If we were pressed to give a definition of emergence, we could say that a property is emergent if it is a novel property of a system or an entity that arises when that system or entity has reached a certain level of complexity and that, even though it exists only insofar as the system or entity exists, it is distinct from the properties of the parts of the system from which it emerges. However, as will become apparent, things are not so simple because “emergence” is a term used in different ways both in science and in philosophy, and how it is to be defined is a substantive question in itself.
The term “emergence” comes from the Latin verb emergo which means to arise, to rise up, to come up or to come forth. The term was coined by G. H. Lewes in Problems of Life and Mind (1875) who drew the distinction between emergent and resultant effects.
Effects are resultant if they can be calculated by the mere addition or subtraction of causes operating together, as with the weight of an object, when one can calculate its weight merely by adding the weights of the parts that make it up. Effects are emergent if they cannot be thus calculated, because they are qualitatively novel compared to the causes from which they emerge. For Lewes, examples of such emergent effects are mental properties that emerge from neural processes yet are not properties of the parts of the neural processes from which they emerge. In Lewes’ work, three essential features of emergence are laid out. First, that emergentism is a theory about the structure of the natural world; and, consequently, it has ramifications concerning the unity of science. Second, that emergence is a relation between properties of an entity and the properties of its parts. Third, that the question of emergence is related to the question of the possibility of reduction. These three features will structure this article's discussion of emergence.
The group of emergentists that Brian McLaughlin (1992) has dubbed the “British emergentists” were the first to make emergence the core of a comprehensive philosophical position in the second half of the nineteenth century and the beginning of the twentieth century. A central question at that time was whether life, mind and chemical bonding could be given a physical explanation and, by extension, whether special sciences such as psychology and biology were reducible to more “basic”’ sciences and, eventually, to physics. Views were divided between the reductionist mechanists and the anti-reductionist vitalists. The mechanists claimed that the properties of an organism are resultant properties that can be fully explained, actually or in principle, in terms of the properties and relations of its parts. The vitalists claimed that organic matter differs fundamentally from inorganic matter and that what accounts for the properties of living organisms is not the arrangement of their constitutive physical and chemical parts, but some sort of entelechy or spirit. In this debate the emergentists proposed a middle way in which, against the mechanists, the whole is more than just the sum and arrangement of its parts yet, against the vitalists, without anything being added to it “from the outside”—that is, there is no need to posit any mysterious intervening entelechy to explain irreducible emergent properties.
Though the views of the British emergentists differ in their details we can generally say they were monists regarding objects or substances in as much as the world is made of fundamentally one kind of thing, matter. However, they also held that at different levels of organization and complexity matter exhibits different properties that are novel relative to the lower levels of organization from which they emerged and this makes the emergentist view one of property dualism (or pluralism). It should also be noted that the British emergentists identified their view as a naturalist position firstly because whether something is emergent or not is to be established or rejected by empirical evidence alone, and secondly because no extra-natural powers, entelechies, souls and so forth are used in emergentist explanations. The main texts of this tradition of the so-called “British emergentists” are J. S. Mill’s System of Logic, Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, C. Lloyd Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and C. D. Broad’s The Mind and its Place in Nature. Beyond these emergentists, traditional brands of emergentism can be found in the work of R. W. Sellars (1922), A. Lovejoy (1927), Roger Sperry (1980, 1991), Karl Popper and John Eccles (1977) and Michael Polanyi (1968).
Though he did not use the term ‘emergence,’ it was Mill’s System of Logic (1843) that marked the beginning of British emergentism.
Mill distinguished between two modes of what he called “the conjoint action of causes,” the mechanical and the chemical. In the mechanical mode the effect of a group of causes is nothing more than the sum of the effects that each individual cause would have were it acting alone. Mill calls the principle according to which the whole effect is the sum of the effects of its parts the “principle of composition of causes” and illustrates it by reference to the vector sum of forces. The effects thus produced in the mechanical mode are called “homopathic effects” and they are subject to causal “homopathic laws.” Mill contrasts the mechanical mode with the chemical mode in which the principle of composition of causes does not hold. In the chemical mode causal effects are not additive but, instead, they are “heteropathic” which means that the conjoint effect of different causes is different from the sum the effects the causes would have in isolation. The paradigmatic examples of such effects were, for Mill, the products of chemical reactions which have different properties and effects than those of the individual reactants. Take, for example a typical substitution reaction:
Zn + 2HCl → ZnCl2 + H2.
In such a reaction zinc reacts with hydrogen chloride and replaces the hydrogen in the latter to produce effects that are more than just the sum of the parts that came together at the beginning of the reaction. The newly formed zinc chloride has properties that neither zinc nor hydrogen chloride possess separately.
Mill’s heteropathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ emergent effects, whereas homopathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ resultants. Heteropathic effects are subject, according to Mill, to causal “heteropathic” laws which, though now relative to the laws of the levels from which they emerged, do not counteract them. Such laws are found in the special sciences such as chemistry, biology and psychology.
In Space, Time and Deity (1920), Samuel Alexander built a complex metaphysical system that has been subject to a number of different interpretations. As we shall see, Alexander in effect talks of different levels of explanation as opposed to the more robust ontological emergence we find in the works of the other British emergentists.
According to Alexander, all processes are physico-chemical processes but as their complexity increases they give rise to emergent qualities that are distinctive of the new complex configurations. These are subject to special laws that are treated by autonomous special sciences that give higher-order explanations of the behavior of complex configurations. One kind of such emergent qualities is mental qualities (others are biological and chemical qualities). Since for Alexander all processes are physico-chemical processes, mental processes are identical to neural processes. However Alexander claims that mental qualities are distinctive of higher-order configurations. Furthermore, Alexander claims, mental qualities are not epiphenomenal. A neural process that lost its mental qualities would not be the same process because it is in virtue of its mental qualities that the “nervous”—neural—process has the character and effects that it has. So though emergent qualities are co-instantiated in one instance in a physico-chemical process, they are distinct from that process due to their novel causal powers.
Alexander also holds that emergent qualities and their behavior cannot be deduced even by a Laplacean calculator from knowledge of the qualities and laws of the lower—physiological—order. To be precise, though a Laplacean calculator could predict all physical processes (and hence all mental processes, since mental processes are physical processes) he would not be able to predict the emergent qualities of those events because their configuration, though being in its entirety physico-chemical, exhibits different behavior from the kind the physico-chemical sciences are concerned with and this behavior is, in turn, captured by emergent laws. Hence the emergence of such qualities should be taken as a brute empirical fact that can be given no explanation and should be accepted with “natural piety”. However it should be noted here that Alexander leaves open the possibility that, if chemical properties were to be reduced without residue to physico-chemical processes, then they would not be emergent, and he adds that the same holds for mental properties.
In Emergent Evolution (1923) (and subsequently in Life, Spirit and Mind  and The Emergence of Novelty ) the biologist C. Lloyd Morgan introduced the notion of emergence into the notion of the process of evolution and maintained that in the course of evolution new properties and behaviors emerge (like life, mind and reflective thought) that cannot be predicted from the already existing entities they emerged from. Taking off from Mill and Lewes, Morgan cites as the paradigmatic case of an emergent phenomenon the products of chemical reactions that are novel and unpredictable. These novel properties, moreover, are not merely epiphenomenal but bring about “a new kind of relatedness”—new lawful connections—that affects the “manner of go” of lower-level events in a way that would not occur had they been absent. Thus emergent properties are causally autonomous and have downward causal powers.
The last major work in the British emergentist tradition and, arguably, the historical foundation of contemporary discussions of emergence in philosophy, was C. D. Broad’s Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925).
Broad identified three possible answers to the question of how the properties of a complex system are related to the properties of its parts. The “component theory” of the vitalists, the reductive answer of the mechanists and the emergentist view that the behavior of the whole cannot in principle be deduced from knowledge of the parts and their arrangement. From this latter view—Broad's own—it follows that contrary to the mechanist’s view of the world as homogeneous throughout, reality is structured in aggregates of different order. Different orders in this sense exhibit different organizational complexity and the kinds that make up each order are made up of the kinds to be found in lower orders. This lack of unity is, in turn, reflected in the sciences, where there is a hierarchy with physics at the lower order and then ascending chemistry, biology and psychology—the subject matter of each being properties of different orders that are irreducible to properties of the lower orders. According to Broad these different orders are subject to different kinds of laws: trans-ordinal laws that connect properties of adjacent orders and intra-ordinal laws that hold between properties within the same order. Trans-ordinal laws, Broad writes, cannot be deduced from intra-ordinal laws and principles that connect the vocabularies of the two orders between which they hold; trans-ordinal laws are irreducible to intra-ordinal laws and, as such, are fundamental emergent laws—they are metaphysical brute facts.
Broad considered the question whether a trans-ordinal law is emergent to be an empirical question. Though he considered the behavior of all chemical compounds irreducible and thus emergent, he admitted, like Alexander, that if one day it is reduced to the physical characteristics of the chemical compound’s components it will not then count as emergent. However, unlike Alexander, he did not consider the same possible concerning the phenomenal experiences that “pure”—secondary—qualities of objects cause in us. Broad calls trans-ordinal laws that hold between physical properties and secondary qualities “trans-physical laws”. Though he is willing to grant that it could turn out that we mistakenly consider some trans-ordinal laws to be emergent purely on the basis of our incomplete knowledge, trans-physical laws are necessarily emergent—we could never have formed the concept of blue, no matter how much knowledge we had of colors, unless we had experienced it. Broad puts forward an a priori argument to this effect that can be seen as a precursor of the knowledge argument against physicalism. These qualities, he says, could not have been predicted even by a “mathematical archangel” who knows everything there is to know about the structure and working of the physical world and can perform any mathematical calculation—they are in principle irreducible, only inductively predictable and hence emergent.
In this we see that Broad’s emergentism concerning the phenomenal experience of secondary qualities is not epistemological (as is sometimes suggested by his writings) but is a consequence of an ontological distinction of properties. That is, the impossibility of prediction which he cites as a criterion of emergence is a consequence of the metaphysical structure of the world; the “mathematical archangel” could not have predicted emergent properties not because of complexity or because of limits to what can be expressed by lower-level concepts, but because emergent facts and laws are brute facts or else are laws that are in principle not reductively explainable.
Beginning in the late 1920’s, advances in science such as the explanation of chemical bonding by quantum mechanics and the development of molecular biology put an end to claims of emergence in chemistry and biology and thus marked the beginning of the fall of the emergentist heyday and the beginning of an era of reductionist enthusiasm. However, beginning with Putnam’s arguments for multiple realizability in the 1960’s, Davidson’s anomalous monism of the psychophysical and Fodor’s argument for the autonomy of the special sciences, the identity theory and reductionism were dealt a severe blow. Today, within a predominant anti-reductivist monist climate, emergentism has reappeared in complex systems theory, cognitive science and the philosophy of mind.
Because emergent properties are novel properties, there are different conceptions of what counts as emergent depending on how novelty is understood, and this is reflected in the different ways the concept of emergence is used in the philosophy of mind and in the natural and cognitive sciences. To capture this difference, David Chalmers (2006) drew the distinction between weak and strong emergence. A different distinction has been drawn by O’Connor and Wong (2002) between epistemological and ontological emergence, but this can be incorporated into the distinction between weak and strong emergence becasue ultimately both differentiate between an epistemological emergence couched in terms of higher and lower-level explanations or descriptions and a robust ontological difference between emergent and non-emergent phenomena. Beyond this, accounts of emergence differ in whether novelty is understood as occurring over time or whether it is a phenomenon restricted to a particular time. This difference is meant to be captured in the distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.
The metaphysically interesting aspect of emergence is the question of what it takes for there to be genuinely distinct things. In other words, the question is whether a plausible metaphysical distinction can be made between things that are “nothing over and above” what constitutes them and those things that are “something over and above” their constituent parts. The notion of strong emergence that is predominant in philosophy is meant to capture this ontological distinction that was part of the initial motivation of the British emergentists and which is lacking in discussions of weak emergence.
Though a phenomenon is often said to be strongly emergent because it is not deducible from knowledge of the lower-level domain from which it emerged—as was the case for C.D. Broad—what distinguishes the thesis of strong emergence from a thesis only about our epistemological predicament is that this non-deducibility is in principle a consequence of an ontological distinction. The question then is what sort of novelty must a property exhibit in order for it to be strongly emergent?
Even reductive physicalists can agree that a property can be novel to a whole even though it is nothing more than the sum of the related properties of the parts of the whole. For instance, a whole weighs as much as the sum of the weights of its parts, yet the weight of the whole is not something that its parts share. In this sense resultant systemic properties, like weight, are novel but not in the sense required for them to be strongly emergent. Also, numerical novelty, the fact that a property is instantiated for the first time, is not enough to make it strongly emergent for, again, that would make many resultant properties emergent, like the first time a specific shape or mass is instantiated in nature.
For this reason the criterion often cited as essential for the ontological autonomy of strong emergents (along with in principle irreducibility or non-deducibility) is causal novelty. That is, the basic tenet of strong emergentism is that at a certain level of physical complexity novel properties appear that are not shared by the parts of the object they emerge from, that are ontologically irreducible to the more fundamental matter from which they emerge and that contribute causally to the world. That is, emergent properties have new downward causal powers that are irreducible to the causal powers of the properties of their subvenient or subjacent (to be more etymologically correct) base. Ontological emergentism is therefore typically committed not only to novel fundamental properties but also to fundamental emergent laws as was the case with the British emergentists who, with the exception of Alexander, were all committed to downward causation—that is, causation from macroscopic levels to microscopic levels. (It should be noted also that this ontological autonomy of emergents implies the existence of irreducible special sciences.) Thus Timothy O’Connor (1994) defines strong emergent properties as properties that supervene on properties of the parts of a complex object, that are not shared by any of the objects parts, are distinct from any structural property of the complex, and that have downward causal influence on the behavior of the complex’s parts.
However, though downward causal powers are commonly cited along with irreducibility as a criterion for strong emergence, there is no consensus regarding what is known as “Alexander’s dictum” (that is, that for something to be real it must have causal powers) and hence not everyone agrees that strong emergentism requires downward causation. For example, David Chalmers (2006) who is neutral on the question of epiphenomenalism, does not take downward causation to be an essential feature of emergentism. Rather, Chalmers defines a high-level phenomenon as strongly emergent when it is systematically determined by low-level facts but nevertheless truths concerning that phenomenon are in principle not deducible from truths in the lower-level domain. The question is posed by Chalmers in terms of conceptual entailment failure. That is, emergent phenomena are nomologically but not logically supervenient on lower-level facts and therefore novel fundamental laws are needed to connect properties of the two domains.
A different approach is offered by Tim Crane (2001, 2010) who bases his account of strong emergence on the distinction between two kinds of reduction: (1) ontological reduction, which identifies entities in one domain with those in another, more fundamental one, and (2) explanatory reduction: that is, a relation that holds between theories aimed at understanding phenomena of one level of reality in terms of a “lower” level. In other words, one theory, T2, is explanatorily reduced to another, T1, when theory T1 sheds light on the phenomena treated in T2; that is, shows from within theory T1 why T2 is true. Crane argues that the difference between strong emergentism and non-reductive physicalism lies in their respective attitude to reduction: though both non-reductive physicalism and emergentism deny ontological reduction, non-reductive physicalism requires explanatory reduction (at least in principle) whereas the distinguishing feature of emergentism is that it denies explanatory reduction and is committed to an explanatory gap. Crane argues that if you have supervenience with in-principle irreducibility and downward causation then you have dependence without explanatory reduction and, hence, strong emergence.
Weak emergence is the kind of emergence that is common in the early twenty-first century primarily (though not exclusively) in cognitive science, complex system theory and, generally, scientific discussions of emergence in which the notions of complexity, functional organization, self-organization and non-linearity are central. The core of this position is that a property is emergent if it is a systemic property of a system—a property of a system that none if its smaller parts share—and it is unpredictable or unexpected given the properties and the laws governing the lower-level, more fundamental, domain from which it emerged. Since weak emergence is defined in terms of unpredictability or unexpectedness, it is an epistemological rather than a metaphysical notion. Commonly cited examples of such weak emergent phenomena range from emergent patterns in cellular automata and systemic properties of connectionist networks to phase transitions, termite organization, traffic jams, the flocking patterns of birds, and so on.
Weak emergence is compatible with reduction since a phenomenon may be unpredictable yet also reducible. For instance, processes comprised of many parts may fall under strict deterministic laws yet be unpredictable due to the unforeseeable consequences of minute initial conditions. And, as Chalmers (2006) argues, weak emergence is also compatible with deducibility of the emergent phenomenon from its base, as for instance, in cellular automata in which though higher-level patterns may be unexpected they are in principle deducible given the initial state of the base entities and the basic rules governing the lower level.
Mario Bunge’s “rational emergentism” (1977) is a form of weak emergence according to which emergent properties are identified with systemic properties that none of the parts of the system share and that are reducible to the parts of the system and their organization. Bunge identifies his view as an emergentism of sorts because he claims that, unlike reductionist mechanism it appreciates the novelty of systemic properties. In addition, he thinks of novelty as having a reductive explanation. He calls this “rational” emergence.
William Wimsatt (2000) also defends an account according to which emergence is compatible with reduction. Wimsatt defines emergence negatively as the failure of aggregativity; aggregativity is the state in which “the whole is nothing more than the sum of its parts” in which, that is, systemic properties are the result of the component parts of a system rather than their organization. Contrasting emergence to aggregativity, Wimsatt defines a systemic property as emergent relative to the properties of the parts of a system if the property is dependent on their mode of organization (and is also context-sensitive) rather than solely on the system’s composition. He argues that, in fact, it is aggregativity which is very rare in nature, while emergence is a common phenomenon (even if in different degrees).
Robert Batterman (2002), who focuses on emergence in physics, also believes that emergent phenomena are common in our everyday experience of the physical world. According to Batterman, what is at the heart of the question of emergence is not downward causation or the distinctness of emergent properties, but rather inter-theoretic reduction and, specifically, the limits of the explanatory power of reducing theories. Thus, a property is emergent, according to this view, if it is a property of a complex system at limit values that cannot be derived from lower level, more fundamental theories. As examples of emergent phenomena Batterman cites phase transitions and transitions of magnetic materials from ferromagnetic states to paramagnetic states, phenomena in which novel behavior is exhibited that cannot be reductively explained by the more fundamental theories of statistical mechanics. However, Batterman wants to distinguish explanation from reduction and so claims that though emergent phenomena are irreducible they are not unexplainable per se because they can have non-reductive explanations.
More recently Mark Bedau (1997, 2007, 2008) has argued that the characteristic of weak emergence is that, though macro-phenomena of complex systems are in principle ontologically and causally reducible to micro-phenomena, their reductive explanation is intractably complex, save by derivation through simulation of the system’s microdynamics and external conditions. In other words, though macro-phenomena are explainable in principle in terms of micro-phenomena, these explanations are incompressible, in the sense that they can only be had by “crawling the micro-causal web”—by aggregating and iterating all local micro-interactions over time. Bedau argues that this is the only kind of real emergence and champions what he calls the “radical view” of emergence according to which emergence is a common phenomenon that applies to all novel macro-properties of systems. (He contrasts this to what he calls the “sparse view” which he characterizes as the view that emergence is a rare phenomenon found only in “exotic” phenomena such as consciousness that are beyond the scope of normal science.) However, though this is a weak kind of emergence in that it denies any strong form of downward causation and it involves reducibility of the macro to the micro (even if only in principle), Bedau denies that weak emergence is merely epistemological, or merely “in the mind” since explanations of weak emergent phenomena are incompressible because they reflect the incompressible nature of the micro-causal structure of reality which is an objective feature of complex systems.
Andy Clark (1997, 2001) also holds a weak emergentist view according to which emergent phenomena need not be restricted to unpredictable or unexplainable phenomena but are, instead, systemic phenomena of complex dynamical systems that are the products of collective activity. Clark distinguishes four kinds of emergence. First, emergence as collective self-organization (a system becomes more organized due solely to the collective effects of the local interaction of its parts, such as flocking patterns of birds, or due to the collective effects of its parts and the environment, such as termite nest building). Second, emergence as unprogrammed functionality, that is, emergent behavior that arises from repeated interaction of an agent with the environment, such as wall-following behavior in “veer and bounce” robots (Clark, 1997). Third, emergence as interactive complexity in which effects, patterns or capacities of a system emerge resulting from complex, cyclic interaction of its components. For example, Bénard and Couette convection cells that result from a repetitive cycle of movement caused by differences in density within a fluid body in which the colder fluid forces the warmer fluid to rise until the latter loses enough heat to descend and cause the former fluid to rise again, and so on. And fourth, emergence as uncompressible unfolding (phenomena that cannot be predicted without simulation). All of these formulations of emergence are compatible with reducibility or in principle predictability and are thus forms of weak emergence. For Clark, emergence picks out the “distinctive way” in which factors conspire to bring about a property, event or pattern and it is “linked to the notion of what variables figure in a good explanation of the behavior of a system.” Thus, Clark’s notion of emergence in complex systems theory is explanatory in that it focuses on explanations in terms of collective variables, that is, variables that focus on higher-level features of complex dynamical systems that do not track properties of the components of the system but, instead, reflect the result of the interaction of multiple agents or their interaction with their environment.
Proponents of weak emergence do not support the strong notion of downward causation that is found in strong emergentist views but, instead, favor one in which higher-level causal powers of a whole can be explained by rules of interaction of its parts, such as feedback loops. Though this kind of view of emergence is predominant in the sciences, it is not exclusive to them. A form of weak emergence within philosophy that denies strong downward causation can be found in John Searle (1992). Searle allows for the existence of “causally emergent system features” such as liquidity, transparency and consciousness that are systemic features of a system that cannot be deduced or predicted from knowledge of causal interactions of lower levels. However, according to Searle, whatever causal effects such features exhibit can be explained by the causal relations of the systems parts, for example, in the case of consciousness, by the behavior and interaction of neurons.
If we make use, for more precision, of the distinction between ontological and explanatory reduction we can see that if we understand strongly emergent phenomena as both ontologically and explanatorily irreducible, as Crane (2010) does, then they are also weakly emergent. However, if strongly emergent phenomena are only ontologically irreducible they may still be, in principle, predictable. For example, even if you deny the identity of heat with mean kinetic energy (perhaps because of multiple realizability) a Laplacean demon could still predict a gas’ heat from the mean kinetic energy of its molecules with the use of “bridge laws” that link the two vocabularies. These bridge laws can be considered to be part of what Crane calls an explanatory reduction. So in such cases, strong emergence does not entail weak emergence. Also it should be noted that weak emergence does not entail strong emergence. A phenomenon can be unpredictable yet also ontologically reducible: perhaps for instance, because systemic properties are subject to indeterministic laws. So a case of weak emergence need not necessarily be a case of strong emergence.
Another distinction that is made concerning how novelty is understood is the distinction between synchronic and diachronic novelty. The former is novelty exhibited in the properties of a system vis-à-vis the properties of its constituent parts at a particular time; the latter is temporal novelty in the sense that a property or state is novel if it is instantiated for the first time. This distinction leads to distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.
In synchronic emergence, articulated by C. D. Broad and predominant in the philosophy of mind, the higher-level, emergent phenomena are simultaneously present with the lower-level phenomena from which they emerge. Usually this form of emergence is stated in terms of supervenience of mental phenomena on subvenient/subjacent neural structures, and so mental states or properties co-exist with states or properties at the neural level. Strong ontological emergence is thus usually understood to be synchronic, “vertical”, emergence. In contrast, diachronic emergence is “horizontal” emergence evolved through time in which the structure from which the novel property emerges exists prior to the emergent. This is typical of the weakly emergent states appealed to in discussions of complex systems, evolution, cosmology, artificial life, and so forth. It can be found in Searle (1992) since he views the relation of the emergent to its base as causal thus, at least in non-synchronic accounts of causation, excluding synchronic emergence.
Because diachronic emergence is emergence over time, novelty is understood in terms of unpredictability of states or properties of a system from past states of that system. And because weak emergence is typically defined in terms of unpredictability it is also usually identified with cases of diachronic emergence. In contrast, in synchronic emergence, which refers to the state of a system at a particular time, novelty revolves around the idea of irreducibility and thus synchronic emergence is usually identified with strong emergence. However, there are formulations of non-supervenience-based strong emergence that are causal and diachronic, such as O’Connor and Wong’s (2005). Note that synchronic emergence could be the result of diachronic emergence but is not entailed by it since, presumably, if God were to create the world exactly as it is in this moment, synchronically emergent phenomena would exist without them being diachronically emergent.
The British emergentists, and this is especially clear in the writing of C. D. Broad, thought that a necessary feature of emergentism is a relation of the kind we would today call supervenience. Supervenience is a relation of covariation between two sets of properties, subjacent/underlying properties and supervenient properties. Roughly, we say that a set of properties A supervenes on a set of properties B if and only if two things that differ with respect to A-properties will also differ with respect to B-properties. Today, because of the failure of successful reductions, especially in the case of the mental to the physical, and because the relation of supervenience per se doesn’t entail anything about the specific nature of the properties it relates, for example, whether they are distinct or not, it has been seen as a prima facie good candidate for a key feature of the relation between emergents and their subjacent base that can account for the distinctness and dependence of emergents while also adding the restriction of synchronicity. Jaegwon Kim (1999), James van Cleve (1990), Timothy O’Connor (1994), Brian McLaughlin (1997), David Chalmers (2006) and Paul Noordhof (2010) all take nomological strong supervenience to be a necessary feature of emergentism. (For present purposes, following Kim we can define strong supervenience thus: A-properties strongly supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2. Nomological supervenience restricts the range of possible worlds to those that conform to the natural laws).
However, not everyone agrees that the relation of strong supervenience is necessary for strong emergence. Some, like Crane (2001), argue that supervenience is not sufficient for emergence and other proponents of strong emergence have questioned that supervenience is even a necessary condition for emergence. For example, O’Connor (2000, 2003, O’Connor & Wong 2005) now supports a form of dynamical emergence which is causal and non-synchronic. A state of an entity is emergent, in this view, if it instantiates non-structural properties as a causal result of that object’s achieving a complex configuration. O’Connor’s view includes a strong notion of downward causation (and the denial of causal closure–roughly, the principle that all physical effects are entirely determined by, or have their chances entirely determined by, prior physical events) and the possibility that an emergent state can generate another emergent state.
Paul Humphreys (1996, 1997) has also offered an alternative account to supervenience-based emergence according to which emergence of properties is the diachronic result of fusion of lower-level properties, a phenomenon that Humphreys claims is common in the physical realm. That is, properties of the base are fused (thereby ceasing to exist) and give rise to new emergent properties with novel causal powers which are not made up of the old property instances—and, in this sense, the only real phenomenon is the emergent phenomenon. Humphreys offers as a paradigmatic example of such emergence quantum entanglement, in which a system can be in a definite state while its individual parts are not and in which the state of the system determines the states of its parts and not the other way around. It must be noted that Humphreys claims ignorance about whether this is what happens in the case of mental properties. Different formulations of non-supervenience-based emergence can be found in Silberstein and McGeever (1999) who have also argued for ontological emergence in quantum mechanics and, by extension, as a real feature of the natural world, as well as in Bickhard and Campbell’s (2000) “process model” of ontological emergence.
The most usually cited objection to strong emergence, initially formulated by Pepper (1926) and championed today by Jaegwon Kim (1999, 2005), concerns the novel (and downward) causal powers of emergent properties.
Kim’s formulation is based on three basic physicalist assumptions: (1) the principle of causal closure which Kim defines as the principle that if a physical event has a cause at t, then it has a physical cause at t, (2) the principle of causal exclusion according to which if an event e has a sufficient cause c at t, no event at t distinct from c can be the cause of e (unless this is a genuine case of causal over-determination), and (3) supervenience. Kim defines mind/body supervenience as follows: mental properties strongly supervene on physical/biological properties, that is, if any system s instantiates a mental property M at t, there necessarily exists a physical property P such that s instantiates P at t, and necessarily anything instantiating P at any time instantiates M at any time.
The gist of the problem is the following. In order for emergent mental properties to have causal powers (and thus to exist, according to what Kim has coined “Alexander’s dictum”) there must be some form of mental causation. However, if this is the case, the principle of causal closure is violated and emergence is in danger of becoming an incoherent position. If mental (and therefore downward) causation is denied and thus causal closure retained, emergent properties become merely epiphenomenal and in this case their existence is threatened.
More specifically, the argument is as follows. According to mind-body supervenience, every time a mental property M is instantiated it supervenes on a physical property P. Now suppose M appears to cause another mental property M¹, the question arises whether the cause of M¹ is indeed M or whether it is M¹’s subvenient/subjacent base P¹ (since according to supervenience M¹ is instantiated by a physical property P¹). Given causal exclusion, it cannot be both, and so, given the supervenience relation, it seems that M¹ occurs because P¹ occurred. Therefore, Kim argues, it seems that M actually causes M¹ by causing the subjacent P¹ and that mental to mental (same level) causation presupposes mental to physical (downward) causation. [Another, more direct, way to put this problem is whether the effect of M is really M¹ or M¹’s subjacent base P¹. I chose an alternative formulation in order for the problem to be more clear to the non-expert reader.] However, Kim continues, given causal closure, P¹ must have a sufficient physical cause P. But given exclusion again, P¹ cannot have two sufficient causes, M and P, and so P is the real cause of P¹ because, if M were the real cause then causal closure would be violated again. Therefore, given supervenience, causal closure and causal exclusion, mental properties are merely epiphenomenal. The tension here for the emergentist, the objection goes, is in the double requirement of supervenience and downward causation in that, on the one hand, we have upward determination and the principle of causal closure of the physical domain, and, on the other hand, we have causally efficacious emergent phenomena. In other words, Kim claims that what seem to be cases of emergent causation are just epiphenomena because ultimately the only way to instantiate an emergent property is to instantiate its base. So, saying that higher level properties are causally efficacious renders any form of non-reductive physicalism, under which Kim includes emergentism, at least implausible and at most incoherent.
Note that this is an objection leveled against cases of strong emergence because in cases of weak emergence that do not make any claims of ontological novelty the causal inheritance principle is preserved—the emergents' causal powers are inherited from the powers of their constitutive parts. For example, a flocking pattern of birds may affect the movement of the individual birds in it but that is nothing more than the effect of the aggregate of all the birds that make it up. Also, this argument applies to cases of supervenience-based emergence which retain base properties intact along with emergent properties, but accounts of emergence that are non-synchronic sidestep the problem of downward causation. So, Kim’s objection does not get off the ground as a retort to O’Connor’s dynamical emergence, Bickhard and Campbell’s process model, Silberstein and McGeever’s quantum mechanical emergence or Humphreys’ fusion emergence.
In the cases where this objection applies, there have been different responses. Philosophers who want to retain causal closure while also retaining emergent properties have tried to give modified accounts of strong emergence that deny either downward causation or the requirement that emergent properties have novel causal powers. For example, Shoemaker (2001) believes that what must be denied is not the principle of causal closure but, instead, that emergent properties have novel causal powers (the appearance of which he elsewhere attributes to “micro-latent” powers of lower-level entities). This approach, however, is problematic, since it seems to be a requirement for robust strong emergence that emergent properties are not merely epiphenomenal. Another approach has recently been proposed by Cynthia and Graham Macdonald (2010) who attempt to preserve causal closure and to show that it is compatible with emergence by building a metaphysics in which events can co-instantiate in a single instance mental and physical properties thus allowing for mental properties to have causal effects (a view that Peter Wyss (2010) has correctly pointed out is in some respects reminiscent of Samuel Alexander’s). In this schema, the Macdonalds argue, property instances do not belong to different levels (though properties do) and so the problem of downward causation is resolved because, in effect, there is no downward causation in the sense assumed by Kim’s argument (and causal efficacy for emergent and mental properties is preserved, they argue, since if a property has causally efficacious instances that means that the property itself has causal powers). However this view will also seem unsatisfactory to the strong emergentist who wants to retain a robust notion of emergent properties and downward causation.
Other philosophers who want to retain strong emergence have opted for rejecting causal closure instead. Such a line has been taken by Crane (2001), Hendry (2010) and Lowe (2000) who, however, subsequently offers an account of strong emergence compatible with causal closure (Lowe, 2003).
Kim’s supervenience argument is meant to question the very possibility of strongly emergent properties. However, even if strong emergence is possible, there is the further question of whether there are any actual cases of strong emergence in the world.
Brian McLaughlin (1992) who grants that the emergence of novel configurational forces is compatible with the laws of physics and that theories of emergence are coherent and consistent, has argued that there is “not a scintilla of evidence” that there are any real cases of strong emergence to be found in the world. This is a commonly cited objection to emergence readily espoused by reductive physicalists committed to the purely physical nature of all the phenomena that have at different times been called emergent and also raised by Mark Bedau who claims that though weak emergence is very common we have no evidence for cases of strong emergence.
Hempel and Oppenheim (1948) have argued that the unpredictability of emergent phenomena is theory-relative—that is, something is emergent only given the knowledge available at a given time—and does not reflect an ontological distinction. And Ernest Nagel (1960), agreeing that emergence is theory-relative, argued that it is a doctrine concerning “logical facts about formal relations between statements rather than any experimental or even ‘metaphysical’ facts about some allegedly ‘inherent’ traits of properties of objects.” According to these views, theoretical advance and accumulation of new knowledge will lead to the re-classification of what are today considered to be emergent phenomena, as happened with the case of life and chemical bonding of the British emergentists. However, though these objections can be construed as viable objections to some forms of weak emergence they fail to affect strong emergence (which was their target) because it is concerned with in principle unpredictability as a result of irreducibility.
Though this skepticism is shared by a few, some philosophers believe that though strong emergence may be rare, it does exist. Bickhard and Campbell (2000), Silvester and McGeever (1999) and Humphreys (1997) claim that ontological emergence can be found (at least) in quantum mechanics—an interesting proposal, and somewhat ironic given that it was advances in quantum physics in the early 20th century that was supposed to have struck the death blow to the British emergentist tradition. Predominantly, however, the usual candidates for strongly emergent properties are mental properties (phenomenal and/or intentional) that continue to resist any kind of reduction. Chalmers (2006)—because of the explanatory gap—considers consciousness to be the only possible intrinsically strongly emergent phenomenon in nature while O’Connor (2000) has argued that our experience of free will which is, in effect, macroscopic control of behavior, seems to be irreducible and hence strongly suggests that human agency may be strongly emergent. (Stephan (2010) also sees free will as a candidate for a strongly emergent property.)
Another line of response is taken by E. J. Lowe (2000) according to whom emergent mental causes could be in principle out of reach of the physiologist, and so it should not come as a surprise that physical science has not discovered them. Lowe argues that, even if we grant that every physical event has a sufficient immediate physical cause, it is plausible that a mental event could have caused the physical event to have that physical cause. That is not to say that the mental event caused the physical event that caused the physical effect; rather, the mental event linked the two physical events so the effect was jointly caused by a mental and a physical event. Such a case, Lowe argues, would be indistinguishable from the point of view of physiological science from a case in which causal closure held.
Following this line of thought it can be argued that though we do not have actual empirical proof that emergent properties exist, the right attitude to hold is to be open to the possibility of their existence. That is, given that there is no available physiological account of how mental states can cause physical states (or how they can be identical), while at the same time having everyday evidence that they do, as well as a plausible mental—psychological or folk psychological—explanation for it, we have independent grounds to believe that emergent properties could possibly exist.
Naval Staff and Command College
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