (Frege, 1892, 32). He starts by asserting that a sentence expresses a thought. This implies, of course, that a thought is the sense of a sentence, because what is expressed is a sense. He also observes that when we alter the sense of any part of a sentence, the sense of the whole sentence is altered (Frege, 1892, 32). So, just as two people can both grasp the sense of a particular name, they can also grasp the sense of a particular sentence: that is, different people can think the very same thought. Now that it is established that a sentence has a sense, and that the sense of the sentence depends upon the sense of the parts of the sentence, Frege argues that if the sentence has a reference, this too would depend on the reference of the parts. If a proper name lacks a bearer, then it will not have a reference, and one would expect that a sentence that contains a name without a bearer would lack a reference. Frege considers an example of a sentence that contains a name without a bearer, a sentence from The Odyssey about Odysseus—Frege is supposing that there is no such person as Odysseus. Frege asserts that such a sentence fails to be true or false: what the sentence lacks is a truth-value (Frege, 1892, 33). This leads Frege to conclude that the reference of a sentence is its truth-value: he states that the True and the False are objects, and truth-values, and that all sentences either name one of these two objects, or else they are names that fail to name anything (Frege, 1892, 34).
Frege then finds further support for this conclusion. He has already stated that if two names stand for the same object, one name may be substituted for the other without changing the truth of what is said, unless, as in indirect speech, we are using a name to designate the sense that that name usually bears. Frege claims that the same applies to sentences. When one sentence contains another as its part, the truth-value of the larger sentence is unchanged when the sentence that forms a part is replaced by another sentence that bears the same truth-value, unless we are dealing with indirect speech (Frege, 1892, 36). Frege proceeds to defend this claim in the rest of the article, analyzing particular cases.
Dummett holds that there are two guiding principles that we need in order to understand Frege's work on sense and reference. The first is that Frege is offering a semantic theory, in which the reference of an expression is its semantic value, the second is that to understand the relationship between a word and its referent, we must take as a model the relationship between a name and its bearer (Dummett, 1981a, 190).
A semantic theory explains how the truth-value of a sentence is determined by its parts. In a semantic theory, every simple expression is assigned a semantic value, and the semantic value of a complex expression is determined by the semantic value of the simple expressions from which it is composed. The truth-value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts.
Consider, for example, the expressions "George Lucas", "Gottlob Frege", "contributed to mathematical logic", and "directed a famous film". The sentence "Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic" is true, but the sentence "George Lucas contributed to mathematical logic" is not true. This is because "Gottlob Frege" and "George Lucas" each have a different semantic value, or, in plain English, "Gottlob Frege" and "George Lucas" are not two different names for the same person (and George Lucas made no independent contribution to mathematical logic). Similarly, from the fact that "Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic" is true, but "Gottlob Frege directed a famous film" is not true, we can conclude that "... directed a famous film" and "... contributed to mathematical logic" do not share the same semantic value.
Semantic theories have a role in the justification of systems of formal logic. Dummett holds that Frege used his work on sense and reference to justify his formal system in exactly the way that logicians today use what is explicitly described as a semantic explanation. Indeed, Dummett sees Frege's work as providing the foundations for all current work in semantics of natural language (Dummett, 1981a, 81-83).
Dummett does not just claim that Frege had a semantic theory; he claims that he had a realist semantic theory. The semantic theory is realist because the prototype of a term's semantic value is the object designated by a name: a term's having a semantic value is equated with its picking out non-linguistic reality, and the failure to pick out non-linguistic reality would result in a failure to have a semantic value (Dummett, Frege: Philosophy of Language, 1981a, 404). From Frege's perspective, if an expression lacks a semantic value, then that really is a failure: a semantic value is something that no expression should be without. If a (declarative) sentence lacks a truth-value, that is because something has gone wrong: all (declarative) sentences should be either true or false, because their components should all denote bits of reality.
Dummett holds that it was an important turning point when Frege described a sentence as a proper name for a truth-value. He thinks that, at this point, Frege lost sight of an important insight embodied in the context principle: the importance of the sentence as the smallest unit of language that can be used to say something. Once a sentence is treated as just a proper name, and a truth-value as just another object, there is no acknowledgement that there is something special about the role of a sentence in language (Dummett, 1981a, 195-196).
Dummett is also unsatisfied by Frege's account of sense. We have seen that, for Frege, several people may grasp the sense of one word or of one thought, and that just as the sense of a name denotes an object, the sense of a thought denotes a truth-value. But what is involved in grasping a sense?
Frege's answer is that senses are neither part of the world of spatio-temporal objects, nor do they exist inside the minds of individuals. They belong to a "third realm", a timeless world, to which all of us have access. Dummett is far from endorsing the suggestion that thoughts occupy a third realm beyond time and space. He describes this doctrine as a piece of "ontological mythology", the term "mythology" here being used in a purely pejorative sense (Dummett, 1993a, 25). Dummett thinks that these two loose ends should be tied together. Rather than being content to describe the act of understanding as involving a mysterious connection between our minds and timeless entities known as senses, we should focus on the practice of using sentences in a language. This, in turn requires us to think about the purpose of classifying sentences as true or false, and that requires that we think about the purposes for which we use a language (Dummett, 1981a, 413). The result of this process might be to vindicate Frege's semantics, or it might vindicate the intuitionist position. Dummett's most influential contribution to philosophy can be understood as an attempt to resolve this unfinished business.
Along with his historical work, Dummett is known for his on-going work on a grand metaphysical project. The aim of this project is to find a means of resolving a number of debates, each of which has a common form but a different subject matter. In each debate, there is a realist, and an anti-realist, and they differ concerning which logical principles they apply to statements of the type that are under dispute—as it may be, statements of arithmetic, statements about the past, about the future, about the physical world, about possible worlds, and so forth. To decide in favor of anti-realism in one instance does not mean that one must always decide in favor of anti-realism, and the same is true for realism.
Some of Dummett's papers deal with arguments that are quite specific to one particular debate—for example, he discusses the charge that anti-realism about the past is ultimately self-defeating, since what is now the present will be the past (Dummett, "The Reality of the Past", in his 1978), and he has advanced an argument about the nature of names for non-existent natural-kinds that is intended to undercut David Lewis's argument for the thesis that all possible worlds are real (Dummett, "Could There Be Unicorns?" in his 1993b). However, he is best known for advancing a generic line of argument that the anti-realist in any particular debate could appeal to. That does not mean that he thinks that the anti-realist will always be successful. In his valedictory lecture as Wykeham Professor of Logic, he stated:
I saw the matter, rather, as the posing of a question how far, and in what contexts, a certain generic line of argument could be pushed, where the answers 'No distance at all' and 'In no context at all' could not be credibly entertained, and the answers 'To the bitter end' and 'In all conceivable contexts' were almost as unlikely to be right. (Dummett, 1993b, 464)
The difference between the realist and the anti-realist, in each case, concerns the correct logical laws, because, for reasons explained in section 2.2, Dummett thinks that metaphysical debates are properly understood as debates about logical laws. Dummett's most complete statement of the nature of such metaphysical debates, and the means by which they can be resolved was The Logical Basis of Metaphysics (Dummett, 1991b).
According to Dummett, to find out how to resolve metaphysical disputes, we must find out how to justify a logic—that is, a set of principles of inference. Logic is the study of validity—an inference is valid if, and only if, the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. The logician wants to be able to recognize such truth-preserving inferences by their structure. More precision can be achieved by presenting inferences in a formal system (Dummett, 1991b, 185), and precision comes to be of vital importance when we are trying to choose between rival logical systems.
The logician wants to be able to recognize, from the structure of one set of sentences, that the members of another set of sentences are true. One method of validating rules of inference is by means of a semantic theory. In such a theory, every expression is assigned a semantic value, and an account is offered of how the semantic value of a complex expression is based upon the semantic value of its components. The aim of the semantic theory is to explain how the parts of a sentence determine the truth-value of that sentence (Dummett, 1991b, 23-25), as was explained above.
At this point, it may be helpful to focus upon a particular inference and a particular semantic theory. Suppose that we assign the following semantic values to symbols in the following way. P and Q stand for atomic sentences, which have either the value true, or the value false, and never both values. The symbol "~" when followed by a symbol which stands for an atomic sentence has the opposite value of the value of that atomic sentence. The symbol "(x v y)", where x and y are replaced by symbols which stand for atomic sentences has the value true when at least one of those atomic sentences has the value true. Otherwise, it has the value false. Next, we consider the following argument:
(1) (P v Q)
To validate this inference, we must show that if (1) and (2) are true, then the conclusion, P, must also be true. If (2) is true, then Q is false. If Q is false, then if (1) is true, it must be in virtue of the truth of P, since if both P and Q were false, (1) could not be true. So we must suppose that P is true, and that is what we were trying to demonstrate.
In this case, the semantic theory used incorporated the principle of bivalence: every sentence was assigned either the value true or the value false. For reasons explained in sections 2.2 and 2.3.2, Dummett considers this to be characteristic of realist semantics. There is no one simple alternative to the principle of bivalence. One could depart from bivalence in virtue of having more than two truth-values, or in virtue of admitting that there are sentences without a truth-value, or in virtue of believing that we have no guarantee that all sentences will have one of the two values true or false. Just as there are many alternatives to bivalence, there are many alternatives to classical logic. Although Dummett's work on deduction has its roots in the debate over intuitionism, it does not necessarily follow that, in every case, the alternative logic advocated by a Dummett-style anti-realist would be intuitionistic logic. The correct logical principles should become clear once the correct semantic theory is established.
Of course, in this case, it probably was not necessary to offer a semantic theory in order to convince the reader of the validity of the inference. Indeed, the astute reader might well wonder whether such a procedure can serve to justify a logical law at all. Did we not invoke logical laws when explaining how the inference under discussion was justified?
The answer is that we did—but this need not render the justification circular. Dummett is clear that he is not trying to show how deductive practices could be justified to someone who is completely skeptical about the possibility of deduction; rather, he is considering how we might decide whether a particular rule of inference, which is accepted by some logicians but not by others, is justifiable. As long as no logical law that is under dispute is used in the semantic theory, it will be possible to offer a justification that does not beg the question. It is important to note that the set of logical laws that are used in the semantic theory need not be co-extensive with the set of logical laws that are justified thereby (Dummett, 1991b, 204).
Dummett devotes considerable attention to establishing a procedure that can be used to show that a law is beyond dispute, a procedure that he terms "third-grade proof-theoretic justification." These are the logical laws that can be used in the semantic theory without fear of controversy. It is not possible to explain the procedure in full here, only to outline the basic principles on which the procedure is based.
As we have seen, logic deals with our ability to recognize that one set of sentences implies that all the members of some other set of sentences are true, in virtue of the structure of the sentences. The task of a system of formal logic is to display the structure, or form, in virtue of which such inferences are possible. Within such a system, the principal operator in a sentence indicates which other sentences may be derived from that sentence, possibly in conjunction with other sentences. For example, the symbol "&" may be used to indicate conjunction: if it is true to assert P & Q, then we know that it is true to assert P and true to assert Q. When we derive, for example, P from P & Q, we are said to be applying an elimination rule for "&": a rule which states how to derive from a sentence which contains "&" a sentence which does not contain "&". As well as elimination rules, a logical constant also has introduction rules. We apply an introduction rule for "&" if, having derived P from one formula, and Q from another, we then assert P & Q.
Let us assume (and this assumption is not trivial), that, whenever we assert a sentence containing "&", that sentence could have been derived by means of the introduction rule. Given the set of introduction and elimination rules for "&", along with our assumption, it will be clear that, if we add the constant "&" to a language, the only sentences that we can now assert, although we were not entitled to assert them before, are sentences which contain "&". When we derive some new sentence from a sentence containing "&", by applying the elimination rule, the final sentence will be one that we could have asserted anyway. In technical terms, this means that if we extend the language by adding the term "&", we have only a conservative extension. Dummett is in agreement with Belnap's thesis is that if we can show, for some rule, that adding this rule to a language involves only a conservative extension, then we have a reason for supposing that the addition of this rule has been justified (Dummett, 1991b, 217-220).
The assumption that, when we have a sentence containing a logical constant, that sentence could have been derived using the introduction rule for the constant, is referred to by Dummett as "the fundamental assumption". It is necessary to consider, for each logical constant whose introduction and elimination rules we wish to justify, whether the fundamental assumption is correct for it. Consider, for example, disjunction, "v"—that is, the logical constant which is more or less equivalent in meaning to "or". The standard introduction rule for disjunction is that, if one can assert P, one can assert "P v Q", and if one can assert Q, then one can assert "P v Q". To decide whether the fundamental assumption is true in this case, it is necessary to consider whether, if I see a child running across the street and say "A boy or a girl is running across the street," it is always true that I could have looked more closely, and been in a position to say either "A boy is running across the street," or "A girl is running across the street." It is a difficult task to spell out the precise content of "could have", and thus a difficult task to determine whether the fundamental assumption should be accepted for each constant (Dummett, 1991b, 270).
Even if we accept the fundamental assumption, not every alleged logical rule involves making merely a conservative extension to the language. Suppose we know that "If P, then Q" is true and also "If not-P, then Q", and from this, we derive "Q". Here, we are applying an elimination rule that does not involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it could be that the truth of "Q" was not used in deriving either of the two conditional statements.
The technical apparatus for examining whether adding some constant to the language involves a conservative or non-conservative extension is known as "proof-theory". It was pioneered by Gerhard Gentzen. Dummett's third-grade proof theoretic justification builds on the work of Dag Prawitz. Dummett's requirements are, in fact, more stringent than that adding an operator to a language involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it is necessary to take into account that two or more operators each of which, taken on its own, involves a conservative extension might, taken together, involve a non-conservative extension, (Dummett, 1991b, 286-290), but we cannot discuss all those details fully here.
It must be remembered that Dummett is not arguing that we should accept only those logical laws which can be justified by these means—rather, he is suggesting that these logical laws are the ones which can be taken for granted when trying to justify more controversial principles. Logical constants that are justified by third-grade proof-theoretic justification are above reproach. Other logical constants may be justified, if at all, by a semantic theory. Proof-theoretic justification is not sufficient to settle disputes about logical laws: it is a useful means of showing that an inference is valid, but it is less useful as a test for invalidity. The set of logical laws that are justified by a semantic theory need not be the same as the set of logical laws that are appealed to in explaining that theory (Dummett, 1991b, 301).
So, we settle a debate about a logical law by offering a semantic theory—but that just pushes the problem back one stage further; we must still consider how to settle debates about rival semantic theories. Dummett's answer is that just as a logic may be justified by a semantic theory, a semantic theory may, in turn be justified by being made the basis of a meaning-theory.
A meaning-theory is an explanation of the skill that anyone who understands a language has. As language-users, we are faced, continually, with sentences that we have never before encountered. It seems that there must be some set of rules of which we have implicit knowledge, which enable us to deduce the meaning of new sentences. Dummett is by no means alone in seeking for such a theory: in particular, there is a certain amount of overlap between Dummett's thinking and that of Donald Davidson, although it would be well beyond the scope of this article to examine the similarities and differences between these two thinkers in detail.
One suggestion, which Davidson has advocated strongly, is that a meaning-theory would specify a set of rules from which we could derive, for any sentence, a knowledge of the conditions under which that sentence is true. The suggestion is that, if you know of some sentence of a foreign language that the sentence is true if the cat is on the mat, and false if the cat is not on the mat, then you know that the sentence in question means "The cat is on the mat."
Dummett endorses the proposal that this is the best suggestion currently on offer for constructing a meaning-theory (Dummett, 1991b, 164), and notes that such a theory must be built on foundations laid by Frege. However, he distinguishes between a strong and a weak sense in which truth can be the central notion of a meaning-theory. In the strong sense, meaning is to be explained in terms of truth-conditions, as above, and it is simply taken for granted that we know what truth is. If truth is central to the meaning-theory only in the weak sense, then although knowledge of the meaning of a sentence is equated with knowledge of its truth-conditions, some further explanation is offered of what it is for a sentence to be true (Dummett, 1991b 113, 161-163). For example, an intuitionist would say that to understand some mathematical formula, it is necessary to be able to distinguish between those mathematical constructions which do and those which do not constitute proofs of the formula in question: truth is here being explained in terms of provability. If truth is central to the meaning-theory in the strong sense, however, grasp of truth-conditions is not explained in terms of any more fundamental notion: we are just told that to understand the meaning is to understand the truth-conditions, it being assumed that, for every sentence, there is something which renders it either true or false.
The connection between a semantic theory and a meaning-theory should now be apparent. Both the realist and the anti-realist offer semantic theories that explain how the semantic value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts. A meaning-theory of the type favored by Dummett will explain how, when we see what words are used in a sentence and the order in which they are put together, we are enabled to understand the truth-conditions for that sentence. The realist, adhering to the principle of bivalence, supposes that all the sentences will be determinately true or false. The anti-realist, on the other hand, can bring other notions into play to explain what it is for a sentence to be true.
So, the logic is justified by a semantics; the semantics is justified by a meaning-theory. How is the meaning-theory to be justified? A meaning-theory is judged to be successful according to whether it provides us with a satisfactory explanation of what it is to understand a language. It is important to note that Dummett requires that the meaning-theory provide us with a genuine explanation of what understanding is. He points out that while it is, no doubt, correct to say that someone understands the meaning of "Davidson has a toothache" if, and only if, they know that an utterance of this sentence is true if, and only if, Davidson has a toothache, this account fails to provide us with a non-circular explanation of what it is to understand the utterance. We want to be told exactly what it is to know that such an utterance is true. Meaning-theories of this type are classified by Dummett as "modest", and he urges other philosophers to set about the harder task of providing more ambitious meaning-theories, meaning-theories that are, in his terminology, "full-blooded." A full-blooded theory offers an explanation of understanding, which does not rely on a prior grasp of concepts such as "understanding", or "knowing the truth-conditions" (Dummett, 1991b, 113, 136).
We are now in a position to consider the "generic line of argument" that Dummett considers can be advanced by the anti-realist. This argument makes use of the Wittgensteinian principle that meaning is use. Dummett takes this to mean that there can be no element in linguistic understanding that is not manifested in the way a word is used in practice. When we recognize that a sentence is true, we are manifesting that we have a certain ability—the ability to recognize that the sentence has been verified. The same holds when we recognize that a sentence has been decisively refuted. According to an anti-realist meaning-theory ( in which justification is central), the ability to recognize when a sentence has been decisively confirmed or refuted is constitutive of knowing the meaning. (Dummett terms this a justificationist semantics). According to the realist, knowledge of how a sentence may be confirmed or refuted is answerable to a prior knowledge of the meaning.
Dummett is aware that the realist suggestion is far more intuitively compelling. However, he argues that it may yet prove to be mistaken. He offers several arguments, of which I will summaries one. Suppose that realism is correct. In that case, our ability to agree about what things are yellow is dependent upon our shared understanding of what makes it true that something is yellow. It would therefore be possible that, tomorrow, everything which is yellow becomes orange and vice versa, and that, at the same time, we all undergo a collective psychological change, so that things which are really yellow now appear to us to be orange, and vice versa. In other words, a major change would have taken place in reality, and yet none of us would notice it. Given that we had not altered the truth-conditions of sentences involving "yellow" and "orange", we would now be making many false utterances using these words. Yet this widespread falsity would pass entirely unnoticed; indeed, it would be entirely inconsequential. Our assertions would be fulfilling perfectly every purpose that they have, and yet would be false. If we admit this possibility, it seems incorrect to say, as Dummett thinks we should, that truth is the goal of our assertions. Truth and falsity would have lost their connection with practice.
Alternatively, one might argue that we would still be making true statements using "yellow" and "orange", but that the meanings of the words "yellow" and "orange" would have been altered. In that case, meaning has been altered, even though there is no observable difference in the practice, and so meaning has lost its connection with practice.
For the anti-realist, this possibility cannot arise, because there is no gap between what makes an assertion correct, and the most direct means that we have of checking that assertion. Dummett does allow that there will be indirect means of confirming a sentence, that is, methods for showing that, had we applied our most direct, or canonical method of verification, it would have been successful (Dummett, 1991b, 313-314).
It is by this type of argument that Dummett hopes to persuade us to rethink our attachment to realism. Of course, he does not think that we will know whether to be a realist or an anti-realist about a specific subject matter until we have a well-worked out meaning-theory. He does not assert that in all cases the correct meaning-theory will be an anti-realist one. Indeed, he has also offered reasons for supposing that "global anti-realism”—the thesis that anti-realism is always correct—is untenable (for example, Dummett, 1978, 367). Dummett’s anti-realism was first formulated as a thesis about arithmetic, and, as he points out, applying it to empirical discourse is not a straightforward matter:
The fundamental difference between the two lies in the fact that, whereas a means of deciding a range of mathematical statements or any other effective mathematical procedure, if available at all, is permanently available, the opportunity to decide whether or not an empirical statement holds good may be lost: what can be effectively decidable now will no longer be effectively decidable next year, nor, perhaps, next week. (Dummett, 2004, 42)
The most extreme form of anti-realism would be the theory that a statement about the past is rendered true or false only by evidence available to the speaker at the time of asserting it. This would imply that if the only evidence for the occurrence of an event is that some individual remembers it, and that individual takes the memory to their grave, then when the witness dies it ceases to be true that the event took place. However, it is basic to Dummett’s whole approach that meaning is determined by how a community uses the language; an individual acting alone cannot confer a meaning. Justification is therefore a collective enterprise; what matters is not whether I can verify a statement, but whether we can verify it, where ‘we’ are a community that includes people who are now dead. Dummett therefore rejects this most extreme form of anti-realism about the past as being too solipsistic. (Dummett, 2004, 67-68)
For this reason, Dummett accepts that some concession must be made to realism when it comes to dealing with statements about the past. He has made different suggestions about how much should be conceded: in his Gifford lectures, he argued that a proposition is true if and only if we are or were in a position to establish its truth, in the Dewey lectures that a proposition is true if and only if someone suitably placed would have been able to do so. The latter implies that statements concerning times before any human being existed have a determinate truth-value on the grounds that, if someone had existed then, they would have been able to confirm or deny such statements. (Dummett, 2006, vii-viii) These two lecture series offer quite different views about the nature of time.
It should be noted that the philosophical motivation for making a concession to realism is the attempt to do justice to the manner in which statements about the past are justified. Dummett’s justificationist approach to semantics does not imply a dogmatic insistence on anti-realism. Rather, he advocates a method for spelling out what it is to grasp truth-conditions by focusing on the way in which that grasp of truth-conditions is manifested. His central objection to truth-conditional semantics is that their advocates presuppose that we know what it is for something to be true, yet they never explain what constitutes such knowledge. This he regards as an act of faith that stands in need of a rational foundation. (Dummett, 2006, 55) Whatever concessions the justificationist may make to the realist, this central principle is not compromised.
In his Gifford Lectures, Dummett presents an argument for the existence of God that depends on his justificationist semantics. According to justificationist semantics, any account of the way the world is must be an account of the way the world is perceived by someone. We know that different animals perceive the world in different ways, and we aspire to break out of the limitations of merely human perception, and perceive the world as it is in itself—the single reality that underlies the very different perceptions that constitute the world of dogs and the world of humans.
By means of science, we have made some progress towards understanding the world as it is in itself—we can point to ways in which scientific descriptions of the world are improvements on the description based on our bare perceptions, so our aspiration to know the world as it is in itself cannot be dismissed as an incoherent longing. But insofar as this aspiration is coherent, "in itself" cannot mean "without reference to the perceptions of any being."
We might be led to suppose that perceptions had been successfully eliminated from our account of how the world is if we focus on abstract mathematical models used by scientists, but this is an error. Abstract mathematical models are a necessary part of science, but many such structures exist as models for mathematicians to study. We must be saying something further when we say of one such structure that it is not merely an object of mathematical study, but a true description of the way the world is. This ‘something further’ would include an explanation of how to apply the favored mathematical description, and that would mean matching the abstract mathematical description to perceptions.
Dummett concludes that the single world that underlies the different perceptions of humans and other species can only be understood as being the world as apprehended by a being whose knowledge constitutes the way things are—in other words, the world as apprehended by God. (Dummett, 2006, 103) Dummett thinks that this demonstrates that there exists a Creator who controls and sustains the universe, but he concedes that it is hard to reconcile Biblical statements about God’s goodness with the presence of evil in the world. (Dummett, 2006, 106)
Dummett’s work against racism was not motivated by philosophy, but it did result in his publishing a work of moral and political philosophy in 2001. The book, On Immigration and Refugees is aimed at a wide audience. In the first half, Dummett argues for a set of general principles concerning rights of immigrants and refugees. In the second half, he examines the recent history of the United Kingdom (with some discussion of other nations), analyzing the reasons why successive governments have failed to live up to the moral standards defended in the first part of the book.
Dummett’s starting point is that everyone is under an obligation to behave justly in the sense of giving people what they are due, which includes the necessities for living a fully human life. He argues that political philosophy has usually focused on the duties that a state has to its citizens, overlooking the fact that a state also represents its citizens to the outside world. Forming a corporation of any kind does not remove normal human obligations, or grant any right to be selfish, so it is immoral to congratulate politicians for upholding the interests of their own citizens at the expense of giving others what is due to them. One basic human right is to be a "first-class citizen" of some state, that is, a citizen of a state whose values one shares and where one does not face unjust persecution.
Starting from these premises, Dummett argued that there should be a presumption in favor of the right to migrate. The state has a right to refuse entry to criminals, or to halt mass immigration to prevent over-population or the submergence of its culture and language. He emphasized that in practice these conditions are rarely met, and argued that although British colonial authorities encouraged immigration policies that submerged the native population in Fiji and Malaya, the claim that British culture is being "swamped" by immigrants is merely a cover for racism. He also argued that those who are stateless have the right to become citizens of another state. Dummett recommended the creation of a commission run by the United Nations to handle such cases.
A few philosophers, notably Crispin Wright (Wright, 1983) and Neil Tennant (Tennant, 1987, 1997), have attempted to extend the project of providing anti-realist semantics for empirical language. More commonly, philosophers have reacted to Dummett's work by attempting to demonstrate that his anti-realist arguments are not successful. Even if they are not, it may yet be that he has provided the correct account of what is at stake in metaphysical disputes concerning realism, and the correct account of the proper framework for resolving disputes about fundamental logical laws. Of course, not all philosophers who have considered the matter are agreed even upon that. How often do philosophers agree about anything?
This lack of agreement may not be surprising, but one of Dummett's early ambitions was to show how philosophers could achieve agreement. His claim was that, once the contributions of Frege are fully appreciated, it would be possible to formulate a method for achieving generally agreed resolutions to problems concerning theories of meaning, and that such work should be viewed as providing the foundations for all future work in philosophy.
He himself pointed out that the similar claims have been made for the work of Husserl, Kant, Spinoza and Descartes, to name but a few, and that, in each case, such claims proved false:
[B]y far the safest bet would be that I am suffering from a similar illusion in making this claim about Frege. To this, I can offer only the banal reply which any prophet has to make to any sceptic: time will tell. (Dummett, 1978, 458)
It may be too early to judge, but so far the passage of time has favored the skeptics rather than the prophet; there does not seem to be a general consensus about how to resolve disputes in philosophy of language, even among analytical philosophers. However, one does not have to agree with Dummett to appreciate that his work is important. His historical work has been devoted towards formulating the basic premises that underlie much contemporary philosophy, including his own. In so doing, he has provided a useful service for critics; those who find themselves out of sympathy with analytical philosophy at least know where to direct their attacks. One does not have to find Dummett's challenge to classical logic successful to accept that it is worth taking seriously.
It is widely acknowledged that Dummett's work is not easy to read. His work has been influential despite this. Indeed, his influence may be attributed, in part, to some of those factors that make his work hard to read, such as his refusal to accept superficial solutions, and his skill in unearthing hidden complexities. These features make for work that is daunting to beginners, but rewarding for experts. To read Dummett's work is to be reminded continuously that anyone who is serious about wanting to discover the answers to deep philosophical questions must be prepared to work very hard. That is a lesson well worth learning.
Works by Dummett in English
A complete bibliography of Dummett’s writings may be found in Randall E. Auxier and Lewis Edwin Hahn (eds.) The Philosophy of Michael Dummett: The Library of Living Philosophers, Volume XXXI (Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 2007)
Books about Dummett
Other Works Cited
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