Émile Durkheim was a French sociologist who rose to prominence in the late 19th and early 20th centuries. Along with Karl Marx and Max Weber, he is credited as being one of the principal founders of modern sociology. Chief among his claims is that society is a sui generis reality, or a reality unique to itself and irreducible to its composing parts. It is created when individual consciences interact and fuse together to create a synthetic reality that is completely new and greater than the sum of its parts. This reality can only be understood in sociological terms, and cannot be reduced to biological or psychological explanations. The fact that social life has this quality would form the foundation of another of Durkheim’s claims, that human societies could be studied scientifically. For this purpose he developed a new methodology, which focuses on what Durkheim calls “social facts,” or elements of collective life that exist independently of and are able to exert an influence on the individual.
Using this method, Durkheim published influential works on a number of topics. In these works he analyzes different social institutions and the roles they play in society, and as a result his work is often associated with the theoretical framework of structural functionalism. Durkheim is most well known as the author of On the Division of Social Labor, The Rules of Sociological Method, Suicide, and The Elementary Forms of Religious Life. However, Durkheim also published a voluminous number of articles and reviews, and has had several of his lecture courses published posthumously.
When Durkheim began writing, sociology was not recognized as an independent field of study. As part of the campaign to change this he went to great lengths to separate sociology from all other disciplines, especially philosophy. In consequence, while Durkheim’s influence in the social sciences has been extensive, his relationship with philosophy remains ambiguous. Nevertheless, Durkheim maintained that sociology and philosophy are in many ways complementary, going so far as to say that sociology has an advantage over philosophy, since his sociological method provides the means to study philosophical questions empirically, rather than metaphysically or theoretically. As a result, Durkheim often used sociology to approach topics that have traditionally been reserved for philosophical investigation.
For the purposes of this article, Durkheim’s strictly sociological thought will be set aside to allow his contributions to philosophy to take prominence. These fall largely in the realms of the philosophy of religion, social theory, hermeneutics, the philosophy of language, morality, meta-ethics, and epistemology. Durkheim’s deconstruction of the self, as well as his analysis of the crisis brought on by modernity and his projections about the future of Western civilization, also deserve significant consideration.
David Émile Durkheim was born in April 1858 in Épinal, located in the Lorraine region of France. His family was devoutly Jewish, and his father, grandfather, and great grandfather were all rabbis. Durkheim, however, broke with tradition and went to the École normale supérieure in 1879, where he studied philosophy. He graduated in 1882 and began teaching the subject in France. In 1887 he was appointed to teach Social Sciences and Pedagogy at the University of Bordeaux, allowing him to teach the first ever official sociology courses in France. Also in 1887, Durkheim married Louise Dreyfus, with whom he would eventually have two children. During his time at Bordeaux, Durkheim had great success, publishing his doctoral thesis On the Division of Social Labor (1893, Division), The Rules of Sociological Method (1895, Rules), and Suicide: A Study in Sociology (1897, Suicide). Also, in 1896 he established the prestigious Année sociologique, further cementing sociology’s place in the academic world.
In 1902, Durkheim was finally given a promotion in the form of the chair of the Science of Education at the Sorbonne. In 1906 he became a full professor and in 1913, his position was changed to formally include sociology. Henceforth he was chair of the Science of Education and Sociology. Here he gave lectures on a number of subjects and published a number of important essays as well as his final, and most important, major work The Elementary Forms of Religious Life (1912, Forms). The outbreak of World War I would prove to have disastrous consequences for Durkheim. The war took many of his most promising pupils and in 1915 his son, André, also died in combat. From this Durkheim would never recover and in November 1917 he died of a stroke, leaving his last great work, La Morale (Morality), with only a preliminary introduction.
During his lifetime, Durkheim was politically engaged, yet kept these engagements rather discrete. He defended Alfred Dreyfus during the Dreyfus affair and was a founding member of the Human Rights League. Durkheim was familiar with Karl Marx’s ideas. Yet, Durkheim was very critical of Marx’s work, which he saw as unscientific and dogmatic, as well as of Marxism, which he saw as needlessly conflictual, reactionary, and violent. Nevertheless, he supported a number of socialist reforms, and had a number of important socialist friends, but never committed himself to the party and did not make political issues a primary concern. Despite his muted political engagement, Durkheim was an ardent patriot of France. He hoped to use his sociology as a way to help a French society suffering under the strains of modernity, and during World War I he took up a position writing anti-German propaganda pamphlets, which in part use his sociological theories to help explain the fervent nationalism found in Germany.
Durkheim was not the first thinker to attempt to make sociology a science. Auguste Comte, who wished to extend the scientific method to the social sciences, and Herbert Spencer, who developed an evolutionary utilitarian approach that he applied to different areas in the social sciences, made notable attempts and their work had a formative influence on Durkheim. In particular, Durkheim appropriated elements of Comte’s positivism as well as elements of his scientific approach to studying societies. Durkheim’s analysis of the ways in which different parts of society operate to create a functioning whole, as well as his use of the organic analogy, was in many ways inspired by Spencer’s own brand of functionalist analysis. However, Durkheim was critical of these attempts at sociology and felt that neither had sufficiently divorced their analyses from metaphysical assumptions. These were to be found particularly in what Durkheim considered Comte and Spencer’s unilinear models of social development, which were based on a priori laws of social evolution. While Durkheim incorporated elements of evolutionary theory into his own, he did so in a critical way, and was not interested in developing a grand theory of society as much as developing a perspective and a method that could be applied in diverse ways. The sociological method that Durkheim devised, thus, sought to be free of the metaphysical positivism of Comte and Spencer and differed greatly from Comte’s mere extension of the scientific method of the natural sciences to society.
Several of Durkheim’s teachers at the École normale supérieure would also have an important impact on his thinking. With Emile Boutroux, Durkheim read Comte and got the idea that sociology could have its own unique subject matter that was not reducible to any other field of study. Gabriel Monod and Numa Denis Fustel de Coulanges, both historians, introduced Durkheim to systematic empirical and comparative methods that could be applied to history and the social sciences. Charles Renouvier, a neo-Kantian philosopher, also had a large impact on Durkheim. Renouvier was an adamant rationalist and likely played a fundamental role in shaping Durkheim’s interpretation of Kant, specifically Durkheim’s understanding of the categories, an understanding that some observers have called into question. Renouvier was also preoccupied with a number of ideas that would appear in Durkheim’s thinking, including the scientific study of morality or social cohesion and the relation of the individual to society.
Between 1885 and 1886, Durkheim spent an academic year visiting universities in Germany. What Durkheim found there impressed him deeply. He encountered German scholars such as Alfred Wagner, Gustav Schmoller, Rudolph von Jhering, Albert Schäffle, and Wilhelm Wundt who were working on scientific approaches to the study of ethics. Importantly these scholars were relating morality to other social institutions such as economics or the law, and in the process were emphasizing the social nature of morality. Arguably the most important of these thinkers for Durkheim was Wundt, who rejected methodological individualism and argued that morality was a sui generis social phenomenon that could not be reduced to individuals acting in isolation. Taken together, these thinkers laid the foundations for Durkheim’s social realism and provided a powerful critique to utilitarian conceptions of morality, epitomized by Spencer, which viewed the origin of morality within the rational, self-interested calculations of the individual.
Throughout Durkheim’s life, other notable thinkers would have a prominent impact on him. Early in his career Durkheim wrote dissertations about Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Montesquieu, both of whom he cited as precursors to sociology. In 1895 Durkheim’s thinking about society changed dramatically after he read William Robertson Smith’s Lectures on the Religion of the Semites. Before this time, as in Division, Durkheim focused on how the material and morphological elements of a society affected it. After reading Smith’s book, Durkheim began to concentrate on the more ideational elements of society, with an increasing focus on the role of religion in social life. Different philosophers are also prominent in Durkheim’s discussions. The most important of these, arguably, is Kant, whose moral and epistemological theories were of great influence. However Plato, William James, and Descartes, among others, are all present in Durkheim’s work and influenced him in substantial ways.
Durkheim remains a fundamental and prominent figure for sociology and social theory in general. Yet, in comparison with Marx and Weber, the influence of Durkheim’s thought has been somewhat muted, especially with regards to philosophy. This can be partly explained by the fact that the Durkheimian school of thought was greatly reduced when many of his most promising students were killed in WWI, that Durkheim went to such great lengths to divorce sociology from philosophy, or by the fact that his thought has been, and continues to be, simplified and misunderstood.
Nevertheless, his ideas had, and continue to have, a strong impact in the social sciences, especially in sociology and anthropology. Members of his research group, such as Marcel Mauss, Paul Fauconnet, Célestin Bouglé, and Lucien Lévy-Bruhl, and later thinkers, such as Maurice Halbwachs, Talcott Parsons, Alfred Radcliffe-Brown, and Claude Levi-Strauss, were all strongly influenced by him. Philosophers such as Henri Bergeson and Emmanuel Levinas acknowledge the influence of Durkheim’s ideas, and his work is also present in that of Jacques Lacan and Maurice Merleau-Ponty. In addition to this, Durkheim’s ideas are latent in the structuralist thought that emerged in post WWII France, for example in Alain Badiou, Louis Althusser, and Michel Foucault. However, these thinkers never discuss Durkheim at length, or acknowledge any intellectual debt to to him. More recently, social theorists such as Pierre Bourdieu, Robert Bellah, and Steven Lukes, and philosophers such as Charles Taylor and Hans Joas, have been influenced by Durkheim’s thinking.
According to Durkheim, all elements of society, including morality and religion, are products of history. As they do not have a transcendent origin and are part of the natural world, they can be studied scientifically. In particular, Durkheim viewed his sociology as the science of the genesis and functioning of institutions, with institutions being all of the beliefs and modes of conduct instituted by the collectivity. A fundamental element of this science is the sociological method, which Durkheim created specifically for this purpose.
The foundational claim for Durkheim’s sociology, and what is to make up the subject matter for sociology, is the existence of what Durkheim calls social facts. A social fact, as defined in Rules, is “a category of facts which present very special characteristics: they consist of manners of acting, thinking, and feeling external to the individual, which are invested with a coercive power by virtue of which they exercise control over him.” (Durkheim; 1982: 52) According to Durkheim, social facts have an objective reality that sociologists can study in a way similar to how other scientists, such as physicists, study the physical world. An important corollary to the above definition is that social facts are also internal to individuals, and it is only through individuals that social facts are able to exist. In this sense, externality means interior to individuals other than the individual subject. This leads to the seemingly paradoxical statement that social facts are both external and internal to the individual, a claim that has frequently been misunderstood and left Durkheim’s work open to criticism.
In order to fully grasp how social facts are created and operate, it must be understood that for Durkheim, a society is not merely a group of individuals living in one particular geographical location. Rather, society is an ensemble of ideas, beliefs, and sentiments of all sorts that are realized through individuals; it indicates a reality that is produced when individuals interact with one another, resulting in the fusion of individual consciences. It is a sui generis reality, meaning that it is irreducible to its composing parts and unable to be explained by any means other than those proper to it. In other words, society is greater than the sum of its parts; it supercedes in complexity, depth, and richness, the existence of any one particular individual and is wholly new and different from the parts that make it up. This psychic reality is sometimes (although especially in Division) referred to by Durkheim with the term conscience collective, which can alternately be translated into English as collective conscience or collective consciousness. What is more, society and social phenomena can only be explained in sociological terms, as the fusion of individual consciences that, once created, follows its own laws. It cannot be explained, for example, in biological or psychological terms, or be reduced to the material forms of a society and its immediate vital necessities, as is the case in historical materialism. Social facts are key, since they are what constitute and express the psychic reality that is society. Through them individuals acquire particular traits, such as a language, a monetary system, values, religious beliefs, tendencies for suicide, or technologies, that they would never have had living in total isolation.
In Rules, Durkheim delineates two different classes of social facts. The first class concerns social facts of a physiological, or operative, order. This set of social facts includes a society’s legal code, religious beliefs, concept of beauty, monetary system, ways of dressing, or its language. In these cases it is easy to see how society imposes itself onto the individual from the outside. The first class of social facts also contains currents of opinion, or social phenomena that express themselves through individual cases. Examples include rates of marriage, birth, suicide or migration patterns. In these cases, the operation of society on the individual is not so obvious. Nevertheless, these phenomena can be studied with the use of statistics, which accumulate individual cases into an aggregate and express a certain state of the collective mind. The second class of social facts is of a morphological, or structural, order. It is often concerned with the demographic and material conditions of life and includes the number, nature, and relation of the composing parts of a society, their geographical distribution, the extent and nature of their channels of communication, the shape and style of their buildings, and so forth. While at first glance it might not be evident how the second class of social facts is influenced by collective ways of thinking, acting, or feeling, they indeed have the same characteristics and the same elements of externality and constraint as the first class. In the end, Durkheim dismisses the distinction altogether, claiming that the second class of social facts are simply more crystalized forms of the first class of social facts, making the term ‘social fact’ a very flexible concept that comprises basically any and all social phenomena.
Durkheim then provides a set of rules for studying social facts. The first and most important rule is to treat social facts as things. What Durkheim means by this is that social facts have an existence independent of the knowing subject and that they impose themselves on the observer. Social facts can be recognized by the sign that they resist the action of individual will upon them; as products of the collectivity, changing social facts require laborious effort. The next rule for studying social facts is that the sociologist must clearly delimit and define the group of phenomena being researched. This structures the research and provides the object of study a condition of verifiability. The sociologist must also strive to be as objective towards the facts they are working on as possible and remove any subjective bias or attachment to what they are investigating. Finally, the sociologist must systematically discard any and all preconceptions and closely examine the facts before saying anything about them.
Durkheim applied these rules to empirical evidence he drew primarily from statistics, ethnography, and history. Durkheim treated this data in a rational way, which is to say that he applied the law of causality to it. At this, Durkheim introduced an important rationalist component to his sociological method, namely the idea that by using his rules, which work to eliminate subjective bias, human behavior can be explained through observable cause and effect relationships. Accordingly, he often used a comparative-historical approach, which he saw as the core of the sociological method, to eliminate extraneous causes and find commonalities between different societies and their social facts. In so doing, he strove to find general laws that were universally applicable. Durkheim also argued that contemporary social facts could only be understood in relation to the social facts preceding and causing them. Accordingly, Durkheim followed the historical development of political, educational, religious, economic, and moral institutions, particularly those of Western society, and explicitly made a strict difference between historical analysis and sociology: whereas the historical method strives only to describe what happened in the past, sociology strives to explain the past. In other words, sociology searches for the causes and functions of social facts as they change over time.
In the early part of his career, Durkheim focused on the second class of social facts, or the structural organization of society. Later, social facts of the first class, such as suicide rates, religion, morality, or language became his primary topics of interest. As Durkheim’s interests shifted, his notion of coercion also changed, as did his use of the word ‘constraint’. In his later works, Durkheim focused more on questions of a normative nature, or how individuals come to think and act in similar ways, and less on actual physical or legal constraints. Here society still imposes itself onto the individual, but social facts are seen in a more positive light, as the enablers of human activity or as sources of strength for the individual. As time wore on Durkheim eventually ceased using the word constraint altogether.
An important, and often misunderstood, element of Durkheim’s sociological method is to be found in what can be termed Durkheim’s social realism, or the idea that society is an objectively real entity that exists independently and autonomously of any particular individual, a view that is epitomized by his prescription to treat social facts as things. Within this realist position there are two important claims. First, Durkheim makes an ontological claim concerning the sui generis reality of social facts. Second, Durkheim makes an epistemological and methodological claim, arguing that social facts should be treated as real objects, existing external to the researcher’s mind, that can be determined by their ability to coerce behavior. Hence, Durkheim is arguing that social facts have particular properties of being and that they can be discovered and analyzed when the sociologist treats them in the proper, scientific way.
These elements of Durkheim’s sociology have led to some confusion. Some critics claim that Durkheim is guilty of saying that social facts exist independent and outside of all individuals, which leads them to think that Durkheim hypostatizes some sort of metaphysical “group mind.” Other critics argue that Durkheim is guilty of an ontologism or a realism in which he considers social facts to be material properties of social life.
Durkheim strongly refuted such accusations. In response to the first critique, it must be remembered that social facts are both exterior and interior to individuals, with externality in this case meaning interior to individuals other than the individual subject. To say that social facts exist independent of all individuals is an absurd position that Durkheim does not advocate. Only on a methodological level, in order to study social facts from the outside as they present themselves to individuals, does the sociologist abstract social facts from the individual consciences in which they are present. In response to the second critique, Durkheim maintains that social facts, as manifestations of a psychic, or ideational, reality, do not have a material substratum. They can only be observed through the more or less systematized phenomenal reality (to be analyzed as empirical data) that expresses them. By stating the reality of the ideational realm of social facts in this way, Durkheim’s social realism can be seen as an attempt to bridge diverging schools of philosophical thought, such as realism and nominalism, or empiricism and idealism.
Durkheim was one of the first thinkers in the Western tradition to examine how an individual’s social milieu affects the way that individual perceives the world. His most definitive statement on the subject can be found in Forms, a book dedicated not only to studying religion, but also to understanding how logical thought arises out of society. Other works, such as Pragmatism and Sociology, a posthumous lecture series given late in his life, elaborate his views. His sociology of knowledge argues that many, if not all, facets of an individual’s thought and conception of the world are influenced by society. Not only are our common beliefs, ideas, and language determined by our social milieu, but even the concepts and categories necessary for logical thought, such as time, space, causality, and number, have their source in society (with the latter claim Durkheim challenges the entire philosophical tradition going back to Aristotle). This logical structure helps to order and interpret the world, ensuring that individuals have a more or less homogenous understanding of the world and how it operates, without which human society would not be possible. And since every society has had some form of logical system to guide its understanding of things, it follows that there has never been a society that is pre-logical or one that has lived in disorder or chaos. To begin to understand Durkheim’s analysis, a fundamental concept of his sociology of knowledge, représentations collectives, needs to be discussed.
According to Durkheim, no knowledge of the world is possible without humanity in some way representing it. Furthermore, Durkheim rejects the idea of the Ding an sich, or the transcendent thing in itself. This means that the world exists only as far as it is represented, and that all knowledge of the world necessarily refers back to how it is represented. Accordingly, the central part of Durkheim’s theory of knowledge is his concept of représentations collectives (this term could be translated into English as collective representations, although there is no English equivalent to Durkheim’s use of the French term représentation, which in his work can mean both a copy of something or an idea about something). Représentations collectives are the body of representations a society uses to represent to itself things in reality, as those things relate to and affect society. It is important to note that while représentations collectives refer to things in reality, they are not simple images that reflect reality as it is projected onto the intellect from the outside. Rather they are the result of an interaction between the external world and society; in being represented by society, things are infused with elements of a society’s collective experience, providing those things with a meaning and value. Représentations collectives are thus the repositories and transmitters of collective experience and thereby embody and express the reality of a society’s collective existence. Représentations collectives are of paramount importance to collective life, and it is no surprise that later in his career Durkheim dedicated so much time to their study. While représentations collectives can take on a diverse number of forms, including photographs, fables, myths, and especially religious imagery, Durkheim reserves special analysis to conceptual thought and language, which late in his life Durkheim saw as the primary enabler of all social life.
Durkheim’s analysis of language in many ways illustrates not only what he means by the term représentations collectives, but also how he sees society operating on a fundamental level. As Durkheim explains, words, or concepts, are unlike individual sensory representations, which are in a perpetual flux and unable to provide a stable and consistent form to thought. Concepts are impersonal, stand outside of time and becoming (le devenir), and the thought they engender is fixed and resists change. Consequently, language is also the realm through which the idea of truth is able to come into being, since through language individuals are able to conceive of a world of stable ideas that are common to different intelligences. Thus, language conforms to the two criteria for truth that Durkheim lays out, impersonality and stability. These two criteria are also precisely what allow for inter-subjective communication. Language is, therefore, obviously a sui generis product of social interaction; its necessity only becomes apparent when there are two or more individuals and language can only come into being through the fusion of individual consciences, with the result being completely new and different from and irreducible to the parts that make it up. As such, the concept is common to all, and is the work of the community. Language does not bear the imprint of any mind in particular, and is instead developed by society, that unique intelligence where all of the others come to meet and interact, contributing their ideas and sentiments to the social nexus. This is a claim of great hermeneutical intrigue, since the signification of any word is to be traced back to this potentially endless well of collective experience. Words are merely the way in which society, in its totality, represents to itself objects of experience. As such, language is also infused with the authority of society. With this, Durkheim makes a reference to Plato, saying that when confronted with this system of notions, the individual mind is in the same situation as the nous of Plato before the world of ideas. The individual is thereby compelled to assimilate the concepts and appropriate them as their own, if only so as to be able to communicate with other individuals.
Language, as a set of représentations collectives, also has a unique quality in that it plays an active role in structuring an individual’s perception of reality. As Durkheim argues, objects of experience do not exist independently of the society that perceives and represents them. They exist only through the relationship they have with society, a relationship that can reveal very different aspects about reality depending on the society. This is because contained within language is all of the wisdom and the science that the collectivity has learned over the centuries. Through language society is able to pass on to an individual a body of collective knowledge that is infinitely rich and greatly exceeds the limits individual experience. To think conceptually, thus, does not simply mean to see reality in a general way, it is to project a light onto reality, a light that penetrates, illuminates, and transforms reality. The way in which an individual, literally, sees the world, and the knowledge an individual comes to have about existence, therefore, is highly informed by the language that individual speaks.
Language is not the only facet of logical thought that society engenders; society also plays a large role in creating the categories of thought, such as time, space, number, causality, personality and so forth. In formulating his theory, Durkheim is especially critical of rationalists, such as Kant, who believe that the categories of human thought are universal, independent of environmental factors, and located within the mind a priori. The categories, such as time and space, are not vague and indeterminate, as Kant suggests. Rather, they have a definite form and specific qualities (such as minutes, weeks, months for time, or north, south, inches, kilometers for space). The characteristics of the categories, furthermore, vary from culture to culture, sometimes greatly, leading Durkheim to believe that they are of a social origin. Durkheim’s rejection of the rationalists, however, does not lead him to the opposing theoretical framework, that of the empiricists. Durkheim is also critical of this school of thought, which argues that an individual’s experience of the world gives rise to the categories. Durkheim argues that the categories share the same properties as concepts. Categories, like concepts, have the qualities of stability and impersonality, both of which are necessary conditions for the mutual understanding of two minds. Like concepts, then, categories have a necessarily social function and are the product of social interaction. Individuals could therefore never create the categories on their own. Durkheim believes that it is possible to overcome the opposition between rationalism and empiricism by accounting for reason without ignoring the world of observable empirical data. In order to do so, Durkheim treats the categories as représentations collectives, and studies them as such.
As Durkheim argues, the categories are the natural, sui generis result of the co-existence and interaction of individuals within a social framework. As représentations collectives created by society, the categories exist independently of the individual and impose themselves onto the individual’s mind, which would have no capacity for categorical thought otherwise. What is more, not only does society institute the categories in this way, but different aspects of the social being serve as the content of the categories. For example, the rhythm of social life serves as the base for the category of time, the spatial arrangement of the group serves as a base for the category of space, the social grouping of society (for example in clans or phratries) serves as a base for the category of class (as in the classification of items), and collective force is at the origin of the concept of an efficacious force, which was essential to the very first formulations of the category of causality. Another category of utmost importance is the category of totality, the notion of everything, which originates from the concept of the social group in total. The categories are not, of course, used only to relate to society. Rather, they extend and apply to the entire universe, helping individuals to explain rationally the world around them. As a result, the ways in which individuals understand the world through the categories can vary in important ways.
This element of Durkheim’s theory has a significant flaw, however. As Steven Lukes has pointed out, Durkheim does not distinguish between the faculties of categorical thinking, such as the faculty of temporality, and the content of these faculties, that is dividing time into set units of measurement. Instead, Durkheim views both the capacity and the content of categorical thought as stamped onto the individual mind by society at the same time. As such, Durkheim’s theory fails to account for the inherent abilities of categorical or logical thought. There may be different classifications within a society, for example, but in order for an individual to recognize these classifications in the first place, they must have prior possession of the ability to recognize classifications. Despite this flaw, an important element of Durkheim’s theory, the idea that the content of the categories is modeled on the organization of society and social life, has proven to be challenging and influential to later thinkers.
Another vital role that society plays in the construction of human knowledge is the fact that it actively organizes objects of experience into a coherent classificatory system that encompasses the entire universe. With these classificatory systems it becomes possible to attach things one to another and to establish relations between them. This allows us to see things as functions of each other, as if they were following an interior law that was founded in their nature and provides order to an otherwise chaotic world. What is more, Durkheim argues that it was through religion that the very first cosmologies, or classificatory systems of the universe, came into being, in the form of religious myth. Religion was thus the first place where humans could attempt to rationally explain and understand the world around them. As a result, Durkheim argues that the evolution of logic is strongly linked to the evolution of religion (though both ultimately depend upon social conditions). This leads to the claim that religion is at the origin of much, if not all, of human knowledge. This argument has a far reach, affecting even the way in which modern science views itself. Following Durkheim, while modern science might claim to have no kinship with religion and in fact claim to be opposed to religion, it is in effect through religion that the conceptual and logical thought necessary for scientific thinking originated and was first elaborated. This component of Durkheim’s sociology of knowledge has been highly provocative and influential both in sociology and beyond.
With such a theory of knowledge, Durkheim reveals himself to be a cultural relativist, arguing that each culture has a network of self-referential logic and concepts that creates truths that are legitimate and, while not necessarily grounded in the reality of the physical world, are grounded within the reality of their respective social framework. Truths of this nature Durkheim calls mythological truths. In opposition to this relativistic view of truth, however, Durkheim also defends scientific rationalism and the idea that there exist scientific truths that are not dependent on cultural context and that express reality “as it is.” These scientific truths, or scientific représentations, are subjected to stringent verification and methodological control, and while they express these truths through inadequate symbols and in an approximated way, they are more perfect and more reliable than other représentations collectives. Despite the fact that they are of a fundamentally different nature (expressing reality as it is and not the reality of society), scientific représentations operate in the same way and are just as instrumental to society as other représentations collectives. Scientific truths deal with the same subject matter as mythological truths (nature, man, society), and like other représentations collectives they serve to reinforce and unify the collective conscience around one idea. Scientific truths are also représentations to which society has added the knowledge it has accumulated historically through collaborative effort. Scientific représentations reflect collective experience and express the relationship a society has with the world around it. Thus, while, there are objective truths about the world to be discovered, it would be mistaken to think that reality exists independently, or is logically antecedent, of it being represented through society, since it is only through collective effort that these scientific truths are discovered, and thus come to being. Scientific truths, while of a special nature, are also in an important way bound by the limits of society.
In the end, Durkheim strives to account for a total sociology of knowledge. Society creates for itself, through its représentations collectives, a vast network of language and logical thought that is instrumental in allowing its individuals to understand and think the world. And, since the world exists only as far as it is thought, and since the world is totally thought only by society, the world takes its shape in society. In other words, society establishes, from the outset, the limits of possibility for rationality, linguistic expression, and knowledge in general.
During Durkheim’s life, his thinking about religion changed in important ways. Early in his life, as in Division, he argued that human societies could exist on a secular basis without religion. But later in his life he saw religion as a more and more fundamental element of social life. By the time he wrote Forms, Durkheim saw religion as a part of the human condition, and while the content of religion might be different from society to society over time, religion will, in some form or another, always be a part of social life. Durkheim also argues that religion is the most fundamental social institution, with almost all other social institutions, at some point in human history, being born from it. For these reasons he gave special analysis to this phenomenon, providing a philosophy of religion that is perhaps as provocative as it is rich with insights.
According to Durkheim, religion is the product of human activity, not divine intervention. He thus treats religion as a sui generis social fact and analyzes it sociologically. Durkheim elaborates his theory of religion at length in his most important work, Forms. In this book Durkheim, uses the ethnographic data that was available at the time to focus his analysis on the most primitive religion that, at the time, was known, the totemic religion of Australian aborigines. This was done for methodological purposes, since Durkheim wished to study the simplest form of religion possible, in which the essential elements of religious life would be easier to ascertain. In a certain sense, then, Durkheim is investigating the old question, albeit in a new way, of the origin of religion. It is important to note, however, that Durkheim is not searching for an absolute origin, or the radical instant where religion first came into being. Such an investigation would be impossible and prone to speculation. In this metaphysical sense of origin, religion, like every social institution, begins nowhere. Rather, as Durkheim says, he is investigating the social forces and causes that are always already present in a social milieu and that lead to the emergence of religious life and thought at different points in time, under different conditions.
Durkheim’s analysis is not without its detractors, who criticize among other things his methodology, his misinterpretation of ethnographic data, or his undermining of traditional religion. Nevertheless, his assertion that religion has an essentially social foundation, as well as other elements of his theory, have been reaffirmed and re-appropriated over the years by a number of different thinkers.
It is important to look at the starting point of Durkheim’s analysis, his definition of religion: “A religion is a unified system of beliefs and practices relative to sacred things, that is to say, things set apart and forbidden–beliefs and practices which unite in one single moral community called a Church, all those who adhere to them.” (Durkheim; 1995: 44) There are, thus, three fundamental elements to every religion: sacred objects, a set of beliefs and practices, and the existence of a moral community. Of the three, perhaps the most important would be the notion of the sacred, which is the point around which any religious system revolves. It is that which inspires great respect and admiration on the part of society and what is set apart and keeps us at a distance. Durkheim contrasts the sacred with the notion of profane, or that which desecrates the sacred and from which the sacred must be protected, making the opposition between sacred and profane a central element of Durkheim’s theory. With this definition Durkheim also puts an emphasis on the social element of religion. This is important because he spends a great deal of time in Forms arguing against theorists like Herbert Spencer, Edward Tylor, or James Frazer who locate the origin of religion in psychological phenomena such as dreams (the animistic view of Spencer) or natural phenomena, such as storms (the naturalistic view of the latter two). Durkheim argued that such an interpretation of phenomena was socially learned, and could only be the effect of an already established religion, not its cause. With this said, it is now time to examine how Durkheim believes a religion originates and operates.
According to Durkheim, a religion comes into being and is legitimated through moments of what he calls “collective effervescence.” Collective effervescence refers to moments in societal life when the group of individuals that makes up a society comes together in order to perform a religious ritual. During these moments, the group comes together and communicates in the same thought and participates in the same action, which serves to unify a group of individuals. When individuals come into close contact with one another and when they are assembled in such a fashion, a certain “electricity” is created and released, leading participants to a high degree of collective emotional excitement or delirium. This impersonal, extra-individual force, which is a core element of religion, transports the individuals into a new, ideal realm, lifts them up outside of themselves, and makes them feel as if they are in contact with an extraordinary energy.
The next step in the genesis of religion is the projecting of this collective energy onto an external symbol. As Durkheim argues, society can only become conscious of these forces circulating in the social world by representing them somehow. The power of religion must therefore be objectified, or somehow made visible, and the object onto which this force is projected becomes sacred. This sacred object receives the collective force and is thereby infused with the power of the community. It is in this way that a society gains a tangible idea, or representation, of itself. When discussing these matters, Durkheim is careful to use the word “sacred object” to describe what is traditionally understood in the West as a god. This is because sacred objects can be very diverse and do not necessarily refer to supernatural deities. For example, God is the sacred object for Christian societies, Thor was the sacred object for Viking society, but the four noble truths are also sacred objects for Buddhists, and, as we will see, the individual person has become the sacred object for modern, Western society. Physical objects, such as rocks, feathers, totem polls, crosses, and so forth, can also become infused with the force of the collectivity, thereby becoming sacred and serving as a physical reminder of society’s presence. Such views on religion allow Durkheim to make the radical claim that a society’s sacred object is nothing but the collective forces of the group hypostatized. Religion is society worshipping itself, and through religion, individuals represent to themselves society and their relationship to it.
With this, Durkheim lays bare the inner workings of a society’s symbolic network. With Durkheim’s rejection of the thing in itself, the meaning and value of an object are not intrinsic to it, but are to be found in that object’s relationship to society. Said otherwise, an object’s status is determined by the meaning that society attributes to it, or as its status as a représentation collective. Importantly, this analysis goes beyond what is strictly considered the religious realm, since all socially derived meaning operates in the same way. For example, a stamp, a flag, or the sport of football are by themselves just a piece of paper, a piece of cloth, or a group of padded men chasing a leather ball; they are all essentially worthless and derive their value from the reality of collective forces they represent and embody. The more important a society determines an object to be, the more valuable it will be in the eyes of an individual.
If these moments of collective effervescence are the origin of religious feelings, religious rituals must be repeated in order to reaffirm the collective unity of a society, otherwise its existence is at risk. Durkheim remarks that if the societal forces central to the religious life of a society are not re-animated, they will be forgotten, leaving individuals with no knowledge of the ties that exist between them and no concept of the society to which they belong. This is why religious ritual is necessary for the continued existence of a society; religion cannot exist through belief alone-it periodically needs the reality of the force behind the belief to be regenerated. This takes place through various religious rituals, in which collective beliefs are reaffirmed and the individual expresses their solidarity with the sacred object of society, or with society itself. The form the specific ritual takes can vary greatly, from funerals to rain dances to patriotic national holidays, but its goal is always the same. Through these rituals, society maintains its existence and integrates individuals into the social fold, exerting pressure on them to act and think alike.
Of great significance to Durkheim’s theory is his insistence on the reality of these religious phenomena. As he argues, the social forces that animate a society’s religious life are real, and are really felt by the participants. While it is a mistake for an individual to believe that this power emanates directly from the sacred object, or is somehow intrinsic to the sacred object, behind the symbol manifesting the force is a living and concrete reality. Consequently, all religions are true, at least symbolically, for they express a power that does exist, the power of society. Religion, religious belief, and the religious experience cannot, therefore, be dismissed as mere fantasies or illusions.
Durkheim’s moral philosophy was unfortunately denied its culmination by his untimely death in 1917. His writings on the subject, therefore, lack the consistency he would have liked to give them. Nevertheless, he did publish several important articles, most notably his Determination of a Moral Fact (1906), and gave lectures on the subject, including the posthumously published Moral Education, from which his views on morality can be deciphered.
Durkheim’s moral theory is unique in that he rejects theorists who rely on a priori moral concepts or abstract logical reasoning to construct ethical systems. Rather, Durkheim treats moral phenomena as conditioned both socially and historically. Each society creates over time its own set of moral rules, which can vary dramatically from one society to the next, with each society creating for itself moral principles that are more or less adequate to its existential needs. When analyzing moral phenomena, the moral philosopher must take into consideration the socio-historical context of the moral system they are operating in and make moral prescriptions accordingly, or risk doing great harm to that society. However, that there exists no universal morality for humanity in no way abnegates the validity of any moral system and does not open the door to moral nihilism. On the contrary, moral rules are rooted in the sui generis reality of society that the individual cannot deny; morality is a social fact and should be studied as such. This approach to morality would form the basis of what Durkheim considers a physique des moeurs, or a physics of morality, a new, empirical, rational science of morality. Yet, what exactly does Durkheim understand morality to be? And how does it operate in a society?
While Durkheim’s understanding of morality can at times be vague and lead to several interpretations, he most often understands morality as a system of rules and maxims that prescribes to individuals’ ways of behaving in different situations. Contained within this moral system is a set of moral values, beliefs, and ideas that provide a framework for the rules. Morality is also a wholly social phenomenon, with morality not existing outside of the limits of society. As Durkheim claims, morality begins only when an individual pertains to a group.
Moral rules have several unique characteristics that separate them from other rules that might be found in society. These special features lie in morality’s obligatory nature and in its desirability. According to Durkheim, at the heart of morality is a central moral authority that commands to its adherents its moral precepts. Through this central authority the individual feels an external constraint to conform to a society’s moral code. Obligation is thus a fundamental element of morality. This aspect of morality corresponds closely to the Kantian notion of duty, whose influence Durkheim openly acknowledges. However, Durkheim was critical of the Kantian notion of duty, since he felt that the repressive notion of duty was lacking a positive counterweight. For Durkheim, such a counterweight is found in the desirability of morality, which is equally important and necessary for the existence of morality. What Durkheim means with the desirability of morality is that the individual views the authority dictating to them their obligations as a higher power that is worthy of their respect and devotion. When an individual performs their duty, they feel as if they are working towards some sort of higher end, which Durkheim equates to the good (le bien). As a result, the individual willingly accepts the obligatory nature of moral rules and views them beneficially.
Within this dual obligatory-desirability element of morality, Durkheim views to a large extent the influence of religion. According to Durkheim morality and religion are intimately linked, and goes so far as to say that the moral life and the religion of a society are intimately intertwined. Wherever one finds a religion, one will find with it an accompanying moral doctrine and moral ideals that are commanded to believers. Moral authority is, thus, born out of religious life and draws its authority from the power of religion, which, as seen in the section above, is merely society’s collective force hypostatized and made visible. Religious imagery therefore takes on a moral tone and can be an important physical source of moral authority in a society. It is not surprising to Durkheim then that religious imagery inspires the same emotions of fear, obedience, and respect that an individual feels in the face of moral imperatives. In this way, moral authority is constituted by a force that is greater than the individual, outside of the individual, but also a force that penetrates the individual and shapes their personality.
At this, Durkheim was keen to distinguish two elements of morality, both equally important to moral behavior. On the one hand, there is the morality of the group, which exists objectively and outside of the individual. On the other hand there is the individual’s way of representing this morality. Indeed, there are moral rules created by society that exert a pressure on the individual, but each individual expresses the morality of their society in their own way. It is impossible for any individual to exactly translate the moral conscience of society, which means that even where moral conformity is the most complete, the individual still retains an individual moral conscience and has a hand in adding elements of their personality to society’s moral codes. This allows the individual to create, at least in part, their own morality. In this way, morality has both an extra-individual element and an individual element, as is the case with all other social facts.
Yet, one is inclined to ask, is the individual free to critique moral rules? Can morality not be changed? Is there any space for individual autonomy in this matter? According to Durkheim, moral rules do not need to be blindly followed by individuals. If the individual finds reason to object, critique, or rebel against the moral principles of society, not only is this possible, but it is perhaps even beneficial to society. For example, it is possible that changes take place within a society that can either cause a moral principle to be forgotten, or produce a schism between a traditional moral system and new moral sentiments that have not yet been recognized by the collective conscience. When this happens, an individual is correct to show the relevance of the forgotten moral principle or to illuminate what these new moral sentiments are exactly (as an example of the latter case Durkheim points to Socrates). For these purposes, the physique des moeurs can be very helpful. Thus, an individual is able to experiment with different moral claims, but only granted that these moral claims reflect that actual moral state, or states, of society (the individual is of course free to completely reject society, but this would only confirm the existence of the moral rules being rejected and potentially cause harm to the individual). This last caveat demonstrates that even when the individual acts in an autonomous way, they are, morally speaking, still bound by the limits of society.
One of the most prominent and problematic interpretations of Durkheim’s thought is the misconception that he does not have a theory of social change. On the contrary, social change is a primary focus in much of Durkheim’s thought. In particular, Durkheim focuses on Europe’s difficult transition from a medieval society to a modern one. Thus, Durkheim’s structural analyses of social institutions are complemented in important ways by analyses of the dynamic nature of these phenomena.
Durkheim’s theory of social change is largely elaborated in Division. In this book Durkheim argues that social change is a mechanical process, meaning that it is not directed in any intentional way. It is spurred above all by changes in the ways that people interact with each other, which in turn depend upon the demographic and material conditions of a society. The two main factors affecting social interaction are increases in population density and advances in technology, most notably in the fields of communication and transportation. This is because population growth and technology advances increase social connectivity, leading to interactions that differ in quantity, intimacy, frequency, type, and content. Cities, the locus of social change, also emerge and grow as a result of changes in population and technology. The rate at which individuals come into contact and interact with one another is what Durkheim calls moral or dynamic density.
The most important change to take place as a result of increased moral density occurs on a structural level and is what Durkheim calls the division of labor. At their beginning, societies are characterized by what Durkheim calls mechanical solidarity. In mechanical solidarity, groups are small, individuals in the group resemble each other, and their individual conscience is more or less synonymous with and dependent on the collective conscience. There is little to no individual volition and individuals belong to the group. The individual and individuality as we understand them do not exist. As the moral density increases, this changes. Appealing to Darwin’s evolutionary theory that the more alike two organisms are the greater the combat for the resources will be, Durkheim argues that with an increase in moral density comes greater competition for fewer resources. In order to mitigate the competition and make social life harmonious, individuals in a society will specialize their tasks and pursue different means to make a living. The more a society grows in moral density, the more the labor of a society will divide and the more specialized the tasks of its individuals will become. This leads to what Durkheim calls organic solidarity, or solidarity based not upon individual resemblances, but upon the functional interdependence of society’s individual parts, much the way the organs of a body are interdependent. In this way, Durkheim argues, modern societies will retain their cohesion. Concerning the specific impacts of the division of labor, Durkheim concentrates his analysis on Europe.
One of the most important effects of the division of labor is the rise of individualism and the importance of the individual within a society. In order for the specialization of tasks to take place, the individual must be given more freedom to develop their work. As the specialization increases, the autonomy of the individual will also increase, since the rest of society will be less and less capable of telling the individual how to do the work. In this way, the individual feels in a real way less acted upon by society. As a result of these divisions in society, there will also be fewer and fewer collective experiences shared by all members of the group, leading further to different points of view and a greater diversity among individuals and within the collective conscience. The division of labor thus has the important effect of individuating the population and creating differences between individuals in a society. The creation of the individual through this process is perhaps the defining characteristic of modernity.
It is worth noting here Durkheim’s opposition to social contract theorists and utilitarians, like Spencer, who argue that society begins when individuals come together to form groups. In many ways his book Division is a refutation of this theory and strives to show that collective life is not born from the individual, but, rather, that the individual is born out of collective life.
The division of labor also had major impacts within the economic and social realms, as evidenced by the historical development of Europe. In medieval society, there were well-defined social institutions in the realms of religion, politics, and education that were each distinct from one another. The organization of the economic sector was especially important, with guilds developing into strong, independent institutions that were at the heart of social life. These institutions regulated prices and production and maintained good relations between members of the same craft. These institutions and structures of society ensured that individuals were integrated into the social fold properly, promoting social solidarity. In the 18th and 19th centuries, however, a large growth in population was coupled with a large demographic shift, which was aided by technological innovation (such as the railroad, the steamship, and various manufacturing techniques). Without the previous restrictions on mobility or production capabilities, cities grew greatly in size, production of goods centralized, and the economic and social equilibrium that existed in the medieval period was ruptured. The ever-greater mobility of goods and people extended the reach of economic, political, and social institutions. As a result the guild system disappeared and regional trading interdependence gave way to international interdependence. Large-scale institutions in politics, education, medicine, shipping, manufacturing, arts, banking and so forth that were free from regional limitations developed and extended their influence to greater portions of society.
In essence, Durkheim is describing the birth of the modern industrial state. The concentration of the population and the centralization of the means of production created an enormous shift in the way of life for large parts of European society. It also changed the way that people related to one another. City life was characterized by fewer and weaker intimate relationships, greater anonymity, but also greater personal freedoms. Factory life was also different from the guild system, as workers were separated from their family for greater parts of the day, there was greater stress on workers’ nervous systems, and workers worked on assembly lines that regimented and mechanized their movements. Under these circumstances, the way of life that corresponded to medieval society no longer corresponded to the way of life in the modern industrial world. It was impossible for new generations to live in the same ways as their predecessors and European society witnessed a weakening of all its previous traditions, particularly its religious traditions.
“The old gods are aging or are already dead, and others are not yet born.” [Durkheim; 2005 (1912): 610-611]
An incredibly important but often overlooked part of Durkheim’s philosophy is his declaration of the death of the gods of European society, and what this means for the future of Western civilization. Durkheim’s declaration, however, should not be confused with Friedrich Nietzsche’s famous “death of God.” While Durkheim was familiar with some of Nietzsche’s work and favorable points of comparison between the two could be made on the subject, Durkheim does not appear to have been influenced by Nietzsche in this respect. Rather, Durkheim’s declaration of the death of the gods is closely linked to his analysis of the social disintegration of European society brought about by modernity, a subject that he comes back to throughout the entirety of his career, from Division to Forms. Yet how is one to understand this statement? What does this mean for European society?
There are two parts to Durkheim’s declaration that need to be de-compacted. On the one hand the old gods are dead. Because of the massive transformations taking place, European society became profoundly de-structured. The institutions animating medieval life disappeared. As a result, individuals were having a hard time finding meaningful attachments to social groups and society as a whole lost its former unity and cohesiveness. Not only this, but the transformations that led to modernity also rendered former beliefs and practices irrelevant. The big things of the past, the political, economic, social, and especially religious institutions, no longer inspired the enthusiasm they once did. With former ways of life no longer relevant and society no longer cohesive, the collective force so vital for the life of a society was no longer generated. This would have an important impact on the religion of medieval society, Christianity. Because society no longer had the means to create the collective force that exists behind God, belief in God weakened substantially. Christian society was no longer sufficiently present to the individual for faith in God to be maintained; the individual no longer felt, literally, the presence of God in their lives. With the lack of faith in God also came a rejection of other elements of Christian doctrine, such as Christian morality and Christian metaphysics, which were beginning to be replaced respectively by modern notions of justice and modern science. In sum, the social milieu that supported Christianity disappeared, leaving Christian faith, values, and thinking without any social foundations to give them life.
That Christianity faded away in European society is not a problem in itself, for it merely reflects a natural course of development a society may take. The problem arises when taking into consideration the second element to Durkheim’s phrase: no new gods have been created to replace the old ones. For Durkheim, the changes in European society were taking place too quickly and no new institutions had been able to form in the absence of the old ones. European society had not yet been able to create a religion to replace Christianity. Instead what Durkheim saw in Europe was a society in a state of disaggregation characterized by a lack of cohesion, unity, and solidarity. Individuals in such a society have no bonds between them and interact in a way similar to molecules of water, without any central force that is able to organize them and give them shape. European society had become nothing but a pile of sand that the slightest wind would succeed at dispersing. In other words, European society was no longer a society in Durkheim’s sense of the word, and as such was open to a number of further problems.
To begin, such a society is incapable of generating social forces that act on the individual. It is unable to create an authority that exerts pressure on individuals to act and think in a similar manner. Without these forces acting on the individual from the outside, individuals are dispersed from their commitment to society and left to their own. Duties are no longer accepted carte blanche and moral rules no longer seem binding. As such, individuals increasingly are detached from group obligation and act out of self-interest. These are the two conditions that Durkheim believes characterize the moral situation of modern European society: rampant individualism and weak morality. Durkheim’s term for this “froid moral” in which morality breaks down is anomie, a state of deregulation, in which the traditional rules have lost their authority.
A second problem stemming from the fact that society is no longer present to individuals is a higher suicide rate, specifically with two types of suicide that Durkheim identifies in Suicide. The first is egoistic suicide, in which an individual no longer see a purpose to life and sees life as meaningless. These feelings arise because the bonds integrating the individual to society have weakened or been broken. This problem involves society because society is an important source of meaning and direction for individuals, giving them goals to pursue and norms to guide them. The second type of suicide is anomic suicide, which involves what Durkheim calls a “mal d’infini.” Normally society, with the help of its moral code, plays an important part in defining what are legitimate aspirations in life, as concerns wealth, material goods, or any other type of pleasure. Without limits set on these desires, the passions are unregulated, and the individual’s expectations do not correspond with reality. Consequently the individual is perpetually unhappy. Both types of suicide result from a weakness of social solidarity and an inability for society to adequately integrate its individuals.
A final consequence is that society has no central measure for truth and no authoritative way of organizing or understanding the world. In such a state, there arises the potential for conflict between individuals or groups who have different ways of understanding the world. Such a conflict could be seen in the 19th and early 20th centuries between Christian religious doctrine and modern science, a conflict that Durkheim’s own sociology took part in and one that continues today.
Essentially, Durkheim’s analysis of the death of the gods concentrates on the underlying disorganization of European society that led to the demise not only of Christianity, but of a number of other economic, political, and social institutions as well. This same underlying disorganization was preventing European society from generating the collective force necessary for the creation of new institutions and a new sacred object. The death of the gods is a symptom of a sickened society, one that has lost its internal structure and descended into an-archy, or a society with no authority and no definitive principles, moral or otherwise, to build itself on. In spite of such a glum analysis, Durkheim did have hope for the future. Out of the chaos he saw the emergence of a new religion that would guide the West, what he termed “the cult of the individual.”
According to the later Durkheim religion is part of the human condition and as long as humans are grouped in collective life, they will inevitably form a religion of some sort. Europe could thus be characterized as in a state of transition; out of the ashes of Christianity, a new religion would eventually emerge. This new religion would form around the sacred object of the human person as it is represented in the individual, the only element common to all in a society that is becoming more and more diverse and individualized. Appropriately, Durkheim calls this new religion the ‘cult of the individual.’ But how does this religion begin? What is its conception of individual? And what kind of society/religion does the cult of the individual create?
To begin, the cult of the individual begins, like all religions according to Durkheim, with collective effervescence. The first moments of collective effervescence for the cult of the individual could be found in the democratic revolutions taking place in Europe and elsewhere at the end of the 18th and during the 19th centuries. The French Revolution is the perfect example of such a release of collective energy. The concept of individual that these social movements were embracing follows strongly the line of thinking that was established during the Enlightenment; it is based on a general idea of human dignity and does not lead to a narcissistic, egotistical worship of the self. As Durkheim argues, the individualism of the cult of the individual is that of Kant and Rousseau; it is what the Déclaration des droits de l’homme (Declaration of the Rights of Man), the document produced by revolutionaries during the French Revolution, attempted to codify more or less successfully. In other words, the cult of the individual presupposes an autonomous individual endowed with rationality, born both free and equal to all other individuals in these respects. Belief in this abstract conception of individual creates the ideal around which the cult revolves.
With this sacred object at its core, the cult of the individual also contains moral ideals to pursue. These moral ideals that define society include the ideals of equality, freedom, and justice. The specific moral code that translates these ideals is built around the inalienable rights of the individual; any disenfranchisement of an individual’s human rights or any violation of an individual’s human dignity is considered sacrilege and is a moral offence of the highest order. Furthermore, with society becoming more diverse, the respect, tolerance, and promotion of differences become important social virtues. Private property, as a tangible expression of an individual’s autonomy and rights, likewise becomes a symbol of the sacred character of the individual and is itself imbued with a certain degree of sacredness. Considering its ideals and beliefs, the cult of the individual also has a political dimension. Modern democracy, which encodes, institutionalizes, and protects the rights of the individual, is the form of government whereby Western societies best express their collective belief in the dignity of the individual. It is by protecting the rights of the individual in this way, somewhat paradoxically, that society is best preserved.
Rationality is also of primary importance to this religion. The cult of the individual has as a first dogma the autonomy of reason and as a first right free inquiry. Authority can and must be rationally grounded in order for the critically rational individual to have respect for social institutions. In continuing with the importance of rationality, modern science provides the cosmology for the cult of the individual. Scientific truths have come to be accepted by society as a whole and Durkheim even says that modern society has faith in science in the same way that past societies had faith in Christianity cosmology; despite that most individuals do not participate in or fully understand the scientific experiments taking place, the general population trusts scientific findings and accepts them as true. Modern science has an advantage, however, in that, unlike other religious cosmologies, it avoids dogmatizing about reality and permits individuals to challenge scientific theories through rational inquiry, fitting with the doctrine of the cult of the individual perfectly.
However, with the large growth in population and the individualization of society, it becomes very easy for society to lose hold of individuals or for the government to become out of touch with the population it serves. If there was to be social integration and solidarity, there needed to be ways in which the moral capacities of individuals could be ensured, and through which individuals could feel attachment to society. As a way of preventing the creation of a wholly individualistic society, Durkheim advocates the existence of intermediary groups, in particular labor unions. These groups would have a double purpose. On the one hand they would be intimate enough to provide sufficient social bonds for the individual, which would serve to integrate the individual into the society and develop their moral conscience. On the other hand, they would represent the demands of individuals to the government and thereby ensure that the state does not become domineering.
Through the new religion of the cult of the individual, to which he gave his full support, Durkheim predicted that European society would once again find the unity and cohesion it was lacking; once again it would have a sacred object. The extent to which Durkheim’s predictions have come true can be debated, although several developments since Durkheim’s death point to the validity of his thought. For example, the Universal Declaration of Human Rights was passed in 1948, more than 30 years after Durkheim’s death. This document could be regarded as the central holy text of the cult of the individual and today international moral discourse is dominated by questions of human rights. Furthermore, as some scholars have pointed out, the growth of democratic movements around the world, particularly since the fall of the Soviet Union, could also be used as evidence of the merits of Durkheim’s theories. In any case, Durkheim acknowledges that this religion, like all others preceding it, would only be of use to humanity temporarily, and would eventually be replaced by some future system of belief more adequate to the needs of society.
Durkheim is one of the first thinkers in the Western tradition, along with other 19th century thinkers such as Friedrich Nietzsche, Charles Peirce, and Karl Marx, to reject the Cartesian model of the self, which stipulates a transcendental, purely rational ego existing wholly independent of outside influence. In opposition to the Cartesian model, Durkheim views the self as integrated in a web of social, and thus historical, relations that greatly influence their actions, interpretations of the world, and even their abilities for logical thought. What is more, social forces can be assimilated by the individual to the point where they operate on an automatic, instinctual level, in which the individual is unaware of the effect society has on their tastes, moral inclinations, or even their perception of reality. Social forces thus comprise an unconscious “substructure” of the mind, in which they have to varying degrees been incorporated by the individual. In consequence, if an individual wants to know themselves, they must understand the society of which they are a part, and how this society has a direct impact on their existence. In fact, in a complete reversal of Descartes, Durkheim, following the sociological method, advocates that in order to understand one’s self, the individual must avoid introspection and look outside of themselves, at the social forces that determine their personality. In these ways, Durkheim anticipated by at least fifty years the post-modern deconstruction of the self as a socio-historically determined entity.
Partly because of this conception of the individual, and partly because of his methodology and theoretical stances, Durkheim has been routinely criticized on several points. Critics argue that he is a deterministic thinker and that his view of society is so constraining towards the individual that it erases any possibility for individual autonomy and freedom. Others argue that his sociology is too holistic and that it leaves no place for the individual or for subjective interpretations of social phenomena. Critics have gone so far as to accuse Durkheim of being anti-individual due in part to his consistent claims that the individual is derived from society.
Such critics, however, misconstrue a number of elements of Durkheim’s thought. To begin, there is an important individual component to society in that it is both external and internal to individuals. Durkheim makes clear on several occasions that elements of society, such as religious beliefs, morality, or language, are incorporated and appropriated by individuals in their own manner. While it is true that représentations collectives, for example, are the work of the collectivity and express collective thought through the individual, when the individual assimilates them they are refracted and colored by the individual’s personal experiences, thereby differentiating them. Thus, each individual expresses society in their own way. It should also be remembered that social facts are the result of a fusion of individual consciences. As such there is a delicate interplay between the individual and society whereby the individual not only maintains their individuality, but is also able to enrich the field of social forces by contributing to it their own personal thoughts and feelings.
In another sense, critics claiming that Durkheim is anti-individual overlook his analysis of modern society. As discussed above, according to Durkheim’s theory of the division of labor, as societies develop, they cultivate differences between individuals by necessity. This grants individuals an increasing amount of freedom to develop their personality. At least in Western society, the development of and respect for individualism has grown to such an extent that it has become the object of a cult; the individual is a sacred object and the protection of individual liberties and human dignity has been codified into moral principles. Granted that this individualism is itself a product of collective life, modern society, if anything, encourages individual autonomy, diversity, and freedom of thought as shared social norms.
As a whole, there is no antagonism between the individual and society in Durkheim’s sociology. In fact, Durkheim argues that to adhere to a group is the only thing that makes an individual human, since everything that we attribute as being special to humanity (language, the ability for rational thought, the ability for moral action, and so forth) is a product of social life. Far from being anti-individual, Durkheim never lost sight of the individual, and the relation of the individual to society is a guiding question throughout his work. Rather than showing that individuals are wholly subservient to society for all aspects of their existence, Durkheim’s analyses demonstrate that in order to understand the individual, it is necessary to situate them within the network of social relations that informs and influences their life. This is exactly what Durkheim’s sociology does, and its strength lies precisely in its illumination and deconstruction of those elements of society that have the greatest bearing on and realize themselves through the individual.
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 3, 2012 | Originally published: