Meister Eckhart was a thirteenth-fourteenth century philosopher, theologian, and mystic who lived and worked in the Dominican Order. It seems he enjoyed a relatively successful academic life and was considered to be an able orator and preacher. Enough of his work has been recovered for scholars to be to able to discern and explicate certain of his themes and concerns; these include the nature of God, The Trinity, the relationship of the human soul to God, and the processes inherent in these and other Christian concerns. Views on sin and redemption, Christ, and ethics are also expounded. The existing works are in the form of sermons, and fragments of a more substantial three-part work called the Opus tripartitum. Eckhart’s views may have teetered toward heresy at times. There is no doubt this caused him a little trouble, though all the details are not clear. Overall he seems to have inspired both admiration and suspicion in various factions. Though not a systematic philosopher, Eckhart’s insights and contributions remain a source of curiosity to modern readers both inside and outside of the academy.
The long controverted question concerning the locality of Eckhart’s origin has been settled by Denifle, who states that he was born at Hochheim, a village eight miles north of Gotha. The year of his birth was probably 1260, and he joined the Dominicans at Erfurt. The lighter studies he no doubt followed at Cologne. Later he was prior at Erfurt and provincial of Thuringia. In 1300 he was sent to Paris to lecture and take the academical degrees, and remained there till 1303. In the latter year he returned to Erfurt, and was made provincial for Saxony, a province which reached at that time from the Netherlands to Livonia. Complaints made against him and the provincial of Teutonia at the general chapter held in Paris in 1306 concerning irregularities among the ternaries, must have been trivial, because the general, Aymeric, appointed him in the following year his vicar-general for Bohemia with full power to set the demoralized monasteries there in order. In 1311 Eckhart was appointed by the general chapter of Naples as teacher at Paris. Then follows a long period of which it is known only that he spent part of the time at Strasburg (see Urkundenbuch der Stadt Strassburg, iii. 236). A passage in a chronicle of the year 1320, extant in manuscript (see Preger, i. 352-399), speaks of a prior Eckhart at Frankfort who was suspected of heresy, and some have referred this to Meister Eckhart; but it is highly improbable that a man under suspicion of heresy would have been appointed teacher in one of the most famous schools of the order.
Eckhart next appears as teacher at Cologne, and the archbishop, Hermann von Virneburg, accused him of heresy before the pope. But Nicholas of Strasburg , to whom the pope had given the temporary charge of the Dominican monasteries in Germany, exonerated him. The archbishop, however, pressed his charges against Eckhart and against Nicholas before his own court. The former now denied the competency of the archiepiscopal inquisition and demanded litterce dimissorix (apostoli) for an appeal to the pope (see the document in Preger, i. 471; more accurately in ALKG, ii. 627 and what follows.). On February 13, 1327, he stated in his protest, which was read publicly, that he had always detested everything wrong, and should anything of the kind be found in his writings, he now retracts. Of the further progress of the case there is no information, except that John XXII. issued a bull (In agro dominico), March 27, 1329, in which a series of statements from Eckhart is characterized as heretical; another as suspected of heresy (the bull is given complete in ALKG, ii. 636-640). At the close it is stated that Eckhart recanted before his death everything which he had falsely taught, by subjecting himself and his writing to the decision of the apostolic see. By this is no doubt meant the statement of February 13, 1327; and it may be inferred that Eckhart’s death, concerning which no information exists, took place shortly after that event. In 1328 the general chapter of the order at Toulouse decided to proceed against preachers who “endeavor to preach subtle things which not only do (not) advance morals, but easily lead the people into error.” Eckhart’s disciples were admonished to be more cautious, but nevertheless they cherished the memory of their master.
For centuries none of Eckhart’s writings were known except a number of sermons, found in the old editions of Tauler’s sermons, published by Kachelouen (Leipzig, 1498) and by Adam Petri (Basel, 1521 and 1522). In 1857 Franz Pfeiffer in the second volume of his Deutsche Mystiker (Stuttgart), which is wholly devoted to Eckhart, added considerable manuscript material. Pfeiffer was followed by others, especially Franz Jostes, Meister Eckhart und seine Junger, ungedruckte Texte zur Geschichte der deutschen Mystik (Collectanea Friburgensia, iv., Freiburg, 1895). But some pieces are of doubtful genuineness, and the tradition concerning others is very unsatisfactory. It was a great surprise when in 1880 and 1886 H. Denifle discovered at Erfurt and Cues two manuscripts with Latin works of Eckhart, the existence of which Nicholas of Cusa and Trittenheim had indeed mentioned, but which had since then been considered lost. There can be no doubt as to their genuineness, but thus far only the (comparatively extensive) specimens which Denifle had published (in ALKG, ii.) are known. The extant writings appear to be only parts of a very large work, the Opus tripartitum, which, to judge from the prologue in the first part treated of more than 1,000 propositions, in the second part debated a number of special questions, and in the third part, first expounded Biblical texts (opus sermonum) and afterward explained the books of the Bible in their order with special reference to the important passages. Entirely unknown at present are the contents of the more important manuscript of Cues, especially the exposition of the Gospel of John, which may contain information on many things.
As has already been stated it is impossible to give at present a final decision on Eckhart’s world of ideas. Nevertheless an attempt may be made to delineate his fundamental thoughts, based upon the material at hand. The great need of man is that his soul be united with God; for this a knowledge of God and his relation to the world, a knowledge of the soul and the way which it must go, are necessary. Eckhart does not doubt that such knowledge is given in the traditional faith of the Church, but it is not sufficient for one who is longing for salvation. He must attain to it with his own understanding. Eckhart accordingly does not move and live in ecclesiastical tradition after the manner of Bernard of Clairvaux or Hugo of Saint Victor; in his thinking on the highest questions he is independent and in this way he arrives at views which do not harmonize with the teaching of the Church, without, however, as far as can be seen, being conscious of any opposition. The last and highest object of thinking is the Deity, that is, the divine entity as distinguished from the persons, yet Eckhart often uses “God” in the sense of “Deity,” where his thought does not call for accurate definitions (but see, on the other hand, 180, 14; 181, 7). The Deity is absolute being without distinction of place or manner (ALKG, ii. 439-440). No predicate derived from finite being is applicable to the Deity; but this is therefore not mere negation or emptiness. Rather is finite being, as such, negation; and the Deity, as the negation of finite being, is the negation of negation, that is, the absolute fulness of being (322, 131 539, 10-27). Dionysius wrongly states: God is not, he is rather a nonentity. When in other passages (82, 26; 182, 31; 500, 27) Eckhart himself designates God as non-existent, he only means that he has none of the characteristics of finite existence. The same apparent contradiction is found, where Eckhart on the one hand calls God absolute being, and on the other denies that he is a being (319, 4; 659, 1); but he reconciles the two views (268-269). The same is the case with occasional seemingly paradoxical expressions such as, for example, that God is not good. (269, 18; 318, 35-319, 3). The essential elements of finite things are present in God, but in an exalted degree and in a manner that can not be comprehended by man (322, 20; 540, 2-7).
The absolute, unqualified being of the Deity Eckhart also calls unnatured nature. This unnatured nature, however, manifests itself in the natured nature, the three persons. The Trinity is the self-revelation of the Deity (540, 31; 390,12-22). In it God comprises himself. Accordingly, Eckhart attributes to the Father a sort of genesis; only the Deity is absolutely without any progression and reposes everlastingly in itself. The Father was made through himself (534, 17). This self-revelation of God Eckhart designates as a cognition, a speaking, or a demeanor. The Father perceives the whole fulness of the Deity (6,S); or, what is the same, he speaks a single word, which comprises everything (70, 25). He procreates the Son (284, 12); for the Father is father only through the Son. The Son, however, is in everything like the Father, only that he procreates not,(337, 3). The essence of the Father is also that of the Son, and the essence in both is no other than that of the Deity. From the pleasure and love which both have for each other springs the Holy Ghost (497, 26). Eckhart leaves no doubt that the entire trinitarian process must not be conceived of as a temporal one, but as a process extending throughout eternity (254, 10). Preger thought that Eckhart’s distinction between Deity and God should be interpreted as a distinction between potentiality and actuality. To this interpretation Denifle (ALKG, ii. 453 and what follows) has strongly objected and cited Eckhart’s Latin writings, in which he, with Thomas Aquinas and others, designates God as actus purus, thus excluding all potentiality. Denifle is right, in that Eckhart does not consciously and deliberately make any such distinction; but it can not be denied that his conception leads to it. Especially significant is Eckhart’s explanation in 175, 7 and what follows, where he tries to illustrate the relation between the fatherhood as it is determined in the Deity and the paternity of the person of the Father by the relation between the maternity peculiar to the Virgin as such, and the maternity which she acquires by bearing. But this is exactly the relation of potentiality and actuality (see also the peculiar passage 193, 33). It must be admitted that Eckhart here expresses two views which can not be harmonized with one another, though the second is not fully developed. Eckhart had a wealth of ingenious ideas, but he was unable to systematize them.
The self-manifestation of God in the Trinity is followed by his manifestation in his creatures. Everything in them that is truly real is God’s eternal being; but God’s being does not manifest itself thus in its entire fulness (101, 34; 173, 26; 503, 26). In this antithesis may be expressed the relation of Eckhart’s philosophy to pantheism, both as regards similarities and differences. According to Eckhart God’s creatures have not, as Thomas Aquinas held, merely ideal preexistence in God, that is, their conceptual essence (essential quidditas) coming from the divine intelligence, but their existence (esse) being foreign to the divine being. Rather is the true being of the creatures immanent in the divine being. On the other hand, every peculiarity distinguishing, creatures from each other is something negative; and in this sense it is said that the creatures are a mere nothing. Should God withdraw from his creatures his being, they would disappear as the shadow on the wall disappears when the wall is removed (31, 2). This perishable being is the creature confined within the limits of space and time (87, 49). On the other hand, every creature, considered according to its true entity, is eternal. It is obvious that this necessarily involves a modification of the idea of creation. Even Augustine and the Schoolmen felt this difficulty. While they did not, like Eckhart connect the existence of the world with the being of God they did consider it unallowable to attribute to God any temporary activity. Albert the Great tried to avoid the difficulty with the sentence, “God created all things from eternity, but things were not created from eternity”; but this is more easily said than conceived. According to the bull of 1329 (p. 2), Eckhart asserted that “it may be conceded that the world was from eternity.” It is impossible here to investigate this view further; but reference must be made to the close relation into which Eckhart brings the process of the Trinity and the genesis, or progress, of the world, both of the real and the ideal world (76, 52; 254, 16; 284, 12; and Commentary in Genesis; ALKG, ii. 553, 13-17).
The unqualified Deity, the Trinity (birth of the Son or of the Eternal Lord), and the creation of the world are to him three immediate moments, which follow each other in conceptual, not temporal sequence. All creatures have part in the divine essence; but this is true of the soul in a higher degree. In the irrational creature there is something of God; but in the soul God is divine (230, 26; 2,31, 4). Though God speaks his word in all creatures, only rational creatures can preserve it (479, 19). In other words, in the soul, where he has his resting-place, God is subjective, while in the rest of creation he is merely objective. The soul is an image of God, in so far as its chief powers, memory, reason, and will, answer to the divine persons (319, 1). This accords with the view of Augustine. Just as there is the absolute Deity, which is superior to the persons of the Godhead, so in the soul there is something that is superior to its own powers. This is the innermost background of the soul, which Eckhart frequently calls a “spark,” or “little spark.” In its real nature this basis of the soul is one with the Deity (66, 2). When Eckhart sometimes speaks of it as uncreated (286, 16; 311, 6), and then again as created, this does not involve a contradiction. While, on the one hand, it rests eternally in the Deity, on the other, it entered into the temporal existence of the soul, that is, was made or created through grace. But it is not in this original unity with God that the soul finds its perfection and bliss. As it has a subjective being, it must turn to God, in order that the essential principle implanted in it may be truly realized. It is not enough that it was made by God; God must come and be in it. But this has taken place without hindrance only in the human soul of Christ (67, 12). For all other souls sin is an obstacle.
But wherein does sin consist? Not in the finiteness, which is never removed from the soul (3S7, 3; 500, 1 1), but in the direction of the will toward the finite and its pleasure therein (476, 19; 674, 17). The possibility of sin, however, is based in finiteness, taken together with the free will of the creature. If it is the destiny of the soul to be the resting-place of God, then the direction of the will toward the finite makes this impossible; and it is this that constitutes sin. Redemption, therefore, can take place only when the creature makes room in his soul for the work of God; and the condition for that is the turning away from the finite. For God is ever ready to work in the soul, provided he is not hindered and the soul is susceptible to his influence (27, 25; 283, 23; 33, 29; 479, 31). The inner separation from everything casual, sensual, earthly and the yielding to the work of God in the heart; that is the seclusion or tranquillity of which Eckhart speaks again and again. For him this is the basis of all piety. But what is it that God accomplishes in the soul? This can be stated in a word: the birth of the son. As the soul is an image of the Deity, if it is to fulfil its destiny, then that process by which the deity develops into the three persons must take place in it. The father procreates in the soul the son (44, 28; 175, 15-20; 479, 10; 13, 12). This takes place during the life of the soul in time; and, too, not merely at a particular moment, but rather continuously and repeatedly. This is not merely a copy or analogon of that inner divine process, but is in truth that very process itself, by which it becomes, through grace, what the Son of God is by nature (433, 32; 382, 7; 377, 17). From this view of Eckhart’s follow a number of the most striking statements in which the soul is made to share in the attributes and works of God, including the creation (119, 28-40; 267, 4; 283, 37-284, 7). However, according to Eckhart, a complete fusion of the soul with the Deity never takes place (387, 3). He also opposes the doctrine of Apocatastasis (65, 20; 402, 34; 470, 22).
According to Eckhart sin is not the real cause of the incarnation (591, 34). God wished rather to receive the nature of things through grace in time just as he had them by nature in eternity in himself (574, 34). Just as a man occupies a central position in the world, since he leads all creatures back to God, so Christ stands in the center of humanity (180, 7; 390, 37.) The same thought is found in Maximus the Confessor and Erigena, but whence did Eckhart get it? Even at the creation of the first man Christ was already the end in view (250, 23); and now after the fact of sin, Christ stands likewise in the center of redemption. After the fall all creatures worked together to produce a man who should restore the harmony (497, 11). This took place when Mary resigned herself so completely to the divine word that the eternal word could assume human nature in her. However, this temporal birth of the son is again included in his eternal birth as a moment of the same (391, 20). And now God is to be born in us. In his human life Jesus becomes a pattern for man; and in all that he did and experienced, above all in his passion and death there is an overwhelming power that draws man to God (218-219) and brings about in us that which first took place in Christ, who alone is the way to the father (241, 17).
Whatever one may think of Eckhart’s philosophical and dogmatic speculations, his ethical view, at any rate, is of rare purity and sublimity. The inner position of man, the disposition of the heart, is for him the main thing (56, 39; 297, 11; 444, S; 560, 43) and with him this is not a result of reflection. One feels that it comes from the core of his personality; and no doubt this was the principal reason for the deep impression his sermons made. He speaks little of church ceremonies. For him outward penances have only a limited value. That man inwardly turn to God and be led by him; that is the main purpose of Eckhart’s exhortations. Let no one think because this or that great saint has done and suffered many things, that he should imitate him. God gives to each his task, and leaves every one on his way (560 and what follows, 177, 26-35). No one can express the fact more definitely than does Eckhart, that it is not works that justify man, but that man must first be righteous in order to do righteous works. Nor does he recommend that one flee from the world, but flee from oneself, from selfishness, and self-will. Otherwise one finds as little peace in the cell as outside of it. Though he sees in suffering the most effective and most valuable means of inner purification, still he does not mean that one should seek sufferings of his own choosing, but only bear patiently whatever God imposes. He recognizes that it is natural for one to be affected either pleasantly or unpleasantly by the various sense-impressions; but in the innermost depths of the soul one must hold fast to God and allow himself to be moved by nothing (52, 1; 427, 22). It need hardly be added that he regards highly works of charity. Even supreme rapture should not prevent one from rendering a service to the poor. It is noteworthy that, in the ninth sermon, he puts Martha higher than Mary, though by a strange misinterpretation of the text. While Mary enjoyed only the sweetness of the Lord, being yet a learner, Martha had passed this stage. She stood firm in the substance, and no work hindered her, but every work helped her to blessedness. Future investigations will presumably make possible a more accurate estimate of the importance of Eckhart; but it is hardly possible that they will overthrow the verdict of Suso and Tauler concerning him.
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Last updated: April 13, 2001 | Originally published: April/13/2001
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