In philosophy, egoism is the theory that one’s self is, or should be, the motivation and the goal of one’s own action. Egoism has two variants, descriptive or normative. The descriptive (or positive) variant conceives egoism as a factual description of human affairs. That is, people are motivated by their own interests and desires, and they cannot be described otherwise. The normative variant proposes that people should be so motivated, regardless of what presently motivates their behavior. Altruism is the opposite of egoism. The term “egoism” derives from “ego,” the Latin term for “I” in English. Egoism should be distinguished from egotism, which means a psychological overvaluation of one’s own importance, or of one’s own activities.
People act for many reasons; but for whom, or what, do or should they act—for themselves, for God, or for the good of the planet? Can an individual ever act only according to her own interests without regard for others’ interests. Conversely, can an individual ever truly act for others in complete disregard for her own interests? The answers will depend on an account of free will. Some philosophers argue that an individual has no choice in these matters, claiming that a person’s acts are determined by prior events which make illusory any belief in choice. Nevertheless, if an element of choice is permitted against the great causal impetus from nature, or God, it follows that a person possesses some control over her next action, and, that, therefore, one may inquire as to whether the individual does, or, should choose a self-or-other-oriented action. Morally speaking, one can ask whether the individual should pursue her own interests, or, whether she should reject self-interest and pursue others’ interest instead: to what extent are other-regarding acts morally praiseworthy compared to self-regarding acts?
The descriptive egoist’s theory is called “psychological egoism.” Psychological egoism describes human nature as being wholly self-centered and self-motivated. Examples of this explanation of human nature predate the formation of the theory, and, are found in writings such as that of British Victorian historian, Macaulay, and, in that of British Reformation political philosopher, Thomas Hobbes. To the question, “What proposition is there respecting human nature which is absolutely and universally true?”, Macaulay, replies, “We know of only one . . . that men always act from self-interest.” (Quoted in Garvin.) In Leviathan, Hobbes maintains that, “No man giveth but with intention of good to himself; because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts the object to every man is his own pleasure.” In its strong form, psychological egoism asserts that people always act in their own interests, and, cannot but act in their own interests, even though they may disguise their motivation with references to helping others or doing their duty.
Opponents claim that psychological egoism renders ethics useless. However, this accusation assumes that ethical behavior is necessarily other-regarding, which opponents would first have to establish. Opponents may also exploit counterfactual evidence to criticize psychological egoism— surely, they claim, there is a host of evidence supporting altruistic or duty bound actions that cannot be said to engage the self-interest of the agent. However, what qualifies to be counted as apparent counterfactual evidence by opponents becomes an intricate and debatable issue. This is because, in response to their opponents, psychological egoists may attempt to shift the question away from outward appearances to ultimate motives of acting benevolently towards others; for example, they may claim that seemingly altruistic behavior (giving a stranger some money) necessarily does have a self-interested component. For example, if the individual were not to offer aid to a stranger, he or she may feel guilty or may look bad in front of a peer group.
On this point, psychological egoism’s validity turns on examining and analyzing moral motivation. But since motivation is inherently private and inaccessible to others (an agent could be lying to herself or to others about the original motive), the theory shifts from a theoretical description of human nature–one that can be put to observational testing–to an assumption about the inner workings of human nature: psychological egoism moves beyond the possibility of empirical verification and the possibility of empirical negation (since motives are private), and therefore it becomes what is termed a “closed theory.”
A closed theory is a theory that rejects competing theories on its own terms and is non-verifiable and non-falsifiable. If psychological egoism is reduced to an assumption concerning human nature and its hidden motives, then it follows that it is just as valid to hold a competing theory of human motivation such as psychological altruism.
Psychological altruism holds that all human action is necessarily other-centered, and other-motivated. One’s becoming a hermit (an apparently selfish act) can be reinterpreted through psychological altruism as an act of pure noble selflessness: a hermit is not selfishly hiding herself away, rather, what she is doing is not inflicting her potentially ungraceful actions or displeasing looks upon others. A parallel analysis of psychological altruism thus results in opposing conclusions to psychological egoism. However, psychological altruism is arguably just as closed as psychological egoism: with it one assumes that an agent’s inherently private and consequently unverifiable motives are altruistic. If both theories can be validly maintained, and if the choice between them becomes the flip of a coin, then their soundness must be questioned.
A weak version of psychological egoism accepts the possibility of altruistic or benevolent behavior, but maintains that, whenever a choice is made by an agent to act, the action is by definition one that the agent wants to do at that point. The action is self-serving, and is therefore sufficiently explained by the theory of psychological egoism. Let one assume that person A wants to help the poor; therefore, A is acting egoistically by actually wanting to help; again, if A ran into a burning building to save a kitten, it must be the case that A wanted or desired to save the kitten. However, defining all motivations as what an agent desires to do remains problematic: logically, the theory becomes tautologous and therefore unable to provide a useful, descriptive meaning of motivation because one is essentially making an arguably philosophically uninteresting claim that an agent is motivated to do what she is motivated to do. Besides which, if helping others is what A desires to do, then to what extent can A be continued to be called an egoist? A acts because that is what A does, and consideration of the ethical “ought” becomes immediately redundant. Consequently, opponents argue that psychological egoism is philosophically inadequate because it sidesteps the great nuances of motive. For example, one can argue that the psychological egoist’s notion of motive sidesteps the clashes that her theory has with the notion of duty, and, related social virtues such as honor, respect, and reputation, which fill the tomes of history and literature.
David Hume, in his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (Appendix II—Of Self Love), offers six rebuttals of what he calls the “selfish hypothesis,” an arguably archaic relative of psychological egoism. First, Hume argues that self-interest opposes moral sentiments that may engage one in concern for others, and, may motivate one’s actions for others. These moral sentiments include love, friendship, compassion, and gratitude. Second, psychological egoism attempts to reduce human motivation to a single cause, which is a ‘fruitless’ task—the “love of simplicity…has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy.” Third, it is evident that animals act benevolently towards one another, and, if it is admitted that animals can act altruistically, then how can it be denied in humans? Fourth, the concepts we use to describe benevolent behavior cannot be meaningless; sometimes an agent obviously does not have a personal interest in the fortune of another, yet will wish her well. Any attempt to create an imaginary vested interest, as the psychological egoist will attempt, proves futile. Fifth, Hume asserts that we have prior motivations to self-interest; we may have, for example, a predisposition towards vanity, fame, or vengeance that transcends any benefit to the agent. Finally, Hume claims that even if the selfish hypothesis were true, there are a sufficient number of dispositions to generate a wide possibility of moral actions, allowing one person to be called vicious and another humane; and he claims that the latter is to be preferred over the former.
The second variant of egoism is normative in that it stipulates the agent ought to promote the self above other values. Herbert Spencer said, “Ethics has to recognize the truth, recognized in unethical thought, that egoism comes before altruism. The acts required for continued self-preservation, including the enjoyments of benefits achieved by such arts, are the first requisites to universal welfare. Unless each duly cares for himself, his care for all others is ended in death, and if each thus dies there remain no others to be cared for.” He was echoing a long history of the importance of self-regarding behavior that can be traced back to Aristotle’s theory of friendship in the Nichomachaean Ethics. In his theory, Aristotle argues that a man must befriend himself before he can befriend others. The general theory of normative egoism does not attempt to describe human nature directly, but asserts how people ought to behave. It comes in two general forms: rational egoism and ethical egoism.
Rational egoism claims that the promotion of one’s own interests is always in accordance with reason. The greatest and most provocative proponent of rational egoism is Ayn Rand, whose The Virtue of Selfishness outlines the logic and appeal of the theory. Rand argues that: first, properly defined, selfishness rejects the sacrificial ethics of the West’s Judaic-Christian heritage on the grounds that it is right for man to live his own life; and, Rand argues that, second, selfishness is a proper virtue to pursue. That being said, she rejects the “selfless selfishness” of irrationally acting individuals: “the actor must always be the beneficiary of his action and that man must act for his own rational self-interest.” To be ethically selfish thus entails a commitment to reason rather than to emotionally driven whims and instincts.
In the strong version of rational egoism defended by Rand, not only is it rational to pursue one’s own interests, it is irrational not to pursue them. In a weaker version, one may note that while it is rational to pursue one’s own interests, there may be occasions when not pursuing them is not necessarily irrational.
Critics of rational egoism may claim that reason may dictate that one’s interests should not govern one’s actions. The possibility of conflicting reasons in a society need not be evoked in this matter; one need only claim that reason may invoke an impartiality clause, in other words, a clause that demands that in a certain situation one’s interests should not be furthered. For example, consider a free-rider situation. In marking students’ papers, a teacher may argue that to offer inflated grades is to make her life easier, and, therefore, is in her self-interest: marking otherwise would incur negative feedback from students and having to spend time counseling on writing skills, and so on. It is even arguably foreseeable that inflating grades may never have negative consequences for anyone. The teacher could conceivably free-ride on the tougher marking of the rest of the department or university and not worry about the negative consequences of a diminished reputation to either. However, impartiality considerations demand an alternative course—it is not right to change grades to make life easier. Here self-interest conflicts with reason. Nonetheless, a Randian would reject the teacher’s free-riding being rational: since the teacher is employed to mark objectively and impartially in the first place, to do otherwise is to commit a fraud both against the employing institution and the student. (This is indeed an analogous situation explored in Rand’s The Fountainhead, in which the hero architect regrets having propped up a friend’s inabilities).
A simpler scenario may also be considered. Suppose that two men seek the hand of one woman, and they deduce that they should fight for her love. A critic may reason that the two men rationally claim that if one of them were vanquished, the other may enjoy the beloved. However, the solution ignores the woman’s right to choose between her suitors, and thus the men’s reasoning is flawed.
In a different scenario, game theory (emanating from John von Neumann’s and Oskar Morgenstern’s Theory of Games and Economic Behaviour, 1944) points to another possible logical error in rational egoism by offering an example in which the pursuit of self-interest results in both agents being made worse off. This is famously described in the Prisoner’s Dilemma.
From the table, two suspects in a crime are individually offered different sentences by their captors. A, for example, is offered 5 years in prison if he confesses, and he is told that if his partner doesn’t confess he will be given 6 months in jail and his partner 10 years. If he refuses to confess, then A faces 10 years in prison if his partner does confess; however, both would only serve two years in prison if they both do not confess.
A prior agreement between A and B not to confess would result in the best solution for the two of them, but that is not allowed by the game because they must make their decision by themselves without communicating with the other person. The incentive that each personally faces to avoid spending time in prison is to squeal in the hope that the other does not confess. If each does this, then both will end up serving the non-optimal solution of 5 years each.
The Prisoner’s Dilemma offers a mathematical model as to why self-interested action could lead to a socially non-optimal equilibrium (in which the participants end up in the worst scenario). Supporters identify a game “as any interaction between agents that is governed by a set of rules specifying the possible moves for each participant and a set of outcomes for each possible combination of moves.” They add: “One is hard put to find an example of social phenomenon that cannot be so described.” (Hargreaves-Heap and Varoufakis, p.1). Nonetheless, it can be countered that the nature of the game artificially pre-empts other possibilities: the sentences are fixed, so the choices facing the agents are fixed; although this may certainly be applied to the restricted choices facing the two prisoners or contestants in a game, it is not obvious that every-day life generates such limited and limiting choices.
Game theory introduces a variety of different outcomes and presents other ethical dilemmas (e.g., in the 1980s, a “mutually assured destruction” version was popular in which two superpowers face each other with nuclear weapons and similar incentives to the prisoners above), but the outcomes and hence restrictions on the agents remain necessarily decided upon by the “game master.” Typically the solutions show self-interested behavior as reducing social welfare, and some solutions may be so determined as to be non socially-optimal and unstable, leaving us to believe that selfish behavior is consequentially both bad and destabilizing. The implied conclusion in such games is that either individuals ought to reject their own interests in favor of collective gain and/or that individuals ought to submit their choices to an overarching “game master” or Hobbesian Leviathan – that is, the state and its experts, politicians, committees, and possibly referenda, and so forth – who would then choose the “correct” collective solution on their behalf. Since egoists tend to disparage others’ choosing for them as immoral, such an implied solution is to be rejected (indeed, a third set of values could be added to the game that reflect the captives’ gross dismay at having the decision made for them!); more importantly, the egoist may reply that life is not a game of fixed values and that the solutions are mere contrivances.
At a deeper level, some egoists may reject the possibility of fixed or absolute values that individuals acting selfishly and caught up in their own pursuits cannot see. Nietzsche, for instance, would counter that values are created by the individual and thereby do not stand independently of his or her self to be explained by another “authority”; similarly, St. Augustine would say “love, and do as you will”; neither of which may be helpful to the prisoners above but which may be of greater guidance for individuals in normal life.
Rand exhorts the application of reason to ethical situations, but a critic may reply that what is rational is not always the same as what is reasonable. The critic may emphasize the historicity of choice, that is, she may emphasize that one’s apparent choice is demarcated by, and dependent on, the particular language, culture of right and consequence and environmental circumstance in which an individual finds herself living: a Victorian English gentleman perceived a different moral sphere and consequently horizon of goals than an American frontiersman. This criticism may, however, turn on semantic or contextual nuances. The Randian may counter that what is rational is reasonable: for one can argue that rationality is governed as much by understanding the context (Sartre’s facticity is a highly useful term!) as adhering to the laws of logic and of non-contradiction.
Ethical egoism is the normative theory that the promotion of one’s own good is in accordance with morality. In the strong version, it is held that it is always moral to promote one’s own good, and it is never moral not to promote it. In the weak version, it is said that although it is always moral to promote one’s own good, it is not necessarily never moral to not. That is, there may be conditions in which the avoidance of personal interest may be a moral action.
In an imaginary construction of a world inhabited by a single being, it is possible that the pursuit of morality is the same as the pursuit of self-interest in that what is good for the agent is the same as what is in the agent’s interests. Arguably, there could never arise an occasion when the agent ought not to pursue self-interest in favor of another morality, unless he produces an alternative ethical system in which he ought to renounce his values in favor of an imaginary self, or, other entity such as the universe, or the agent’s God. Opponents of ethical egoism may claim, however, that although it is possible for this Robinson Crusoe type creature to lament previous choices as not conducive to self-interest (enjoying the pleasures of swimming all day, and not spending necessary time producing food), the mistake is not a moral mistake but a mistake of identifying self-interest. Presumably this lonely creature will begin to comprehend the distinctions between short, and long-term interests, and, that short-term pains can be countered by long-term gains.
In addition, opponents argue that even in a world inhabited by a single being, duties would still apply; (Kantian) duties are those actions that reason dictates ought to be pursued regardless of any gain, or loss to self or others. Further, the deontologist asserts the application of yet another moral sphere which ought to be pursued, namely, that of impartial duties. The problem with complicating the creature’s world with impartial duties, however, is in defining an impartial task in a purely subjective world. Impartiality, the ethical egoist may retort, could only exist where there are competing selves: otherwise, the attempt to be impartial in judging one’s actions is a redundant exercise. (However, the Cartesian rationalist could retort that need not be so, that a sentient being should act rationally, and reason will disclose what are the proper actions he should follow.)
If we move away from the imaginary construct of a single being’s world, ethical egoism comes under fire from more pertinent arguments. In complying with ethical egoism, the individual aims at her own greatest good. Ignoring a definition of the good for the present, it may justly be argued that pursuing one’s own greatest good can conflict with another’s pursuit, thus creating a situation of conflict. In a typical example, a young person may see his greatest good in murdering his rich uncle to inherit his millions. It is the rich uncle’s greatest good to continue enjoying his money, as he sees fit. According to detractors, conflict is an inherent problem of ethical egoism, and the model seemingly does not possess a conflict resolution system. With the additional premise of living in society, ethical egoism has much to respond to: obviously there are situations when two people’s greatest goods – the subjectively perceived working of their own self-interest – will conflict, and, a solution to such dilemmas is a necessary element of any theory attempting to provide an ethical system.
The ethical egoist contends that her theory, in fact, has resolutions to the conflict. The first resolution proceeds from a state of nature examination. If, in the wilderness, two people simultaneously come across the only source of drinkable water a potential dilemma arises if both make a simultaneous claim to it. With no recourse to arbitration they must either accept an equal share of the water, which would comply with rational egoism. (In other words, it is in the interest of both to share, for both may enjoy the water and each other’s company, and, if the water is inexhaustible, neither can gain from monopolizing the source.) But a critic may maintain that this solution is not necessarily in compliance with ethical egoism. Arguably, the critic continues, the two have no possible resolution, and must, therefore, fight for the water. This is often the line taken against egoism generally: that it results in insoluble conflict that implies, or necessitates a resort to force by one or both of the parties concerned. For the critic, the proffered resolution is, therefore, an acceptance of the ethical theory that “might is right;” that is, the critic maintains that the resolution accepts that the stronger will take possession and thereby gain proprietary rights.
However, ethical egoism does not have to logically result in a Darwinian struggle between the strong and the weak in which strength determines moral rectitude to resources or values. Indeed, the “realist” position may strike one as philosophically inadequate as that of psychological egoism, although popularly attractive. For example, instead of succumbing to insoluble conflict, the two people could cooperate (as rational egoism would require). Through cooperation, both agents would, thereby, mutually benefit from securing and sharing the resource. Against the critic’s pessimistic presumption that conflict is insoluble without recourse to victory, the ethical egoist can retort that reasoning people can recognize that their greatest interests are served more through cooperation than conflict. War is inherently costly, and, even the fighting beasts of the wild instinctively recognize its potential costs, and, have evolved conflict-avoiding strategies.
On the other hand, the ethical egoist can argue less benevolently, that in case one man reaches the desired resource first, he would then be able to take rightful control and possession of it – the second person cannot possess any right to it, except insofar as he may trade with its present owner. Of course, charitable considerations may motivate the owner to secure a share for the second comer, and economic considerations may prompt both to trade in those products that each can better produce or acquire: the one may guard the water supply from animals while the other hunts. Such would be a classical liberal reading of this situation, which considers the advance of property rights to be the obvious solution to apparently intractable conflicts over resources.
A second conflict-resolution stems from critics’ fears that ethical egoists could logically pursue their interests at the cost of others. Specifically, a critic may contend that personal gain logically cannot be in one’s best interest if it entails doing harm to another: doing harm to another would be to accept the principle that doing harm to another is ethical (that is, one would be equating “doing harm” with “one’s own best interests”), whereas, reflection shows that principle to be illogical on universalistic criteria. However, an ethical egoist may respond that in the case of the rich uncle and greedy nephew, for example, it is not the case that the nephew would be acting ethically by killing his uncle, and that for a critic to contend otherwise is to criticize personal gain from the separate ethical standpoint that condemns murder. In addition, the ethical egoist may respond by saying that these particular fears are based on a confusion resulting from conflating ethics (that is, self-interest) with personal gain; The ethical egoist may contend that if the nephew were to attempt to do harm for personal gain, that he would find that his uncle or others would or may be permitted to do harm in return. The argument that “I have a right to harm those who get in my way” is foiled by the argument that “others have a right to harm me should I get in the way.” That is, in the end, the nephew variously could see how harming another for personal gain would not be in his self-interest at all.
The critics’ fear is based on a misreading of ethical egoism, and is an attempt to subtly reinsert the “might is right” premise. Consequently, the ethical egoist is unfairly chastised on the basis of a straw-man argument. Ultimately, however, one comes to the conclusion reached in the discussion of the first resolution; that is, one must either accept the principle that might is right (which in most cases would be evidentially contrary to one’s best interest), or accept that cooperation with others is a more successful approach to improving one’s interests. Though interaction can either be violent or peaceful, an ethical egoist rejects violence as undermining the pursuit of self-interest.
A third conflict-resolution entails the insertion of rights as a standard. This resolution incorporates the conclusions of the first two resolutions by stating that there is an ethical framework that can logically be extrapolated from ethical egoism. However, the logical extrapolation is philosophically difficult (and, hence, intriguing) because ethical egoism is the theory that the promotion of one’s own self-interest is in accordance with morality whereas rights incorporate boundaries to behavior that reason or experience has shown to be contrary to the pursuit of self-interest. Although it is facile to argue that the greedy nephew does not have a right to claim his uncle’s money because it is not his but his uncle’s, and to claim that it is wrong to act aggressively against the person of another because that person has a legitimate right to live in peace (thus providing the substance of conflict-resolution for ethical egoism), the problem of expounding this theory for the ethical egoist lies in the intellectual arguments required to substantiate the claims for the existence of rights and then, once substantiated, connecting them to the pursuit of an individual’s greatest good.
A final type of ethical egoism is conditional egoism. This is the theory that egoism is morally acceptable or right if it leads to morally acceptable ends. For example, self-interested behavior can be accepted and applauded if it leads to the betterment of society as a whole; the ultimate test rests not on acting self-interestedly but on whether society is improved as a result. A famous example of this kind of thinking is from Adam Smith’s The Wealth of Nations, in which Smith outlines the public benefits resulting from self-interested behavior (borrowing a theory from the earlier writer Bernard Mandeville and his Fable of the Bees). Smith writes: “It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own interest. We address ourselves, not to their humanity but to their self-love, and never talk to them of our own necessities but of their advantages” (Wealth of Nations, I.ii.2).
As Smith himself admits, if egoistic behavior lends itself to society’s detriment, then it ought to be stopped. The theory of conditional egoism is thus dependent on a superior moral goal such as an action being in the common interest, that is, the public good. The grave problem facing conditional egoists is according to what standard ought the limits on egoism be placed? In other words, who or what is to define the nature of the public good? If it is a person who is set up as the great arbitrator of the public, then it is uncertain if there can be a guarantee that he or she is embodying or arguing for an impartial standard of the good and not for his or her own particular interest. If it is an impartial standard that sets the limit, one that can be indicated by any reasonable person, then it behooves the philosopher to explain the nature of that standard.
In most “public good” theories, the assumption is made that there exists a collective entity over and above the individuals that comprise it: race, nation, religion, and state being common examples. Collectivists then attempt to explain what in particular should be held as the interest of the group. Inevitably, however, conflict arises, and resolutions have to be produced. Some seek refuge in claiming the need for perpetual dialogue (rather than exchange), but others return to the need for force to settle apparently insoluble conflicts; nonetheless, the various shades of egoism pose a valid and appealing criticism of collectivism: that individuals act; groups don’t. Karl Popper’s works on methodological individualism are a useful source in criticizing collectivist thinking (for example, Popper’s The Poverty of Historicism).
Psychological egoism is fraught with the logical problem of collapsing into a closed theory, and hence being a mere assumption that could validly be accepted as describing human motivation and morality, or be rejected in favor of a psychological altruism (or even a psychological ecologism in which all actions necessarily benefit the agent’s environment).
Normative egoism, however, engages in a philosophically more intriguing dialogue with protractors. Normative egoists argue from various positions that an individual ought to pursue his or her own interest. These may be summarized as follows: the individual is best placed to know what defines that interest, or it is thoroughly the individual’s right to pursue that interest. The latter is divided into two sub-arguments: either because it is the reasonable/rational course of action, or because it is the best guarantee of maximizing social welfare.
Egoists also stress that the implication of critics’ condemnation of self-serving or self-motivating action is the call to renounce freedom in favor of control by others, who then are empowered to choose on their behalf. This entails an acceptance of Aristotle’s political maxim that “some are born to rule and others are born to be ruled,” also read as “individuals are generally too stupid to act either in their own best interests or in the interests of those who would wish to command them.” Rejecting both descriptions (the first as being arrogant and empirically questionable and the second as unmasking the truly immoral ambition lurking behind attacks on selfishness), egoists ironically can be read as moral and political egalitarians glorifying the dignity of each and every person to pursue life as they see fit. Mistakes in securing the proper means and appropriate ends will be made by individuals, but if they are morally responsible for their actions they not only will bear the consequences but also the opportunity for adapting and learning. When that responsibility is removed and individuals are exhorted to live for an alternative cause, their incentive and joy in improving their own welfare is concomitantly diminished, which will, for many egoists, ultimately foster an uncritical, unthinking mass of obedient bodies vulnerable to political manipulation: when the ego is trammeled, so too is freedom ensnared, and without freedom ethics is removed from individual to collective or government responsibility.
Egoists also reject the insight into personal motivation that others – whether they are psychological or sociological “experts” – declare they possess, and which they may accordingly fine-tune or encourage to “better ends.” Why an individual acts remains an intrinsically personal and private act that is the stuff of memoirs and literature, but how they should act releases our investigations into ethics of what shall define the good for the self-regarding agent.
Last updated: August 7, 2005 | Originally published: