The concept of emanation is that all derived or secondary things proceed or flow from the more primary. It is distinguished from the doctrine of creation by its elimination of a definite will in the first cause, from which all things are made to emanate according to natural laws and without conscious volition. It differs from the theory of formation at the hands of a supreme artisan who finds his matter ready to his hand, in teaching that all things, whether actually or only apparently material, flow from the primal principle. Unlike evolution, again, which includes the entire principle of the world, material and spiritual, in the process of development, emanation holds to the immutability of the first principle as to both quality and quantity, and also in the tendency of the development evolution implying one which goes from less to more perfect, while emanation involves a series of descending stages.
In the Upanishads of the Veda several passages which point, if obscurely, to this doctrine. One frequently quoted passage asserts that “From this Atman originated space, and from space the wind, and from the wind the fire, and from fire water, and from water the earth, and from the earth plants, and from plants food, and from food the seed of man, and from the seed of man himself.” This, however, does not clearly assert an emanation, but merely marks the stages of descent that separate man from the Atman. Attempts have often been made to derive the Gnostic doctrine of emanation from the Zoroastrian Avesta, but with doubtful success. Even if we may assume another higher power antecedent to the two hostile powers set forth in this dualistic system and comprising them both, still the independence of these two, as well as of the angels or half-divine beings who surround them, is not clearly asserted as owing to their emanation from the primal principle. In the ancient Egyptian religion, in which polytheism early appeared, there is no question of either emanation or evolution. In Greek philosophy emanations (aporrhoiai) occur at an early period, as in Empedocles, who accounts for sensual perceptions as emanations or effluxes proceeding from the objects perceived. Similarly Democritus spoke of effluxes of atoms from the thing perceived, by which images (eidola) are produced, which strike our senses. But these views do not come under the general head of emanation, since they do not touch the origin of the atoms. Nor does the teaching of the Hylozoists, like Heraclitus, with his doctrine of the transformation of all things into fire, and then of fire into all other things. The same is true of the Stoics; some of the later ones, like Marcus Aurelius, speak of the soul as an aporrhoia of God, but this means a part of God, not an emanation from an undiminished source. The first real mention of the doctrine in Greek or Hellenistic philosophy is in the Wisdom of Solomon, where wisdom is described as ” the breath of the power of God, and a pure influence (aporrhoia) flowing from the glory of the Almighty.” These and the following expressions may, indeed, be poetical, not involving a personification of wisdom apart from the Godhead; but the way in which wisdom is spoken of throughout the book makes for the conception of an independent cosmic power which is an efflux from the Godhead.
The doctrine of emanation is a little more explicit in Philo, though he does not teach it clearly and consciously, still less purely and logically. It assumes its most definite form for Greek philosophy in the works of the Neoplatonists — though their speculations are largely derived from the Gnostic mythological systems of Basilides and Valentinus, in which emanation played a prominent part. According to Basilides, a whole series of eons emanated in successive stages from the unbegotten Father; and the Valentinians spoke of the primal essence as “throwing off ” (proballein), without diminution, that which was derived from it. In the Neoplatonist system, the highest principle, the One, overflows without a conscious act, merely by a law of its nature, losing nothing of its fullness and this process has no end in time. It goes from more perfect to less perfect, and the ineffable Unity is the source of all plurality. The Nous (intellect), the first stage in the process, thinks, and thus from it emanate the soul and the logos (word). So the process goes on until the lowest stage is reached in essenceless matter. The notion of emanation was frequently used by the early Christian writers in the attempt to express the relation of the Son and the Holy Spirit to the Father. The idea is similarly used by Athenagoras, Origen, and Arnobius- Tertullian even ventures to employ the Valentinian term probola for the relation of the Son to the Father, while repudiating the separation which Valentinus had taught between his eons. In the final establishment of the Trinitarian doctrine the idea of emanation undoubtedly played a part, as in the emphasis laid upon the Son’s being ” begotten, not made ” (Nicene Creed), and the ” procession” of the Holy Ghost; but the idea of descent to imperfection is lacking.
A common misunderstanding regards Dionysius the Areopagite as of importance in the history of the doctrine of emanation. He does teach an efflux from God; but the heavenly hierarchy, with its various grades of perfection, does not arise by an emanation of one from the other; all have their origin directly from God, or the Highest Good. Erigena, referring much of his doctrine to Dionysius, makes use of a kind of creation which resembles the Neoplatonist emanation. His world ofcausoe primordiales is eternal, though not with God’s eternity, but eternally created by or proceeding from God. Creation is a process through these to the visible and invisible creatures; it too is eternal; God is in the creation, and the creation in God. From Erigena the custom passed over to scholasticism of considering creation as a sort of emanation; but in the passage of Thomas Aquinas most frequently quoted in this connection (I., qu. xlv., art. 1) the specific character of emanation is so weakened as to be perceptible only in the fact that he does not draw a sharp dividing line between God and his powers and the world. In the mystics, despite their connection with scholasticism, the doctrine of emanation can scarcely be discovered in its pure form. But in the Jewish Cabala the emanationistic origin of the world is distinctly taught; the connection with Christian Gnosticism, with the Neoplatonists, and with Dionysius is evident. With the founders of modern metaphysics, Descartes and Spinoza, emanation plays no prominent part; but the logicians of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries make use of the term causa emanative in contradistinction to causa activa. It is also found in Leibniz’s conception of the relation between God and single monads; God is the primal unity, the monas primitive, which produces the created and derived monads.
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Last updated: April 13, 2001 | Originally published: April/13/2001
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