“Eclecticism” is a name given to a group of ancient philosophers who, from the existing philosophical beliefs, tried to select the doctrines that seemed to them most reasonable, and out of these constructed a new system (see Diogenes Laertius, 21). The name was first generally used in the first century BCE. Stoicism and Epicureanism had made the search for pure truth subordinate to the attainment of practical virtue and happiness. Skepticism had denied that pure truth was possible to discover. Eclecticism sought to reach by selection the highest possible degree of probability, in the despair of attaining to what is absolutely true. In Greek philosophy, the best known Eclectics were the Stoics Panaetius (150 BCE.) and Posidonius (75 BCE.). The New Academic, Carnaedes (155 BCE.), and Philo of Larissa (75 BCE.). Among the Romans, Cicero, whose cast of mind made him always doubtful and uncertain of his own attitude, was thoroughly eclectic, uniting the Peripatetic, Stoic, and New Academic doctrines, and seeking the probable (illud probabile). The same general line was followed by Varro, and in the next century the Stoic Seneca propounded a philosophical system largely based on eclecticism.
In the late period of Greek philosophy there appears an eclectic system consisting of a compromise between the Neo-Pythagoreans and the various Platonic sects. Still another school is that of Philo Iudaeus, who at Alexandria, in the first century CE. interpreted the Old Testament allegorically, and tried to harmonize it with selected doctrines of Greek philosophy. Neo-Platonism, the last product of Greek speculation, was also a fusion of Greek philosophy with eastern religion. Its chief representatives were Plotinus (230 CE.), Porphyrius (275 CE.), Iamblichus (300 CE.), and Proclus (450 CE.). The desire of this school was to attain right relations between God and humans, and was thus religious.
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Last updated: April 13, 2001 | Originally published: April/13/2001
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