Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803—1882)

emersonIn his lifetime, Ralph Waldo Emerson became the most widely known man of letters in America, establishing himself as a prolific poet, essayist, popular lecturer, and an advocate of social reforms who was nevertheless suspicious of reform and reformers. Emerson achieved some reputation with his verse, corresponded with many of the leading intellectual and artistic figures of his day, and during an off and on again career as a Unitarian minister, delivered and later published a number of controversial sermons. Emerson’s enduring reputation, however, is as a philosopher, an aphoristic writer (like Friedrich Nietzsche) and a quintessentially American thinker whose championing of the American Transcendental movement and influence on Walt Whitman, Henry David Thoreau, William James, and others would alone secure him a prominent place in American cultural history. Transcendentalism in America, of which Emerson was the leading figure, resembled British Romanticism in its precept that a fundamental continuity exists between man, nature, and God, or the divine. What is beyond nature is revealed through nature; nature is itself a symbol, or an indication of a deeper reality, in Emerson’s philosophy. Matter and spirit are not opposed but reflect a critical unity of experience. Emerson is often characterized as an idealist philosopher and indeed used the term himself of his philosophy, explaining it simply as a recognition that plan always precedes action. For Emerson, all things exist in a ceaseless flow of change, and “being” is the subject of constant metamorphosis. Later developments in his thinking shifted the emphasis from unity to the balance of opposites: power and form, identity and variety, intellect and fate. Emerson remained throughout his lifetime the champion of the individual and a believer in the primacy of the individual’s experience. In the individual can be discovered all truths, all experience. For the individual, the religious experience must be direct and unmediated by texts, traditions, or personality. Central to defining Emerson’s contribution to American thought is his emphasis on non-conformity that had so profound an effect on Thoreau. Self-reliance and independence of thought are fundamental to Emerson’s perspective in that they are the practical expressions of the central relation between the self and the infinite. To trust oneself and follow our inner promptings corresponds to the highest degree of consciousness.

Emerson concurred with the German poet and philosopher Johann Wolfgang von Goethe that originality was essentially a matter of reassembling elements drawn from other sources. Not surprisingly, some of Emerson’s key ideas are popularizations of both European as well as Eastern thought. From Goethe, Emerson also drew the notion of “bildung,” or development, calling it the central purpose of human existence. From the English Romantic poet and critic Samuel Taylor Coleridge, Emerson borrowed his conception of “Reason,” which consists of acts of perception, insight, recognition, and cognition. The concepts of “unity” and “flux” that are critical to his early thought and never fully depart from his philosophy are basic to Buddhism: indeed, Emerson said, perhaps ironically, that “the Buddhist . . . is a Transcendentalist.” From his friend the social philosopher Margaret Fuller, Emerson acquired the perspective that ideas are in fact ideas of particular persons, an observation he would expand into his more general—and more famous—contention that history is biography.

On the other hand, Emerson’s work possesses deep original strains that influenced other major philosophers of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. The German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche read Emerson in German translations and his developing philosophy of the great man is clearly influenced and confirmed by the contact. Writing about the Greek philosopher Plato, Emerson asserted that “Every book is a quotation . . . and every man is a quotation,” a perspective that foreshadows the work of French Structuralist philosopher Roland Barthes. Emerson also anticipates the key Poststructuralist concept of différance found in the work of Jacques Derrida and Jacques Lacan—“It is the same among men and women, as among the silent trees; always a referred existence, an absence, never a presence and satisfaction.” While not progressive on the subject of race by modern standards, Emerson observed that the differences among a particular race are greater than the differences between the races, a view compatible with the social constructivist theory of race found in the work of contemporary philosophers like Kwame Appiah.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Major Works
  3. Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Ralph Waldo Emerson was born on May 25, 1803, in Boston to Ruth Haskins Emerson and William Emerson, pastor of Boston’s First Church. The cultural milieu of Boston at the turn of the nineteenth century would increasingly be marked by the conflict between its older conservative values and the radical reform movements and social idealists that emerged in the decades leading up through the 1840s. Emerson was one of five surviving sons who formed a supportive brotherhood, the financial and emotional leadership of which he was increasingly forced to assume over the years. “Waldo,” as Emerson was called, entered Harvard at age fourteen, taught in the summer, waited tables, and with his brother Edward, wrote papers for other students to pay his expenses. Graduating in the middle of his class, Emerson taught in his brother William’s school until 1825 when he entered the Divinity School at Harvard. The pattern of Emerson’s intellectual life was shaped in these early years by the range and depth of his extracurricular reading in history, literature, philosophy, and religion, the extent of which took a severe toll on his eyesight and health. Equally important to his intellectual development was the influence of his paternal aunt Mary Moody Emerson. Though she wrote primarily on religious subjects, Mary Moody Emerson set an example for Emerson and his brothers with her wide reading in every branch of knowledge and her stubborn insistence that they form opinions on all of the issues of the day. Mary Moody Emerson was at the same time passionately orthodox in religion and a lover of controversy, an original thinker tending to a mysticism that was a precursor to her nephew’s more radical beliefs. His aunt’s influence waned as he developed away from her strict orthodoxy, but her relentless intellectual energy and combative individualism left a permanent stamp on Emerson as a thinker.

In 1829, he accepted a call to serve as junior pastor at Boston’s Second Church, serving only until 1832 when he resigned at least in part over his objections to the validity of the Lord’s Supper. Emerson would in 1835 refuse a call as minister to East Lexington Church but did preach there regularly until 1839. In 1830, Emerson married Ellen Tucker who died the following year of tuberculosis. Emerson married again in 1835 to Lydia Jackson. Together they had four children, the eldest of whom, Waldo, died at the age of five, an event that left deep scars on the couple and altered Emerson’s outlook on the redemptive value of suffering. Emerson’s first book Nature was published anonymously in 1836 and at Emerson’s own expense. In 1837 Emerson delivered his famous “American Scholar” lecture as the Phi Beta Kappa address at Harvard, but his controversial Harvard Divinity School address, delivered in 1838, was the occasion of a twenty-nine year breach with the university and signaled his divergence from even the liberal theological currents of Cambridge. Compelled by financial necessity to undertake a career on the lecture circuit, Emerson began lecturing in earnest in 1839 and kept a demanding public schedule until 1872. While providing Emerson’s growing family and array of dependents with a steady income, the lecture tours heightened public awareness of Emerson’s ideas and work. From 1840-1844, Emerson edited The Dial with Margaret Fuller. Essays: First Series was published in 1841, followed by Essays: Second Series in 1844, the two volumes most responsible for Emerson’s reputation as a philosopher. In 1844, Emerson also purchased the land on the shore of Walden Pond where he was to allow the naturalist and philosopher Henry David Thoreau to build a cabin the following year. While sympathetic to the experimental collective at Brook Farm, Emerson declined urgent appeals to join the group and maintained his own household in Concord with Lydia and their growing family. Emerson attempted to create his own community of kindred spirits, however, assembling in the neighborhood of Concord a group of writers including Thoreau, Nathaniel Hawthorne, the social thinker Margaret Fuller, the reformer Bronson Alcott, and the poet Ellery Channing. English Traits was inspired by a trip to Britain during 1847-1848. By the 1850s, Emerson was an outspoken advocate of abolition in lectures across New England and the Midwest and continued lecturing widely on a number of different topics—eighty lectures in 1867 alone. Emerson spent the final years of his life peacefully but without full use of his faculties. He died of pneumonia in 1882 at his home in Concord.

2. Major Works

As a philosopher, Emerson primarily makes use of two forms, the essay and the public address or lecture. His career began, however, with a short book, Nature, published anonymously in 1836. Nature touches on many of the ideas to which he would return to again and again over his lifetime, most significantly the perspective that nature serves as an intermediary between human experience and what lies beyond nature. Emerson expresses a similar idea in his claim that spirit puts forth nature through us, exemplary of which is the famous “transparent eye-ball” passage, in which he writes that on a particular evening, while “crossing a bare common . . . the currents of Universal Being circulate through me.” On the strength this passage alone, Nature has been widely viewed as a defining text of Transcendentalism, praised and satirized for the same qualities. Emerson invokes the “transparent eye-ball” to describe the loss of individuation in the experience of nature, where there is no seer, only seeing: “I am nothing; I see all.” This immersion in nature compensates us in our most difficult adversity and provides a sanctification of experience profoundly religious —the direct religious experience that Emerson was to call for all his life. While Emerson characterizes traversing the common with mystical language, it is also importantly a matter of knowledge. The fundamental knowledge of nature that circulates through him is the basis of all human knowledge but cannot be distinguished, in Emerson’s thought, from divine understanding.

The unity of nature is the unity of variety, and “each particle is a microcosm.” There is, Emerson writes “a universal soul” that, influenced by Coleridge, he named “reason.” Nature is by turns exhortative and pessimistic, like the work of the English Romantics, portraying man as a creature fallen away from a primordial connection with nature. Man ought to live in a original relation to the universe, an assault on convention he repeats in various formulas throughout his life; however, “man is the dwarf of himself . . . is disunited with himself . . . is a god in ruins.” Nature concludes with a version of Emerson’s permanent program, the admonition to conform your life to the “pure idea in your mind,” a prescription for living he never abandons.

“The American Scholar” and “The Divinity School Address” are generally held to be representative statements of Emerson’s early period. “The American Scholar,” delivered as the Phi Beta Kappa oration at Harvard in 1837, repeats a call for a distinctively American scholarly life and a break with European influences and models—a not original appeal in the 1830s. Emerson begins with a familiar critique of American and particularly New England culture by asserting that Americans were “a people too busy to give to letters any more.” What must have surprised the audience was his anti-scholarly theme, that “Books are for the scholar’s idle times,” an idea that aligns the prodigiously learned and widely read Emerson with the critique of excessive bookishness found in Wordsworth and English Romanticism. Continuing in this theme, Emerson argues against book knowledge entirely and in favor of lived experience: “Only so much do I know, as I have lived.” Nature is the most important influence on the mind, he told his listeners, and it is the same mind, one mind, that writes and reads. Emerson calls for both creative writing and “creative reading,” individual development being essential for the encounter with mind found in books. The object of scholarly culture is not the bookworm but “Man Thinking,” Emerson’s figure for an active, self-reliant intellectual life that thus puts mind in touch with Mind and the “Divine Soul.” Through this approach to the study of letters, Emerson predicts that in America “A nation of men will for the first time exist.”

“The Divinity School Address,” also delivered at Harvard in 1838, was considerably more controversial and marked in earnest the beginning of Emerson’s opposition to the climate of organized religion in his day, even the relatively liberal theology of Cambridge and the Unitarian Church. Emerson set out defiantly to insist on the divinity of all men rather than one single historical personage, a position at odds with Christian orthodoxy but one central to his entire system of thought. The original relation to nature Emerson insisted upon ensures an original relation to the divine, not copied from the religious experience of others, even Jesus of Nazareth. Emerson observes that in the universe there is a “justice” operative in the form of compensation: “He who does a good deed is instantly ennobled.” This theme he would develop powerfully into a full essay, “Compensation” (1841). Whether Emerson characterized it as compensation, retribution, balance, or unity, the principle of an automatic response to all human action, good or ill, was a permanent fixture of his thought. “Good is positive,” he argued to the vexation of many in the audience, “evil merely privative, not absolute.” Emerson concludes his address with a subversive call to rely on one’s self, to “go alone; to refuse the good models.”

Two of Emerson’s first non-occasional public lectures from this early period contain especially important expressions of his thought. Always suspicious of reform and reformers, Emerson was yet an advocate of reform causes. In “Man the Reformer” (1841), Emerson expresses this ambivalence by speculating that if we were to “Let our affection flow out to our fellows; it would operate in a day the greatest of all revolutions.” In an early and partial formulation of his theory that all people, times, and places are essentially alike, he writes in “Lecture on the Times” (1841) that “The Times . . . have their root in an invisible spiritual reality;” then more fully in “The Transcendentalist” (1842): “new views . . . are not new, but the very oldest of thoughts cast into the mould of these new times.” Such ideas, while quintessential Emerson, are nevertheless positions that he would qualify and complicate over the next twenty years.

Emerson brought out his Essays: First Series, in 1841, which contain perhaps his single most influential work, “Self-Reliance.” Emerson’s style as an essayist, not unlike the form of his public lectures, operates best at the level of the individual sentence. His essays are bound together neither by their stated theme nor the progression of argument, but instead by the systematic coherence of his thought alone. Indeed, the various titles of Emerson’s do not limit the subject matter of the essays but repeatedly bear out the abiding concerns of his philosophy. Another feature of his rhetorical style involves exploring the contrary poles of a particular idea, similar to a poetic antithesis. As a philosopher-poet, Emerson employs a highly figurative style, while his poetry is remarkable as a poetry of ideas. The language of the essays is sufficiently poetical that Thoreau felt compelled to say critically of the essays—”they were not written exactly at the right crisis [to be poetry] though inconceivably near it.” In “History” Emerson attempts to demonstrate the unity of experience of men of all ages: “What Plato has thought, he may think; what a saint has felt, he may feel; what at any time has befallen any man, he may understand.” Interestingly, for an idealist philosopher, he describes man as “a bundle of relations.” The experience of the individual self is of such importance in Emerson’s conception of history that it comes to stand for history: “there is properly no history; only biography.” Working back from this thought, Emerson connects his understanding of this essential unity to his fundamental premise about the relation of man and nature: “the mind is one, and that nature is correlative.” By correlative, Emerson means that mind and nature are themselves representative, symbolic, and consequently correlate to spiritual facts. In the wide-ranging style of his essays, he returns to the subject of nature, suggesting that nature is itself a repetition of a very few laws, and thus implying that history repeats itself consistently with a few recognizable situations. Like the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard, Emerson disavowed nineteenth century notions of progress, arguing in the next essay of the book, “Society never advances . . . For everything that is given, something is taken.”

“Self-Reliance” is justly famous as a statement of Emerson’s credo, found in the title and perhaps uniquely among his essays, consistently and without serious digression throughout the work. The emphasis on the unity of experience is the same: “what is true for you in your private heart is true for all men.” Emerson rests his abiding faith in the individual—”Trust thyself”—on the fundamental link between each man and the divine reality, or nature, that works through him. Emerson wove this explicit theme of self-trust throughout his work, writing in “Heroism” (1841), “Self-trust is the essence of heroism.” The apostle of self-reliance perceived that the impulses that move us may not be benign, that advocacy of self-trust carried certain social risks. No less a friend of Emerson’s than Herman Melville parodied excessive faith in the individual through the portrait of Captain Ahab in his classic American novel, Moby-Dick. Nevertheless, Emerson argued that if our promptings are bad they come from our inmost being. If we are made thus we have little choice in any case but to be what we are. Translating this precept into the social realm, Emerson famously declares, “Whoso would be a man must be a nonconformist”—a point of view developed at length in both the life and work of Thoreau. Equally memorable and influential on Walt Whitman is Emerson’s idea that “a foolish consistency is the hobgoblin of small minds, adored by little statesmen and philosophers and divines.” In Leaves of Grass, Whitman made of his contradictions a virtue by claiming for himself a vastness of character that encompassed the vastness of the American experience. Emerson opposes on principle the reliance on social structures (civil, religious) precisely because through them the individual approaches the divine second hand, mediated by the once original experience of a genius from another age: “An institution,” as he explains, “is the lengthened shadow of one man.” To achieve this original relation one must “Insist on one’s self; never imitate” for if the relationship is secondary the connection is lost. “Nothing,” Emerson concludes, “can bring you peace but the triumph of principles,” a statement that both in tone and content illustrates the vocational drive of the former minister to speak directly to a wide audience and preach a practical philosophy of living.

Three years later in 1844 Emerson published his Essays: Second Series, eight essays and one public lecture, the titles indicating the range of his interests: “The Poet,” “Experience,” “Character,” “Manners,” “Gifts,” “Nature,” “Politics,” “Nominalist and Realist,” and “New England Reformers.” “The Poet” contains the most comprehensive statement on Emerson’s aesthetics and art. This philosophy of art has its premise in the Transcendental notion that the power of nature operates through all being, that it is being: “For we are not pans and barrows . . . but children of the fire, made of it, and only the same divinity transmuted.” Art and the products of art of every kind—poetry, sculpture, painting, and architecture—flow from the same unity at the root of all human experience. Emerson’s aesthetics stress not the object of art but the force that creates the art object, or as he characterizes this process in relation to poetry: “it is not metres, but a metre-making argument that makes a poem.” “The Poet” repeats anew the Emersonian dictum that nature is itself a symbol, and thus nature admits of being used symbolically in art. While Emerson does not accept in principle social progress as such, his philosophy emphasizes the progress of spirit, particularly when understood as development. This process he allies with the process of art: “Nature has a higher end . . . ascension, or the passage of the soul into higher forms.” The realm of art, ultimately for Emerson, is only an intermediary function, not an end itself: “Art is the path of the creator to his work.” On this and every subject, Emerson reveals the humanism at the core of his philosophy, his human centric perspective that posits the creative principle above the created thing. “There is a higher work for Art than the arts,” he argues in the essay “Art,” and that work is the full creative expression of human being. Nature too has this “humanism,” to speak figuratively, in its creative process, as he writes in “The Method of Nature:” “The universe does not attract us until housed in an individual.” Most notable in “The Poet” is Emerson’s call for an expressly American poetry and poet to do justice to the fact that “America is a poem in our eyes.” What is required is a “genius . . . with tyrannous eye, which knew the value of our incomparable materials” and can make use of the “barbarism and materialism of the times.” Emerson would not meet Whitman for another decade, only after Whitman had sent him anonymously a copy of the first edition of Leaves of Grass, in which—indicative of Emerson’s influence—Whitman self-consciously assumes the role of the required poet of America and asserts, like his unacknowledged mentor, that America herself is indeed a poem.

“Experience” remains one of Emerson’s best-known and often-anthologized essays. It is also an essay written out of the devastating grief that struck the Emerson household after the death of their five-year-old son, Waldo. He wrote, whether out of conviction or helplessness, “I grieve that grief can teach me nothing.” Emerson goes on, rocking back and forth between resignation and affirmation, establishing along the way a number of key points. In “Experience” he defines “spirit” as “matter reduced to an extreme thinness.” In keeping with the gradual shift in his philosophy from an emphasis on the explanatory model of “unity” to images suggesting balance, he describes “human life” as consisting of “two elements, power and form, and the proportion must be invariably kept.” Among his more quotable aphorisms is “The years teach us much which the days never know,” a memorable argument for the idea that experience cannot be reduced to the smallest observable events, then added back up again to constitute a life; that there is, on the contrary, an irreducible whole present in a life and at work through us. “Experience” concludes with Emerson’s hallmark optimism, a faith in human events grounded in his sense of the total penetration of the divine in all matter. “Every day,” he writes, and “every act betrays the ill-concealed deity,” a determined expression of his lifelong principle that the divine radiates through all being.

The early 1850s saw the publication of a number of distinctively American texts: Nathaniel Hawthorne’s The Scarlet Letter (1850); Melville’s Moby-Dick (1851); Harriet Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin (1852); and Whitman’s Leaves of Grass (1855). Emerson’s Representative Men (1850) failed to anticipate this flowering of a uniquely American literature in at least one respect: none of his representative characters were American—nevertheless, each biography yields an insight into some aspect of Emerson’s thought he finds in the man or in his work, so that Representative Men reads as the history of Emerson’s precursors in other times and places. Emerson structures the book around portraits of Plato, the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg, the French essayist Montaigne, the poet William Shakespeare, the statesman Napoleon Bonaparte, and the writer Johann Wolfgang von Goethe. Each man stands in for a type, for example, Montaigne represents the “skeptic,” Napoleon the “man of the world.” Humanity, for Emerson, consisted of recognizable but overlapping personality types, types discoverable in every age and nation, but all sharing in a common humanity that has its source in divine being. Each portrait balances the particular feature of the representative man that illustrates the general laws inhabiting humanity along with an assessment of the great man’s shortcomings. Like Nietzsche, Emerson did not believe that great men were ends in themselves but served particular functions, notably for Emerson their capacity to “clear our eyes of egotism, and enable us to see other people in their works.” Emerson’s representative men are “great,” but “exist that there may be greater men.” As a gesture toward self-criticism about an entire book on great men by the champion of American individualism, Emerson concedes, “there are no common men,” and his biographical sketches ultimately balance both the limitations of each man with his—to use an oxymoron—distinctive universality, or in other words, the impact he has had on Emerson’s thought. While Plato receives credit for establishing the “cardinal facts . . . the one and the two.—1. Unity, or Identity; and, 2. Variety,” Emerson concedes that through Plato we have had no success in “explaining existence.” It was Swedenborg, according to Emerson, who discovered that the smallest particles in nature are merely replicated and repeated in larger organizations, and that the physical world is symbolic of the spiritual. But although he approves of the religion Swedenborg urged, a spirituality of each and every moment, Emerson complains the mystic lacks the “liberality of universal wisdom.” Instead, we are “always in a church.” From Montaigne, Emerson gained a heightened sense of the universal mind as he read the French philosophers’ Essays, for “It seemed to me as if I had myself written the book”—as well as an enduring imperative of style: “Cut these words, and they would bleed.” The “skeptic” Montaigne, however, lacks belief, which “consists in accepting the affirmations of the soul.” From Shakespeare, Emerson received confirmation that originality was a reassembly of existing ideas. The English poet possessed the rare capacity of greatness in that he allowed the spirit of his age to achieve representation through him. Nevertheless the world waits on “a poet-priest” who can see, speak, and act, with equal inspiration.” Reflection on Napoleon’s life teaches the value of concentration, one of Emerson’s chief virtues. In The Conduct of Life, Emerson describes “concentration,” or bringing to bear all of one’s powers on a single object, as the “chief prudence.” Likewise, Napoleon’s shrewdness consisted in allowing events to take their natural course and become representative of the forces of his time. The defect of the “man of the world” was that he possessed “the powers of intellect without conscience” and was doomed to fail. Emerson’s moral summary of Napoleon’s sounds a great deal like Whitman: “Only that good profits, which we can taste with all doors open, and which serves all men.” Goethe, “the writer,” like Napoleon, represents the countervailing force of nature against Emerson’s lifelong opponent, what he called “the morgue of convention.” Goethe is also exemplary of the man of culture whose sphere of knowledge, as Emerson himself tried to emulate with his wide and systematic reading, knows no limits or categorical boundaries. Yet, “the lawgiver of art is not an artist,” and repeating a call for an original relation to the infinite, foregoing even the venerable authority of Goethe, Emerson concludes, “We too must write Bibles.”

English Traits was published in 1856 but represented almost a decade of reflections on an invited lecture tour Emerson made in 1847-48 to Great Britain. English Traits presents an unusually conservative set of perspectives on a rather limited subject, that of a single nation and “race,” in place of human civilization and humanity as a whole. English Traits contains an advanced understanding of race, namely, that the differences among the members of a race are greater than the differences between races, but in general introduces few new ideas. The work is highly “occasional,” shaped by his travels and visits, and bore evidence of what seemed to be an erosion of energy and originality in his thought.

The Conduct of Life (1860), however, proved to be a work of startling vigor and insight and is Emerson’s last important work published in his lifetime. “Fate” is arguably the central essay in the book. The subject of fate, which Emerson defines as “An expense of means to end,” along with the relation of fate to freedom and the primacy of man’s vocation, come to be the chief subjects of the final years of his career. Some of Emerson’s finest poetry can be found in his essays. In “Fate” he writes: “A man’s power is hooped in by a necessity, which, by many experiments, he touches on every side, until he learns its arc.” Fate is balanced in the essay by intellect: “So far as a man thinks, he is free.” Emerson’s advice for the conduct of life is to learn to swim with the tide, to “trim your bark” (that is, sails) to catch the prevailing wind. He refines and redefines his conception of history as the interaction between “Nature and thought.” Emerson further refines his conception of the great man by describing him as the “impressionable” man, or the man who most perfectly captures the spirit of his time in his thought and action. Varying a biblical proverb to his own thought, Emerson argues that what we seek we will find because it is our fate to seek what is our own. Always a moderating voice in politics, Emerson writes in “Power” that the “evils of popular government appear greater than they are”—at best a lukewarm recommendation of democracy. On the subject of politics, Emerson consistently posited a faith in balance, the tendencies toward chaos and order, change and conservation always correcting each other. His late aesthetics reinforce this political stance as he veers in “Beauty” onto the subject of women’s suffrage: “Thus the circumstances may be easily imagined, in which woman may speak, vote, argue causes, legislate, and drive a coach, and all the most naturally in the world, if only it come by degrees.”

In his early work, Emerson emphasized the operation of nature through the individual man. The Conduct of Life uncovers the same consideration only now understood in terms of work or vocation. Emerson argued with increasing regularity throughout his career that each man is made for some work, and to ally himself with that is to render himself immune from harm: “the conviction that his work is dear to God and cannot be spared, defends him.” One step above simple concentration of force in Emerson’s scale of values we find his sense of dedication: “Nothing is beneath you, if it is in the direction of your life.” While in favor of many of the social and political reform movements of his time, Emerson never ventured far into a critique of laissez-faire economics. In “Wealth” we find the balanced perspective, one might say contradiction, to be found in all the late work. Emerson argues that to be a “whole man” one must be able to find a “blameless living,” and yet this same essay acknowledges an unsentimental definition of wealth: “He is the richest man who knows how to draw a benefit from the labors of the greatest numbers of men.” In the final essay of the book, “Illusions,” Emerson uses a metaphor—“the sun borrows his beams”—to reassert his pervasive humanism, the idea that we endow nature with its beauty, and that man is at the center of creation. Man is at the center, and the center will hold: “There is no chance, and no anarchy, in the universe.”

3. Legacy

Emerson remains the major American philosopher of the nineteenth century and in some respects the central figure of American thought since the colonial period. Perhaps due to his highly quotable style, Emerson wields a celebrity unknown to subsequent American philosophers. The general reading public knows Emerson’s work primarily through his aphorisms, which appear throughout popular culture on calendars and poster, on boxes of tea and breath mints, and of course through his individual essays. Generations of readers continue to encounter the more famous essays under the rubric of “literature” as well as philosophy, and indeed the essays, less so his poetry, stand undiminished as major works in the American literary tradition. Emerson’s emphasis on self-reliance and nonconformity, his championing of an authentic American literature, his insistence on each individual’s original relation to God, and finally his relentless optimism, that “life is a boundless privilege,” remain his chief legacies.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baker, Carlos. Emerson Among the Eccentrics: A Group Portrait. New York: Penguin, 1997.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo: Essays and Lectures. Ed. Joel Porte. New York: Library of America, 1983.
  • Essays and Poems. Ed. Joel Porte et al. New York: Library of American, 1996.
  • The Complete Sermons of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Vol. 4. Ed Wesley T. Mott et al. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 1992.
  • The Selected Letters of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Ed. Joel Myerson. New York: Columbia, 1997.
  • The Heart of Emerson’s Journals. Ed. Bliss Perry. Minneola, NY: Dover Press, 1995.
  • Field, Peter. S. Ralph Waldo Emerson: The Making of a Democratic Intellectual. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2002.
  • Porte, Joel. Representative Man: Ralph Waldo Emerson in His Time. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Porte, Joel and Morris, Saundra. The Cambridge Companion to Ralph Waldo Emerson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Richardson, Robert D. Jr. Emerson: The Mind on Fire. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995

Author Information

Vince Brewton
Email: vjbrewton@una.edu
University of North Alabama
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 11, 2005 | Originally published: