There are different theories of emotion to explain what emotions are and how they operate. This is challenging, since emotions can be analyzed from many different perspectives. In one sense, emotions are sophisticated and subtle, the epitome of what make us human. In another sense, however, human emotions seem to be very similar to (if not the same as) the responses that other animals display. Further, the emotions that we have and how we express them reflect our social environment, but it also seems likely that emotions were shaped by natural selection over time. These and other conflicting features of the emotions make constructing a theory difficult and have led to the creation of a variety of different theories.
Theories of emotion can be categorized in terms of the context within which the explanation is developed. The standard contexts are evolutionary, social and internal. Evolutionary theories attempt to provide an historical analysis of the emotions, usually with a special interest in explaining why humans today have the emotions that they do. Social theories explain emotions as the products of cultures and societies. The internal approach attempts to provide a description of the emotion process itself. This article is organized around these three categories and will discuss the basic ideas that are associated with each. Some specific theories, as well as the main features of emotion will also be explained.
Emotion is one type of affect, other types being mood, temperament and sensation (for example, pain). Emotions can be understood as either states or as processes. When understood as a state (like being angry or afraid), an emotion is a type of mental state that interacts with other mental states and causes certain behaviors.
Understood as a process, it is useful to divide emotion into two parts. The early part of the emotion process is the interval between the perception of the stimulus and the triggering of the bodily response. The later part of the emotion process is a bodily response, for example, changes in heart rate, skin conductance, and facial expression. This description is sufficient to begin an analysis of the emotions, although it does leave out some aspects of the process such as the subjective awareness of the emotion and behavior that is often part of the emotion response (for example, fighting, running away, hugging another person).
The early part of the process is typically taken to include an evaluation of the stimulus, which means that the occurrence of an emotion depends on how the individual understands or “sees” the stimulus. For example, one person may respond to being laid-off from a job with anger, while another person responds with joy—it depends on how the individual evaluates this event. Having this evaluative component in the process means that an emotion is not a simple and direct response to a stimulus. In this way, emotions differ from reflexes such as the startle response or the eye-blink response, which are direct responses to certain kinds of stimuli.
The following are some of the features that distinguish emotion from moods. An emotion is a response to a specific stimulus that can be internal, like a belief or a memory. It is also generally agreed that emotions have intentional content, which is to say that they are about something, often the stimulus itself. Moods, on the other hand, are typically not about anything, and at least some of the time do not appear to be caused by a specific stimulus. Emotions also have a relatively brief duration—on the order of seconds or minutes—whereas moods last much longer. Most theories agree about these features of the emotions. Other features will be discussed in the course of this article. There is much less agreement, however, about most of these other features that the emotions may (or may not) have.
The evolutionary approach focuses on the historical setting in which emotions developed. Typically, the goal is to explain why emotions are present in humans today by referring to natural selection that occurred some time in the past.
It will help to begin by clarifying some terminology. Evolution is simply “change over generational time” (Brandon, 1990, p. 5). Change to a trait can occur because of natural selection, chance, genetic drift, or because the trait is genetically linked with some other trait. A trait is an adaptation if it is produced by natural selection. And a trait is the result of natural selection only when “its prevalence is due to the fact that it conferred a greater fitness” (Richardson, 1996, p. 545), where fitness means reproductive success.
However, a trait can enhance fitness without being an adaptation. One example, noted by Darwin in The Origin of Species, is the skull sutures in newborns:
The sutures in the skulls of young mammals have been advanced as a beautiful adaptation for aiding parturition [that is, live birth], and no doubt they facilitate, or may be indispensable for this act; but as sutures occur in the skulls of young birds and reptiles, which have only to escape from a broken egg, we may infer that this structure has arisen from the laws of growth, and has been taken advantage of in the parturition of the higher animals (p. 218).
In this case, the evidence from non-mammals indicates that this trait was not selected because it aids live birth, although it later became useful for this task.
In order to know that a trait is an adaptation, we have to be familiar with the circumstances under which the selection occurred (Brandon, 1990; Richardson, 1996). However, often the historical evidence is not available to establish that a new trait replaced a previous one because the new trait increased fitness. This is especially true for psychological traits because there is no fossil record to examine. Hence, establishing that an emotion is an adaptation presents some difficult challenges.
Nevertheless, this has not prevented the development of theories that explain emotions as adaptations. The attractiveness of this approach is easy to see. Since all humans have emotions and most non-human animals display emotion-like responses, it is likely that emotions (or emotion-like behaviors) were present in a common ancestor. Moreover, emotions appear to serve an important function, which has led many to think that the certain emotions have been selected to deal with particular problems and challenges that organisms regularly encounter. As Dacher Keltner et al. has stated, “Emotions have the hallmarks of adaptations: They are efficient, coordinated responses that help organisms to reproduce, to protect offspring, to maintain cooperative alliances, and to avoid physical threats” (Keltner, Haidt, & Shiota, 2006, p. 117).
Three different ways in which the evolutionary position has been developed will be discussed in the following sections. The first is based on the claim that emotions are the result of natural selection that occurred in early hominids. The second also claims that emotions are adaptations, but suggests that the selection occurred much earlier. Finally, the third position suggests that emotions are historical, but does not rely on emotions being adaptations.
The theories in the first group claim that the emotions were selected for in early hominids. Most of these theories suggest that this selection occurred in response to problems that arose because of the social environment in which these organisms lived (Tooby & Cosmides, 1990; Cosmides & Tooby, 2000; Nesse, 1990; Keltner et al., 2006). Some examples of the problems that early hominids may have encountered, and the emotions that may have been selected in response to these problems, are listed in Table 1.
Table 1. Some possible examples of emotions that were selected for in early hominids.
These emotions, it is suggested, have been selected to deal with the types of problems indicated.
Although the time period during which this selection is believed to have occurred is typically not specified with any precision, the general period begins after the human lineage diverged from that of the great apes, 5 to 8 million years ago, and continues through the appearance of Homo sapiens, which was at least 150,000 years ago (Wood & Collard, 1999; Wood, 1996).
Adherents of this position suggest that each emotion should be understood as a set of programs that guide cognitive, physiological, and behavioral processes when a specific type of problem is encountered (Tooby & Cosmides, 1990; Cosmides & Tooby, 2000; Nesse, 1990). In Randolph Nesse’s words, “The emotions are specialized modes of operation shaped by natural selection to adjust the physiological, psychological, and behavioral parameters of the organism in ways that increase its capacity and tendency to respond adaptively to the threats and opportunities characteristic of specific kinds of situations” (1990, p. 268).
For example, Cosmides and Tooby suggest that sexual jealousy is an adaptation that occurred in “our hunger-gatherer ancestors” (2000, p. 100). As they explain it, sexual jealousy was selected to deal with a group of related problems. The main one is that a mate is having sex with someone else, but other problems include the harm that has been done to the victim’s status and reputation, the possibility that the unfaithful mate has conceived with the rival, and the likelihood that the victim of the infidelity has been deceived about a wide variety of other matters (2000, p. 100).
According to Cosmides and Tooby, the emotion of sexual jealousy, deals with these problems in the following ways:
Physiological processes are prepared for such things as violence, sperm competition, and the withdrawal of investment; the goal of deterring, injuring, or murdering the rival emerges; the goal of punishing, deterring, or deserting the mate appears; the desire to make oneself more competitively attractive to alternative mates emerges; memory is activated to reanalyze the past; confident assessments of the past are transformed into doubts; the general estimate of the reliability and trustworthiness of the opposite sex (or indeed everyone) may decline; associated shame programs may be triggered to search for situations in which the individual can publicly demonstrate acts of violence or punishment that work to counteract an (imagined or real) social perception of weakness; and so on (2000, p. 101).
Cosmides and Tooby, and others who have similar theories, stress that these emotions are responses that enhanced fitness when the selection occurred—whenever that was in the past. Although these emotions are still present in humans today, they may no longer be useful, and may even be counterproductive, as Cosmides and Tooby’s description of the more violent aspects of sexual jealousy illustrates.
In contrast to theories that claim that the emotions are the result of natural selection that occurred in early hominids, another position is that the selection occurred much earlier, and so the adaptations are shared by a wider collection of species today. Robert Plutchik claims that there are eight basic emotions, each one is an adaptation, and all eight are found in all organisms (1980, 1984). According to Plutchik, the emotions are similar to traits such as DNA or lungs in air breathing animals—traits that are so important that they arose once and have been conserved ever since. In the case of the emotions, which he calls “basic adaptations needed by all organisms in the struggle for individual survival” (1980, p. 145), Plutchik suggests that the selection occurred in the Cambrian era, 600 million years ago. The eight adaptations are incorporation, rejection, destruction, protection, reproduction, reintegration, orientation, and exploration (see Table 2 for a description of each).
Table 2. This table lists the eight basic emotions in Robert Plutchik theory. On the left are the behaviors that, according to Plutchik, are the result of natural selection, and on the right are the emotions associated with these behaviors. The first emotion listed in each row (e.g., fear, anger, joy) is the basic emotion, the second is the same emotion except at a greater intensity (that is, terror, rage, ecstasy) (1980, 1984).
In Plutchik’s theory, these adaptations are, in one sense, types of animal behaviors. The term “emotion” is just a particular way of describing these behaviors in humans. However, he does acknowledge that the same behaviors are not found in all species. The emotions that appear in humans are more complex than what are found in lower species, “but the basic functional patterns remain invariant in all animals, up to and including humans” (1980, p. 130).
Plutchik’s theory also accounts for more than just these eight emotions. Other emotions, he says, are either combinations of two or three of these basic emotions, or one of these eight emotions experienced at a greater or a milder intensity. Some examples are: anger and disgust mixing to form contempt; fear and sadness mixing to form despair; and with regard to levels of intensity, annoyance is a milder form of anger, which is itself a milder form of rage.
Although the trend when explaining emotions from a historical point of view is to focus on adaptations, an alternative is simply to identify the traits that are present in a certain range of species because of their shared ancestry. According to Paul Griffiths, some emotions should be identified and then classified in this way (1997, 2004). This classification creates a psychological category, which Griffiths terms the affect program emotions: surprise, anger, fear, sadness, joy, and disgust. In Griffiths’ theory, the other emotions belong to different categories—the higher-cognitive emotions and the socially constructed emotions—and in some cases a single vernacular term, for example, anger, will have instances that belong to different categories. Affect programs are explained further in section 4.
Griffiths’ idea is that these emotions are basically the same as other traits that are studied and classified by evolutionary biology. An affect program emotion is, “no different from a trait like the human arm, which has unique features but can be homologized more or less broadly with everything from a chimpanzee arm to a cetacean fin” (1997, p. 230). For example, sadness, one of Griffiths’ affect program emotions, occurs in all humans and in other related species. This trait may differ slightly from species to species, but it is a single trait because all of the occurrences can be traced back to a common ancestor.
Griffiths suggests that this method of classification will identify the emotions that are carried out by similar mechanisms in different species. For example, “threat displays in chimps look very different from anger in humans, but when their superficial appearance is analyzed to reveal the specific muscles whose movement produces the expression and the order in which those muscles move, it becomes clear that they are homologues of one another. The same is almost certainly true of the neural mechanisms that control those movements” (Griffiths, 2004, p. 238). Rather than simply focusing on the functions of the emotions, this kind of analysis is more useful for psychology and neuropsychology because these sciences are interested in identifying the mechanisms that drive behavior (Griffiths, 2004).
The second main approach to explaining the emotions begins with the idea that emotions are social constructions. That is, emotions are the products of societies and cultures, and are acquired or learned by individuals through experience. Virtually everyone who defends this position acknowledges that emotions are to some degree, natural phenomena. Nonetheless, the central claim made in these theories is that the social influence is so significant that emotions are best understood from this perspective.
This section will discuss some of the motivations for adopting this approach to explaining the emotions. Some brief examples to show how these ideas have been developed are also reviewed.
1. A number of anthropological studies have found discrepancies among the emotion words used in different languages. In particular, there are emotion words in other languages that do not correspond directly or even closely to emotion words in English. Given that individuals experience the emotions that they have terms for (and vice versa), the claim that follows from these findings is that people in different cultures have and experience different emotions. The following are some of the examples that are often used to illustrate the variability of emotion terms.
The people of Ifaluk, a small island in the Pacific, have an emotion that they refer to as fago. Catherine Lutz translates fago as “compassion/love/sadness” and claims that it is unlike any single western emotion (1988). The Japanese have the emotion amae, which is a feeling of dependency upon another’s love. This is similar to the feeling that children have towards their mothers, but it is experienced by adults. (Morsbach & Tyler, 1986). And there are several cultures in which anger and sadness are not distinguished as separate, discrete emotions (Orley, 1970 [quoted in Russell, 1991]; Davitz, 1969; M. Z. Rosaldo, 1980; R. I. Rosaldo, 1984). (See Russell  for a comprehensive review of this literature.)
2. Emotions typically occur in social settings and during interpersonal transactions—many, if not most, emotions are caused by other people and social relationships. Thus, in many cases emotions may be best understood as interactions between people, rather than simply as one individual’s response to a particular stimulus (Parkinson, 1996). Brian Parkinson and his colleagues have developed a theory based upon these considerations (Parkinson, 1996, 1997; Parkinson, Fischer, & Manstead, 2005). In brief, Parkinson describes emotion as:
something that emerges directly through the medium of interaction. Interpersonal factors are typically the main causes of emotion, and emotions lead people to engage in certain kinds of social encounter or withdraw from such interpersonal contact. Many emotions have relational rather than personal meanings … and the expression of these meanings in an emotional interaction serves specific interpersonal functions depending on the nature of the emotion (1996, p. 680).
Rom Harré also points out that language, social practices, and other elements of an individual’s culture have a significant role in the formation of emotions. Individuals in a society develop their emotions based on what they are exposed to and experience, either directly or indirectly (1986, 1995). One example that Harré uses to demonstrate this is an emotion that depended upon religious beliefs and the norms that develop around those beliefs in the Middle Ages. Accidie was a negative emotion that Harré and Finlay-Jones describe as “boredom, dejection, or even disgust with fulfilling one’s religious duty” (Harré & Finlay-Jones, 1986, p. 221). Moreover, this emotion was “the major spiritual failing to which those who should have been dutiful succumbed” and “to feel it at all was a sin” (p. 221). Nevertheless, experience it people did. Today, although people still get bored and dejected, this emotion no longer exists because our emotions are, according to Harré and Finlay-Jones, “defined against the background of a different moral order” (p. 222).
3. Emotions and their expression are regulated by social norms, values, and expectations. These norms and values influence what the appropriate objects of emotion are (that is, what events should make a person angry, happy, jealous, and so on), and they also influence how emotions should be expressed.
As an example of how specific and recognizable these norms, values, and expectations sometimes are, one can consider “emotion rules” that Americans often follow. James Averill (1993; see also 1982) has identified the rules for anger, some of which are listed here:
Once these rules are specified by society (either implicitly or explicitly), they become, Averill says, “part of our ‘second nature’” (1993, p. 184), and so we follow them without any deliberate effort.
Claire Armon-Jones goes further and says that the purpose of the emotions is to reinforce society’s norms and values (1986b, see also 1985, 1986a). Allowing that emotions may also serve other purposes, some of the functions that they have are “the regulation of socially undesirable behavior and the promotion of attitudes which reflect and endorse the interrelated religious, political, moral, aesthetic and social practices of a society” (1986b, p. 57). For example, an individual’s envy of someone who is successful (or his guilt over having cheated someone) are both emotions that have been prescribed by the individual’s society so that the individual will take the appropriate attitude towards success and cheating.
Of course, there are times when emotion responses do not adhere well to what one may think of as moral rules or values, for instance, taking pleasure in creating graffiti or taking pride in hurting people. For these cases, Armon-Jones suggests that the emotion has still been learned by the individual, just not in a way that is consistent with what the larger portion of the society would endorse. Rather, the individual has acquired the emotion from some sub-population of society or a peer-group that the individual identifies with (1986b).
Many theories have been developed from the social perspective, but one that has been particularly significant is James Averill’s, which will be reviewed in this section (1980, 1982, 1986). According to Averill, “an emotion is a transitory social role (a socially constituted syndrome) that includes an individual’s appraisal of the situation and that is interpreted as a passion rather than as an action” (1980, p. 312). These transitory social roles and syndromes are generated by social norms and expectations, and so, by these means, social norms and expectations govern an individual’s emotions.
Averill employs the notion of a syndrome to indicate that each emotion (like fear, anger or embarrassment), covers a variety of elements. A syndrome is a collection of all of the appropriate responses of a particular emotion, any of which may at certain times constitute an emotion response, but none of which are essential or necessary for that emotion syndrome. It also consists of beliefs about the nature of the eliciting stimuli and perhaps some natural (that is, non-social) elements. All of these various components are linked together for an individual by principles of organization. These principles are what allow the various elements to be construed coherently as one particular emotion (1982).
For example, grief is a syndrome. Every individual who understands this syndrome may at different times have the following grief responses: shock, crying, refusing to cry (that is, keeping a stiff upper lip), declining to eat, neglecting basic responsibilities, and so on. Further, the conditions that the individual understands should elicit grief are also part of this syndrome: the death of a loved one, the loss of a valuable object, a setback at work, rainy days, and so forth.
Bringing these parts together into one coherent whole are the mental constructs that allow an individual to construe all of these various elements as grief. An individual labels both his response at a funeral and his response to his favorite baseball team losing as grief, even if the two responses have nothing in common. Additionally, with an understanding of the grief syndrome an individual can judge when others are experiencing grief and whether another individual’s grief is genuine, severe, mild, and so on.
The idea of emotions as transitory social roles is distinct from the notion of a syndrome, but characterizes the same phenomena, in particular, the eliciting conditions and the responses for an emotion. In Averill’s theory, transitory social roles are the roles that individuals adopt when they choose to play a particular part in a situation as it unfolds. That being said, although the individual chooses the role, Averill stresses that the emotional responses are interpreted by the agent as passive responses to particular situations, not as active choices.
The transitory social roles are rule governed ways of performing a social role, and so individuals adopt a role that is consistent with what a given situation calls for. For example, a grief response is appropriate at a funeral, but different grief responses are appropriate at the burial and at the service before the burial. In order to have an emotion response that is consistent with social norms and expectations, the individual must understand what the role they are adopting means in the context in which it is used.
Summarizing these different resources from Averill’s theory, the syndromes are used to classify emotions and demarcate them from each other. The transitory social roles are useful for explaining how the emotion responses relate to the society as well as the specific social context. Considering an emotion as a syndrome, the individual has a variety of choices for the emotion response. The transitory social role imposes rules that dictate which response is appropriate for the situation. For example, the possible responses for anger may include pouting, yelling, hitting, or perhaps no overt behavior at all. In a particular situation, say a baseball game, a player may adopt a social role that includes pushing the umpire as an anger response. Yelling at the umpire would have been another role the player could have adopted. However, social norms and expectations dictate that pouting in this situation would not be an appropriate response.
The third category of theories contains those that attempt to describe the emotion process itself. Generally speaking, the emotion process begins with the perception of a stimulus, although in some cases the “stimulus” may be internal, for example, a thought or a memory. The early part of the emotion process is the activity between the perception and the triggering of the bodily response (that is, the emotion response), and the later part of the emotion process is the bodily response: changes in heart rate, blood pressure, facial expression, skin conductivity, and so forth.
Most of the theories that will be considered in this section focus on the early part of the emotion process because—according to these theories—the specific emotion that occurs is determined during this part of the process. There is, however, disagreement about how simple or complex the early part of the emotion process might be, which has lead to competing cognitive and non-cognitive theories. These two types of theories are discussed in this section, as is a third type, the somatic feedback theories.
The cognitive theories contend that the early part of the emotion process includes the manipulation of information and so should be understood as a cognitive process. This is in contrast to theories that state that the generation of the emotion response is a direct and automatic result of perceiving the stimulus—these non-cognitive theories are discussed below.
Two observations demonstrate some of the motivation for the cognitive position. First, different individuals will respond to the same event with different emotions, or the same individual may at different times respond differently to the same stimulus. For example, one person may be relieved to be laid-off from her job, while a co-worker greets the same news with dread. Or one person may, as a young woman, be excited to be laid-off from her job, but several years later find being laid-off frightening. As the psychologists Ira Roseman and Craig Smith point out, “Both individual and temporal variability in reaction to an event are difficult to explain with theories that claim that stimulus events directly cause emotional response” (2001, p. 4).
Second, there is a wide range of seemingly unrelated events that cause the same emotion. None of these events share any physical feature or property, but all of them can cause the same response. Roseman and Smith provide an example using sadness and comment on the consequence of this example for a theory of emotion:
sadness may be elicited by the death of a parent (see Boucher & Brandt, 1981), the birth of a child (see, for example, Hopkins, Marcus, & Campbell, 1984), divorce (for example, Richards, Hardy, & Wadsworth, 1997), declining sensory capacity (Kalayam, Alexopoulos, Merrell, & Young, 1991), not being accepted to medical school (Scherer, 1988), or the crash of one’s computer hard drive … These examples pose problems for theories claiming that emotions are unconditioned responses to evolutionary specified stimulus events or are learned via generalization or association (2001, p. 4).
Cognitive theories account for these two observations by proposing that the way in which the individual evaluates the stimulus determines the emotion that is elicited. Every individual has beliefs, as well as goals, personal tendencies, and desires in place before the emotion causing event is encountered. It is in light of these factors that an individual evaluates the event. For example, different emotions will occur depending on whether an individual evaluates being laid-off as consistent with her current goals or inconsistent with them.
Judgment theories are the version of the cognitive position that have been developed by philosophers. The basic idea, as Robert Solomon puts it, is that an emotion is “a basic judgment about our Selves and our place in our world, the projection of the values and ideals, structures and mythologies, according to which we live and through which we experience our lives” (1993, p. 126). Judging in this context is the mental ability that individuals use when they acknowledge a particular experience or the existence of a particular state of the world; what Martha Nussbaum calls “assent[ing] to an appearance” (2004, p. 191).
Taking anger as an example, in Solomon’s theory, “What constitutes the anger is my judging that I have been insulted and offended” (1977, p. 47). Nussbaum has a similar, but more detailed, description of anger as the following set of beliefs: “that there has been some damage to me or to something or someone close to me; that the damage is not trivial but significant; that it was done by someone; that it was done willingly; that it would be right for the perpetrator of the damage to be punished” (2004, p. 188). In some contexts, Nussbaum treats judgments and beliefs interchangeably and it is sometimes the case that a series of judgments constitute the emotion.
Elaborating upon her example, Nussbaum points out how the different beliefs are related to the emotion. She notes that, “each element of this set of beliefs is necessary in order for anger to be present: if I should discover that not x but y had done the damage, or that it was not done willingly, or that it was not serious, we could expect my anger to modify itself accordingly or recede” (2004, p. 188). Thus, a change in an individual’s beliefs—in his or her way of seeing the world—entails a different emotion, or none at all.
Judging is the central idea in these theories because it is something that the agent actively does, rather than something that happens to the individual. This in turn reflects the judgment theorists’ claim that in order to have an emotion the individual must judge (evaluate, acknowledge) that events are a certain way. Of course, one can make judgments that are not themselves emotions. For example, the judgment that the wall is red, or the judgment that the icy road is dangerous. One way to distinguish the judgments that are emotions from those that are not is to suggest (like Nussbaum) that the judgment must be based on a certain set of beliefs. If those beliefs are present, then the emotion will occur; if they are not, then it won’t. A second response is to be more specific about the nature of the judgment itself. The judgments related to emotions are, as Solomon says, “self-involved and relatively intense evaluative judgments … The judgments and objects that constitute our emotions are those which are especially important to us, meaningful to us, concerning matters in which we have invested our Selves” (1993, p. 127).
It is also important to note that, although these theories claim that emotion is a cognitive process, they do not claim that it is a conscious or a deliberative process. As Solomon says, “by ‘judgment’, I do not necessarily mean ‘deliberative judgment’ … One might call such judgments ‘spontaneous’ as long as ‘spontaneity’ isn’t confused with ‘passivity’” (1977, p. 46). For example, the judgment that I have been insulted and offended does not necessarily require any conscious mental effort on my part.
The last issue that needs to be addressed concerns the bodily response. All of the judgment theories state that judgments are necessary for an emotion. While these theories acknowledge that in many cases various bodily responses will accompany the emotion, many do not consider the bodily response an integral part of the emotion process. Nussbaum believes that this can be demonstrated by considering the consequences of having the requisite mental states while not having a bodily response:
There usually will be bodily sensations and changes involved in grieving, but if we discovered that my blood pressure was quite low during this whole episode, or that my pulse rate never went above sixty, there would not, I think, be the slightest reason to conclude that I was not grieving. If my hands and feet were cold or warm, sweaty or dry, again this would be of no critical value (2004, p. 195).
Some judgment theorists are, however, more accommodating and allow that the bodily response is properly considered part of the emotion, an effect of the judgments that are made. Thus, William Lyons describes his theory, the causal-evaluative theory, as follows:
the causal-evaluative theory gets its name from advocating that X is to be deemed an emotional state if and only if it is a physiologically abnormal state caused by the subject of that state’s evaluation of his or her situation. The causal order is important, emotion is a psychosomatic state, a bodily state caused by an attitude, in this case an evaluative attitude (1980, pp. 57–58).
In theory such as Lyons’, the bodily response is considered part of the emotion process and the emotion is determined by the cognitive activity—the judgment or evaluation—that occurs (Lyons 1980, pp. 62–63; see also Roseman and Smith, 2001, p. 6).
Cognitive appraisal theories are the cognitive theories that have been developed by psychologists. Like the judgment theories, the cognitive appraisal theories emphasize the idea that the way in which an individual evaluates or appraises the stimulus determines the emotion. But unlike the judgment theories, the cognitive appraisal theories do not rely on the resources of folk psychology (beliefs, judgments, and so forth). The cognitive appraisal theories also offer a more detailed analysis of the different types of appraisals involved in the emotion process.
This section will focus on Ira Roseman’s theory (1984), which was one of the first cognitive appraisal theories. As an early contribution, Roseman’s theory is in some ways simpler than more recent cognitive appraisal theories and so will serve as a good introduction. Similar models are offered by Roseman, Antoniou, and Jose , Roseman , Lazarus , and Scherer [1993, 2001]. The basic theoretical framework is the same for all of the cognitive appraisal theories. The main differences concern the exact appraisals that are used in this process.
Roseman’s model, which is described in Table 3, has five appraisal components that can produce 14 discrete emotions. The appraisal components and the different values that each component can take are motivational state (appetitive, aversive), situational state (motive-consistent, motive-inconsistent), probability (certain, uncertain, unknown), power (strong, weak), and agency (self-caused, other-caused, circumstance-caused). The basic idea is that when a stimulus is encountered it is appraised along these five dimensions. Each appraisal component is assigned one of its possible values, and together these values determine which emotion response will be generated.
Table 3. The different appraisal components in Roseman’s theory are motivational state, situational state, probability, power, and agency. The arrows point to the different values that each appraisal component can take. Each emotion type takes the values that its placement in the chart indicates. When the emotion is placed such that it lines up with more than one value for an appraisal component (e.g., anger can be uncertain or certain), any of those values can be assigned for that emotion. Adapted from Roseman (1984, p. 31).
For example, for joy, the situational state must be appraised as motive-consistent, the motivational state as appetitive, agency must be circumstance-caused, probability must be certain, and power can be either weak or strong. Notice also that the different emotions all use the same appraisal components, and many emotions take the same values for several of the components. For example, in Roseman’s model, anger and regret take the same values for all of the appraisals except for the agency component; for that appraisal, regret takes the value self-caused and anger takes other-caused.
The five appraisal components are described as follows:
Just like the judgment theorists, Roseman and the other appraisal theorists say that these appraisals do not have to be deliberate, or even something of which the individual is consciously aware. To illustrate this, consider someone accidentally spilling a glass of water on you versus intentionally throwing the glass of water on you. According to Roseman’s theory, in the first case, the agency appraisal would most likely be circumstance-caused. In the latter case, it would be other-caused. As a result, different emotions would be elicited. Most people have had an experience like this and can see that determining these values would not take any conscious effort. The values are set outside of conscious awareness.
Unlike some of the judgment theorists, all of the cognitive appraisal theorists agree that the appraisals are followed by a bodily response, which is properly consider part of the emotion process. Roseman suggests that once the appraisals have been made, a response that has the following parts is set in motion: (1) “the thoughts, images, and subjective ‘feeling’ associated with each discrete emotion,” (2) “the patterns of bodily response,” (3) the “facial expressions, vocal signals, and postural cues that communicate to others which emotion one is feeling,” (4) a “behavioral component [that] comprises actions, such as running or fighting, which are often associated with particular emotions,” and (5) “goals to which particular emotions give rise, such as avoiding some situation (when frightened) or inflicting harm upon some person (when angered)” (1984, pp. 19–20).
Non-cognitive theories are those that defend the claim that judgments or appraisals are not part of the emotion process. Hence, the disagreement between the cognitive and the non-cognitive positions primarily entails the early part of the emotion process. The concern is what intervenes between the perception of a stimulus and the emotion response. The non-cognitive position is that the emotion response directly follows the perception of a relevant stimulus. Thus, instead of any sort of evaluation or judgment about the stimulus, the early part of the emotion process is thought to be reflex-like.
The non-cognitive theories are in many ways a development of the folk psychological view of emotion. This is the idea that emotions are separate from the rational or cognitive operations of the mind: cognitive operations are cold and logical, whereas emotions are hot, irrational, and largely uncontrollable responses to certain events. The non-cognitive position has also been motivated by skepticism about the cognitive theories. The non-cognitive theorists deny that propositional attitudes and the conceptual knowledge that they require (for example, anger is the judgment that I have been wronged) are necessary for emotions. Advocates of the non-cognitive position stress that a theory of emotion should apply to infants and non-human animals, which presumably do not have the cognitive capabilities that are described in the judgment theories or the cognitive appraisal theories.
With respect to the non-cognitive theories themselves, there are two different approaches. The first develops an explanation of the non-cognitive process, but claims that only some emotions are non-cognitive. The second approach describes the non-cognitive process in a very similar way, but defends the idea that all emotions are non-cognitive.
Paul Ekman originally developed what is now the standard description of the non-cognitive process (1977), and more recently Paul Griffiths has incorporated Ekman’s account into his own theory of the emotions (1997). This section will review the way in which Ekman and Griffiths describe the non-cognitive process. The next section will examine a theory that holds that all emotions are non-cognitive, a position that Ekman and Griffiths do not defend.
Ekman’s model is composed of two mechanisms that directly interface with each other: an automatic appraisal mechanism and an affect programme. Griffiths adopts a slightly different way of describing the model; he treats Ekman’s two mechanisms as a single system, which he calls the affect program. Griffiths also suggests that there is a separate affect program for each of several emotions: surprise, fear, anger, disgust, sadness, and joy (1997, p. 97). (As noted in section one, Griffiths identifies this class of emotions, the affect programs, historically.)
Describing the automatic appraisal mechanism, Ekman says:
There must be an appraiser mechanism which selectively attends to those stimuli (external or internal) which are the occasion for activating the affect programme … Since the interval between stimulus and emotional response is sometimes extraordinarily short, the appraisal mechanism must be capable of operating with great speed. Often the appraisal is not only quick but it happens without awareness, so I must postulate that the appraisal mechanism is able to operate automatically. It must be constructed so that it quickly attends to some stimuli, determining not only that they pertain to emotion, but to which emotion, and then activating the appropriate part of the affect programme (1977, p. 58).
The automatic appraisal mechanism is able to detect certain stimuli, which Ekman calls elicitors. Elicitors can vary by culture, as well as from individual to individual. On a more general level, however, there are similarities among the elicitors for each emotion. These are some of the examples that Ekman offers:
Disgust elicitors share the characteristic of being noxious rather than painful; … fear elicitors share the characteristic of portending harm or pain. One of the common characteristics of some of the elicitors of happiness is release from accumulated pressure, tension, discomfort, etc. Loss of something to which one is intimately attached might be a common characteristic of sadness elicitors. Interference with ongoing activity might be characteristic of some anger elicitors (1977, pp. 60–61).
Related to Ekman’s notion of an elicitor, Griffiths suggests that this system includes a “biased learning mechanism,” which allows it to easily learn some things, but makes it difficult for it to learn others. For example, it is easier for humans to acquire a fear of snakes than a fear flowers (Griffiths, 1997, pp. 88–89). Furthermore, this system “would have some form of memory, storing information about classes of stimuli previously assessed as meriting emotional response” (1997, p. 92).
The second mechanism that Ekman describes, what he calls the affect programme, governs the various elements of the emotion response: the skeletal muscle response, facial response, vocal response, and central and autonomic nervous system responses (1977, p. 57; see also Griffiths, 1997, p. 77). According to Ekman, this is a mechanism that “stores the patterns for these complex organized responses, and which when set off directs their occurrence” (1977, p. 57).
Griffiths also points out that the affect programs (recall that, in Griffiths’ parlance, affect program refers to the whole system) have several of the features that Fodor (1983) identified for modular processes. In particular, when the appropriate stimulus is presented to the system the triggering of the response is mandatory, meaning that once it begins it cannot be interfered with or stopped. The affect programs are also encapsulated, or cut off from other mental processes (1997, pp. 93–95). Ekman appears to have been aware of the modular nature of this system when he wrote, “The difficulty experienced when trying to interfere with the operation of the affect programme, the speed of its operation, its capability to initiate responses that are hard to halt voluntarily, is what is meant by out-of-control quality to the subjective experiences of some emotions” (1977, p. 58).
Ekman and Griffiths both believe that this system accounts for a significant number of the emotions that humans experience, but neither think that it describes all emotions. Ekman says that the automatic appraisal mechanism is one kind of appraisal mechanism, but he also believes that cognitive appraisals are sometimes utilized. Griffiths defends the view that the vernacular term emotion does not pick out a single psychological class. In addition to the affect program emotions, he suggests some emotions are cognitively mediated and some are socially constructed.
An alternative view is that the emotion process is always a non-cognitive one. That is, a system like the one described by Ekman and Griffiths accounts for all occurrences of emotion. This position is defended by Jenefer Robinson (1995, 2004, 2005). It is also similar to the theories developed by William James (1884) and, more recently, Jesse Prinz (2004a), which are discussed in the next section. See Zajonc (1980, 1984) for another important defense of the non-cognitive position.
In her “exclusively non-cognitive” theory, Robinson claims that any cognitive processes that occur in an emotion-causing situation are in addition to the core process, which is non-cognitive. She acknowledges that in some cases, an emotion might be caused by cognitive activity, but this is explained as cognitive activity that precedes the non-cognitive emotion process. For example, sometimes an individual’s fear is in response to cognitively complex information such as the value of one’s investments suddenly dropping. In this case, a cognitive process will determine that the current situation is dangerous, and then what Robinson calls an affective appraisal will be made of this specific information and a fear response will be triggered. As Robinson describes this part of her theory, “My suggestion is that there is a set of inbuilt affective appraisal mechanisms, which in more primitive species and in neonates are automatically attuned to particular stimuli, but which, as human beings learn and develop, can also take as input more complex stimuli, including complex ‘judgments’ or thoughts” (2004, p. 41).
This explanation allows Robinson to maintain the idea that emotions are non-cognitive while acknowledging that humans can have emotions in response to complex events. This aspect of her theory can also be used to explain how an individual can be cognitively aware that he or she has been unjustly treated, or been unexpectedly rewarded, but not experience any emotion (for example, anger, or sadness, or happiness)—a situation which does seem to occur sometimes. For example, the cognitive appraisal may indicate that the individual has been unjustly treated, but the affective appraisal will not evaluate this as worthy of an emotion response.
Robinson also suggests that the non-cognitive process may be followed by cognitive activity that labels an emotion response in ways that reflect the individual’s thoughts and beliefs. The non-cognitive process might generate an anger response, but then subsequent cognitive monitoring of the response and the situation causes the emotion to be labeled as jealousy. Thus, the individual will take him or herself to be experiencing jealousy, even though the actual emotion process was the one specific to anger (2004, 2005).
The theories discussed in this section have varied in the importance that they place on the bodily changes that typically during the emotion process. The judgment theorist Martha Nussbaum is dismissive of the bodily changes, whereas the cognitive appraisal theorists (that is, the psychologists) hold that the bodily response is a legitimate part of the process and has to be included in any complete description of the emotions. Meanwhile, all of the non-cognitive theorists agree that bodily changes are part of the emotion process.
However, the cognitive theories all maintain that it is the cognitive activity that determines the specific emotion that is produced (that is, sadness, anger, fear, and so forth.) and the non-cognitive position is not very different in this regard. Ekman’s automatic appraisal mechanism and Robinson’s affective appraisals are both supposed to determine which emotion is generated.
The further question is whether there is a unique set of bodily changes for each emotion. The cognitive appraisal theorist Klaus Scherer claims that each appraisal component directs specific bodily changes, and so his answer to this question is affirmative (2001); Griffiths says that is likely that each affect program emotion has a unique bodily response profile (1997, pp. 79–84); and Robinson is skeptical that different emotions can be distinguished by any of the features of the bodily response, except perhaps the facial expression (2005, pp. 28–34). Nevertheless, although answering this question is important for a complete understanding of the emotions, it does not greatly affect the theories mentioned here, which are largely based on what occurs in the early part of the emotion process.
The somatic feedback theorists differ from the cognitive and non-cognitive positions by claiming that the bodily responses are unique for each emotion and that it is in virtue of the unique patterns of somatic activity that the emotions are differentiated. Thus, according to these theories, there is one set of bodily changes for sadness, one set for anger, one for happiness, and so on. This is a claim for which there is some evidence, although except for facial expressions, the current evidence is not very strong (see Ekman, 1999; Levenson, Ekman, & Friesen, 1990; Prinz, 2004b). In any case, it is the feedback that the mind (or brain) gets from the body that makes the event an emotion.
William James (1884) was the first to develop a somatic feedback theory, and recently James’ model has been revived and expanded by Antonio Damasio (1994, 2001) and Jesse Prinz (2004a, 2004b). Somatic feedback theories suggest that once the bodily response has been generated (that is, a change in heart rate, blood pressure, facial expression, and so forth), the mind registers these bodily activities, and this mental state (the one caused by the bodily changes) is the emotion.
James describes it this way: “the bodily changes follow directly the perception of the exciting fact [that is, the emotion causing event], and … our feeling of the same changes as they occur is the emotion,” (1884, p. 189–90, italics and capitalization removed). Note that James’ theory overlaps with the non-cognitive theories insofar as James suggests that when the stimulus is perceived, a bodily response is triggered automatically or reflexively (1884, p. 195–97). The way in which he describes this process is just as central to the non-cognitive theories as it is to his own: “the nervous system of every living thing is but a bundle of predispositions to react in particular ways upon the contact of particular features of the environment. . . . The neural machinery is but a hyphen between determinate arrangements of matter outside the body and determinate impulses to inhibition or discharge within its organs” (1884, p. 190). Hence, according to James, when the appropriate type of stimulus is perceived (that is a bear), this automatically causes a bodily response (trembling, raised heart rate, and so forth), and the individual’s awareness of this bodily response is the fear.
A consequence of this view is that without a bodily response there cannot be an emotion. This is a point that James illustrates with the following thought experiment:
If we fancy some strong emotion, and then try to abstract from our consciousness of it all the feelings of its characteristic bodily symptoms, we find we have nothing left behind, no “mind-stuff” out of which the emotion can be constituted, and that a cold and neutral state of intellectual perception is all that remains (1884, p. 193; notice that Nussbaum articulates the opposite intuition in a quote above).
Jesse Prinz has recently expanded upon James’ theory. For Prinz, as for James, the emotion is the mental state that is caused by the feedback from the body. However, Prinz makes a distinction between what this mental state registers and what it represents. According to Prinz, an emotion registers the bodily response, but it represents simple information concerning what each emotion is about—for example, fear represents danger, sadness represents the loss of something valued, anger represents having been demeaned.
Like James, Prinz suggests that the bodily response is primarily the result of a non-cognitive process. In Prinz’s example in Figure 1, there is no mental evaluation or appraisal that the snake is dangerous, rather the perception of the snake triggers the bodily changes. In this case, Prinz says that the bodily changes that occur in response to perceiving a snake can be explained as an adaptation. Our bodies respond in the way that they do to the perception of a snake because snakes are dangerous, and so danger is what the mental state is representing (2004a, p. 69).
Figure 1. An illustration of Prinz’s somatic feedback theory. In this example, fear is the mental state caused by feedback from the body (that is, the perception of the bodily changes). This mental state registers the bodily changes, but represents meaningful, albeit simple, information. In this example the mental state represents danger. Adapted from Prinz (2004a, p. 69).
The advantage that Prinz’s theory has over James’ is that it incorporates a plausible account of the intentionality of emotions into a somatic feedback theory. In Prinz’s theory, the mental state (the emotion) is caused by bodily activity, but, rather than being about the bodily activity, the emotion is about something else, namely these simple pieces of information that the mental state represents.
The third theorist in this group, Antonio Damasio, is also able to account for the intentionality of the mental state that is caused by feedback from the body. Here, Damasio’s account differs from Prinz’s because Damasio takes it that the emotion process does include cognitive evaluations, at least for most emotions. A word of clarification before proceeding: what James and Prinz call the emotion, Damasio refers to as a feeling.
In Damasio’s theory, a typical case begins with thoughts and evaluations about the stimulus, and this mental activity triggers a bodily response—this process Damasio calls “the emotion.” A mental representation of the bodily activity is then generated in the brain’s somatosensory cortices—this is the feeling according to Damasio (1994, p. 145). This feeling occurs “in juxtaposition” to the thoughts and evaluations about the stimulus that triggered the bodily changes in the first place.
Figure 2. Damasio’s somatic feedback theory. The part of this process that includes (B) and (C) is what Damsio calls the emotion. The mental representation of the activity in the body, (D), Damasio calls the feeling. Since (B) and (D) co-occur, the feeling will be accompanied by the information that triggered the bodily response.
According to Damasio, these feelings are crucial in helping us make decisions and choose our actions (see Damasio’s somatic marker hypothesis, 1994, 1996). As an illustration of this, let us say that Bill’s brother-in-law has just offered to let him in on a risky, but possibly lucrative business venture. Although Bill realizes that there are many aspects of the situation to consider, the thought of losing a lot of money causes a bodily response. The feedback from Bill’s body is then juxtaposed with the thought of being tangled up in a losing venture with his brother-in-law. It is this negative feeling that informs Bill’s choice of behavior, and he declines the offer without ever pondering all of the costs and benefits. Bill could have considered the situation more thoroughly, but acting on this kind of feeling is, according to Damasio, often the way in which actions are chosen.
Another important feature of Damasio’s account (and one that Prinz has adopted) is the idea that there is an as-if loop in the brain—as in ‘as-if the body were active.’ According to Damasio, the mental representations that constitute feelings can occur in the way just described, or the brain areas that evaluate the stimulus (the amygdala and the prefrontal cortices) can directly signal the somatosensory cortices instead of triggering bodily activity. The somatosensory cortices will respond as if the bodily activity was actually occurring. This will generate a feeling more quickly and efficiently, although it may not feel the same as a genuine bodily response (1994, p. 155–56). In any case, the consequence is that there can be a feeling even if the body is not involved. The possibility that there is an as-if loop in the brain allows the somatic feedback theorists to explain how individuals who cannot receive the typical feedback from the body can still have feelings (or in Prinz’s language, emotions), for instance, those individuals who have suffered spinal cord injuries.
This article has outlined the basic approaches to explaining the emotions, it has reviewed a number of important theories, and it has discussed many of the features that emotions are believed to have. One tentative conclusion that can now be drawn is that it is unlikely that any single theory will prevail anytime soon, especially since not all of these theories are in direct competition with each other. Some of them are compatible, for instance, an evolutionary theory and a theory that describes the emotion process can easily complement each other; Griffiths’ theory of the affect program emotions demonstrates that these two perspectives can be employed in a single theory. On the other hand, some of the theories are simply inconsistent, like the cognitive and non-cognitive theories, and so the natural expectation is that one of these positions will eventually be eliminated. Many of the theories, however, fall somewhere in between, agreeing about some features of emotion, while disagreeing about others.
The empirical evidence that exists and continues to be collected is one topic that has not been discussed in this article. Being familiar with this research is central to analyzing and critiquing the theories. In the past forty years, a vast amount of data has been collected by cognitive and social psychologists, neuroscientists, anthropologists, and ethologists. This empirical research has made theorizing about the emotions an interesting challenge. A problem that remains for the theorist of emotion is accounting for all of the available empirical evidence.
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Last updated: June 9, 2009 | Originally published: