The distinction between “empathy” and “sympathy” in the context of ethics is a dynamic and challenging one. The eighteenth century texts of David Hume and Adam Smith used the word “sympathy,” but not “empathy,” although the conceptual distinction marked by empathy was doing essential work in their writings. After discussing the early uses of these terms, this article is organized historically. Two traditions are distinguished. The first is the Anglo-American tradition, and it extends from Hume and Smith to the twenty-first century work of Michael Slote. Stephen Darwall’s contribution is applied in engaging Hume and Smith. Finally, the interrelation of empathy, sympathy and altruism is explored in the work of John Rawls and Thomas Nagel. The second tradition is the Continental one. It extends from the spirituality of Johann Herder to the phenomenological movement of Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, Max Scheler, and Edith Stein. The intentional analysis of empathy is directly relevant to the constitution of the social community in a broad, normative relationship with the “Other.” Empathy (Einfühlung) is sui generis an intentional (mental) act that starts out in the superstructure of intersubjectivity in Husserl and steadily migrates towards the foundation of community under the influence of Heidegger, Scheler, and Stein. The choice of which philosophers and thinkers to include is also determined by the contingent facts that those chosen are most likely to be encountered in contemporary debates about empathy, sympathy, and ethics. Stein, Husserl, and Heidegger are primarily epistemological, ontological, and post-onto-theological, and are in the background of any contemporary, formal engagement with ethical theories, which is the focus of the present article. Scheler turns his phenomenological intuition of essence (wesenschau) towards the moral sentiments; and his analysis of the diversity of sympathetic forms is a lasting contribution to the topic. Contemporary Continental thinkers such as Larry Hatab and Frederick Olafson associate empathy with Heideggerian Mitsein and Mitdasein (being in the world with others) as the existential foundation of ethics). The roles of Friedrich Nietzsche, the Holocaust, and the “Other,” especially in Emmanuel Levinas, are distinguishing marks of the ethical approach on the Continent. The article ends with a discussion of how the discipline of psychoanalysis contributes to the role of empathy.
The words “sympathy” and “empathy” can be distinguished in several ways. Some of these distinctions are controversial, and work is needed to make them more precise. For example, “sympathy” is frequently used to mean one person’s response to the negative affects (suffering) of another individual, leading to pro-social (helping) behavior towards the other. In contrast, “empathy” generally includes responding to positive affects as well as negative ones without, however, necessarily requiring doing anything about it (no pro-social behavior required). “Sympathy” is understood to include agreement or approbation whereas “empathy” is often, though by no means always, a relatively neutral form of data gathering about the experiences and affects of others. “Sympathy” means a specific affective response such as compassion or pity whereas “empathy” once again encompasses affects in general including negative ones such as anger, fear, or resentment.
The words “empathy” and “sympathy” both point to the ancient Greek root “pathos” in the etymological context of modern English (Partridge 1966/1977). “Pathos” in turn means to suffer in the sense of to endure, to undergo, or to be at the effect of. A single mention in Aristotle in the original Greek of empathes occurs in Aristotle’s On Dreams in which the coward experiences intense fear upon imagining that he sees his enemy approaching. In the original Greek, the references to empathes are few and marginal, generally meaning “in a state of intense emotion,” “passionate emotion,” or “much affected by,” a distinctly different meaning than it has today. The short list of other occurrences in antiquity is filled out by a single reference each in Plutarch’s Lives, in Flavius Jospheus Antiquitates Judaica, and Polybius Histories (entry on empathes in Liddell and Scott 1940).
In contrast, the number of references to “sympathy” is hundreds of entries long and is diverse, extending from Aeschylus, Aristophanes, Aristotle, Demosthenes, and frequently breaking though to the English in Shakespeare. The meanings include the constellation of ones that we would recognize including “agreement,” “pity,” “compassion,” “transmission of affect,” and “suggestibility.”
In the English language “empathy” simply did not exist prior to Cornell University psychologist Edward Bradford Titchner’s neologism in translating the German word “Einfühlung” as “empathy” in his lectures based on his work in the laboratory of Wilhelm Wundt (E. B. Titchener (1909)). Arguably the German is best captured by a phrase such as “feeling one’s way into,” but the advantages of a single word also have merit. Thus, it is technically an error, but one with an underlying kernel of truth, when one of the foremost researchers on empathy uses “empathy” as a substitute for “sympathy” as in the following from Hoffman: “And the British version of utilitarianism represented by David Hume, Adam Smith, and others for whom empathy was a necessary social bond, finds expression in current research on empathy, compassion, and the morality of caring” (2000: 2, 123). As noted, the word “empathy” did not exist in the English language when Hume (1739) and Smith (1759) write about engaging the foundations of morality in “sympathy,” the latter being the only word they used. Yet Hoffman captures an aspect of the truth as the word “sympathy” itself as used by Hume and Smith included the communicability of affect and emotional contagion, which today we would also count as inputs to “empathy” without, however, reducing empathy to emotional contagion and low level transmission of affect without remainder.
Prior to the arrival of the word “empathy” into the English language, “sympathy” captured the distinction “communicability of affect,” onto which additional meanings were layered. Hume and Smith are the main witnesses to this development. With the arrival of the word “empathy,” the difference between a method of data gathering about the experiences (sensations, affects, emotions) of other individuals and the use of this experience for ethically relevant processing, decision making, and evaluations was able to moved into the foreground.
Meanwhile, the Continental tradition reenacts in its own terms some of the same challenges in the German language that occurred around “sympathy” in the British tradition. Starting with Herder (1772/1792; see also Forster 2010: 19), and reaching to the 20th century in the writings of the phenomenologists such as Husserl, Scheler, and Stein a group of terms around “fühlen” [to feel] was occurring. Thus: “mitfühlen,” to “feel with” or “sympathize” and “nachfühlen,” to “feel vicariously” or even “to feel after” as in an after-image of a feeling. All these semantic distinctions emerged alongside “einfühlen,” to “empathize” or “to feel one’s way into” (Scheler 1913/22; Forster 2010: 39). Wilhelm Dilthey dismissed Einfühlung in favor of nacherleben [reexperiencing, reliving], nachfühlen (and Verstehen [understanding]) (see Makkreel 1975: 6-7, 252, 290). However, the point where these two traditions intersect is precise. The German psychologist Theodor Lipps translated Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature into German (1739/1904 Hume/Lipps) even as Lipps was completing his own Aesthetik (1903). Lipps eventually published the translation of Hume in two volumes in 1904/1906. Without directly borrowing what Hume said about “sympathy,” Lipps made empathy (Einfühlung) into the foundation of his aesthetics and an account of other minds. While “sympathy” comes across into German as “sympathie,” the seed was planted for the close connection between sympathy and (aesthetic) taste that developed into an entire aesthetic (Lipps 1903) in which Einfühlung (empathy) plays the central role. An entire generation of thinkers, including Freud, Husserl, and Heidegger, was inhibited from using the precise term “empathy” [“Einfühlung”]. Further more, when they did use it in the context of overcoming otherness, they marginalized it. This was because they were reluctant to invoke echoes of Lipps’ psychology of beauty and art – as well as Lipps’s solipsistic reveries that the individual psyche is what animates and enlivens nature and other individual through projective empathy. Scheler got it accurate dismissing Lipps’ “projective empathy”.
One of the innovations in the use of “empathy” in the 1950s is by the psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut (1959, 1971, 1977, 1984; Goldberg 1999). Kohut’s use is based on his view of philosophy of science (see the Hartmann-Nagel debate (Hartmann, 1959; E. Nagel 1959)) rather than in any usage in Freud, who mostly neglected the word but not the underlying distinction (Trosman & Simmons 1972; Freud 1909 where Einfühlung is explicitly used). Kohut’s use of “empathy” is a method of data gathering oriented towards a listening-based immersion in the affective, experiential, and mental life of the other person. However, even in a relatively value neutral inquiry such as psychoanalysis, the use of empathy as a method of data gathering has turned out to be relevant to ethics. Issues arise around the coherence and integrity of character and the self as a bulwark against unethical behavior such as rampant cheating, drug abuse, gambling, moral malaise and other individual, social, and communal ills.
In the parable of the Good Samaritan (Luke 10: 30-27), the Priest and the Levite cross the road and pass by the Jewish traveler who was robbed, beaten by thieves, and left for dead. The Samaritan (today that would be a local inhabitant, a Palestinian) stops to help the individual in need. Multiple, overlapping descriptions are available of the Samaritan as a would-be moral agent. For example: The Samaritan’s altruism was aroused. His sympathy was aroused. His empathy was aroused. In the case of those who crossed the road and passed by the victim without stopping, the experience of empathic distress was decisive (arguably). They experienced the other’s suffering and were overwhelmed by it. They handled the empathic experience of suffering by avoiding the situation. In the case of the Samaritan, the empathic distress was transformed into sympathetic distress (under one description (Hoffman 2000: 87-88)), which, in turn, motivated a pro-social, helping, altruistic intervention to aide the traveler. An entirely different description is available: ethics is fundamental in attributing the altruistic decision from the start to a fundamental recognition on the part of the Samaritan, answering the question, “Who is my neighbor?” The answer? The neighbor is the individual in need. By the end of this article, we shall not necessarily know which description is the truth with a capital “T,” but we shall have determined the terms of the debate and defined the issues in detail.
A working definition of “empathy” will be useful. At the level of phenomenal awareness of everyday human experience in the world with other humans, the minimal essential constituents of empathy include: (i) a receptivity (“openness”) to the affects of others whether in face-to-face encounter or as artifacts of human imagination (“empathic receptivity”); (ii) an understanding of the other in which the other individual is interpreted as a possibility—a possibility of choosing, making commitments, and implementing them (“empathic understanding”) in which the aforementioned possibility is implemented; (iii) an interpretation of the other from first-, second-, and third-person perspectives (“empathic interpretation”); and (iv) an articulation in language of this receptivity, understanding and interpretation, including the form of speech known as listening that enables the other to appreciate that he or she has been the target of empathy (“empathic listening”). In terms of the example of the Good Samaritan, the Samaritan is empathically receptive to the suffering of the traveler. This openness informs his understanding of the possibility that the other is a fellow traveler like himself. The other is interpreted as a neighbor (in the second person). This neighborliness is expressed in words and deeds by his stopping and altruistically giving assistance.
This working definition includes the possibility of alternative, orthogonal definitions, for example, from the perspective of functional causality. In the latter, another’s affects are the cause of mine in the context of a self-other distinction in which a causal construct such as a “shared manifold” is deployed below the threshold of introspective awareness in our biology (“neurology”) to explain the functions of perspective taking and emotional control (Gallese 2007). It is also consistent with a neuron-computational representation that uses mirror neurons to implement the transfer of affectivity from one individual to another (Jackson, Meltzoff, and Decety 2005; Decety & Jackson). It is consistent with a hermeneutic definition that deploys a double representation of the self’s representation of the other’s intentional fulfillment and the further processing of these representations (Agosta 2010; Husserl 1929/35; Stein 1917; Zahavi 2005). As we shall see, “sympathy” in Hume corresponds to at least two of these definitions of the communicability of affect and the ability to put oneself in the other’s place ((ideal) perspective taking). In addition, he has two definitions that do not overlap with empathy – a reactive response that is compassionate and caring towards another’s suffering and (as Hume uses it) the power of suggestion (to which we now turn).
David Hume has at least four distinct meanings of “sympathy.” These develop along with his thinking about the foundations of ethics. First, “sympathy” functions in the communicability of affect; next it encompasses what is often described as “emotional contagion,” the communicability of affect without the inclusion of the idea of the other individual as its source; additionally, it encompasses the power of suggestion; and, finally, it comes to include an element of benevolence. How this series of transformations unfolds is the topic of this story as the meaning of “sympathy” evolves from a communicability of affect to the responsive sentiment of compassion which is one of the essential ways that we regard sympathy today.
Always the astute phenomenologist, the philosopher, David Hume, witnesses the divergence of sympathy into components that will blend with the judgment of taste, taking on an irreversible dimension of evaluation, across both an ethical and aesthetic dimension. Other components identified by Hume develop into the form of human empathy known to us as the mere communicability of affect, subject to further cognitive processing. By the time Hume writes his 1741 essay “Of the delicacy of taste and passion,” he assimilates all the advantages for human interrelations of “sympathy” such as friendship, intimacy, interpersonal warmth to “delicacy of taste” (1741: 25-28; 1757: 3-24). Hume’s contribution to the transformations of sympathy has a significant subtlety and depth that deserves a substantial treatment of its own much longer than that engaged here.
By “sympathy” Hume does not initially mean the particular sentiments of pity or compassion or benevolence but rather the function of communicating affect in general. Relying on his simple psychology of ideas and impression, sympathy reverses the operation of the understanding, which converts impressions of sensation into ideas. In the case of sympathy, the operation is in the other direction – from idea to impression. Sympathy arouses ideas in the recipient that are transformed into impressions – though this time impressions of reflection – through the influence of the ideas. Thus, the operation of sympathy:
‘Tis indeed evident, that when we sympathize with the passions and sentiments of others, these movements appear at first in our mind as mere ideas, and are conceiv’d to belong to another person, as we conceive any other matter of fact. ‘Tis also evident, that the ideas of the affections of others are converted into the very impressions they represent, and that the passions arise in conformity to the images we form of them (T 22.214.171.124; SBN 319-20).
Sympathy reverses the operation of the understanding, which transforms impressions of sensation into ideas. Sympathy arouses impressions through the influence of ideas. The functional basis of this sympathetic conversion will turn out to be the imagination. In this view, sympathy is not to be mistaken with some particular affect such as pity or compassion, but is rigorously defined by Hume as “the conversion of an idea into an impression by the force of imagination” (T 126.96.36.199; SBN 427). The other’s anger gets expressed and is apprehended sympathetically as an idea, which idea is communicated to me, and, in turn, through the sympathetic work of the imagination, arouses a corresponding impression of my own. This is an impression of reflection that is fainter and calmer than the initial idea (or impression) of anger. (An “impression of reflection” is an impression of an idea or (in some cases) of a vivid impression.) I thus experience what may be variously described as a trace affect, a counter-part feeling, or a vicarious experience—of anger.
In short, the one individual now knows what the other is experiencing because she experiences it too, not as the numerically identical impression, but as one that is qualitatively similar. This operation of sympathy, at least in this example, is also crucially distinct from emotional contagion, as in the mass behavior of crowds, since the passion and sentiments are “conceived to belong to another person.” This is crucial. This introduces the other and the distinction between one individual and the other. Significantly, the concept of the other accompanies the impression that is aroused in the one individual as a result of the other’s expression.
Hume distinguishes between sympathy and emotional contagion (T 188.8.131.52; SBN 316-7; T 184.108.40.206; SBN 592). Sympathy requires a double representation. What the other is feeling is represented in a vicarious feeling, which is what sympathy shares with emotional contagion. However, sympathy in the full sense also requires a representation of the other as the source of the first representation, “conceived to belong to the other person” (T 220.127.116.11; SBN 319-20). The distinction “other” is what is missing in the case of emotional contagion.
Hume establishes sympathy as the glue that affectively binds others to oneself and, by implication, binds a community of ethical individuals together. One of the undisputed masters of the English language in his own day (and ours), Hume asserts that “the minds of men are mirrors to one another, not only because they reflect each others emotions, but also because those rays of passions, sentiments and opinions may be often reverberated and decay away by insensible degrees” (T 18.104.22.168; SBN 365). Here one does experience an immediate resonance (“reverberation”) with the other, perceiving pleasure in the smile, pain in the grimace, or anger in the clenched teeth. In this case, a counterpart feeling – a vicarious feeling – is aroused in oneself and, in turn, becomes the experiential basis for further cognitive activity about what is going on with the other person.
However, Hume finds now that he is at risk of having undercut ethics by giving to sympathy such a central role in creating community. Experience shows that sympathy is diminished by distance of time and proximity and relatedness (“acquaintance”). We are much less affected by the pleasures and pains of those at a great distance than by those in our immediate physical vicinity or (say) close family relations. So an earthquake in China creates less sympathetic distress in me than an earthquake in Los Angeles (in my own country), even if I am perfectly safe in either case. According to Hume, my ethical approbation of (and obligations to) those at a great distance from me are no less strong than to those close at hand. The balance of impartiality needs to be restored by appealing to an unbiased ideal observer. In turn, this sets up a tension between the sympathetic observer of the moral agent and the ideal, unbiased one. “Unbiased” does not mean “unsympathetic”; yet it does not mean “wholly sympathetic” either. This is an issue. The ideal observer and the sympathetic one are complementary at best, and possibly even contrary. Being sympathetic reduces distance between individuals; being an ideal observer creates distance. Let us now look at two possible ways of resolving the tension between the ideal observer and sympathy as the basis for moral approbation and disapproval. (Slote will have a third approach considered in detail further below.)
The first is due to Stephen Darwall’s reading of Hume as going beyond moral sentiment (at least implicitly) to rule regulation in accounting for such artificial virtues as justice and related convention-based virtues like adhering to contracts. Hume says that the motivation to justice is produced through sympathy in observing the beneficial results of justice (Darwall 1995: 314-5). Indeed Hume expresses what would become a very Kantian approach, though whether he does so consistently is an issue: “[W]e have no real or universal motive for observing the laws of equity but the very equity and merit of that observance” (SBN: 483). And: “’Tis evident we have no motive leading us to the performance of promises, distinct from a sense of duty. If we thought, that promises had no moral obligation, we never shou’d feel any inclination to observe them” (SBN 518; quoted in Darwall 1995: 302). It is easy to agree with Darwall’s general conclusion that Hume points towards the result that a virtue such as justice requires a rule-based obligation without explicitly embracing it, going beyond empirical naturalism, to account for justice. Through Darwall’s argumentative force, subtlety, and mastery of the details, both sympathy and the ideal observer are undercut, resulting in a Hume that reads much like Kant. This is not Hume’s point of view, though he anticipates and inspired Kant. Hume is not a closet Kantian. Sympathy is a source of information about the experience of the other individual. But that is not all. Hume’s commitment is that, in addition to the latter, sympathy is also a source of morality. Thus, Hume is constrained to evolve “sympathy” in the direction of “compassion” and “benevolence” to maintain his program. Darwall does not follow him there, but, as we shall see, it is a matter of controversy whether the modern account of empathy should do so.
The second approach is a reconstruction of the disinterested spectator as the sympathetic spectator. In other words, the key term “disinterested” means lacking a “conflict of interest,” not “unsympathetic” in the sense of “inhumanly cold-hearted”. The ideal spectator has to be sympathetic, not in the sense of benevolent (which “sympathy” has come to mean in part thanks to Hume’s usage), but in the sense of openness to the communicability of affect. Appreciating what the other is feeling is a useful, though not always decisive, data point in evaluating the ethical qualities of the agent being considered in the judgment of approbation. It makes a difference in contemplating the moral worth of someone making a charitable gift whether it is done with the feeling of pleasure in being better than the poor wretches who are its beneficiaries or with a trace feeling of the suffering of the other individual, which one’s gift might relieve. What the other is experiencing is useful input to the process of ethical assessment of the quality of character of the individual in question. As sympathy is enlarged in Hume beyond the narrow scope of one’s family and friends, it gives way to benevolence, an interest in the well-being of all mankind, as the basis of morality, while “sympathy” as a term used by Hume is trimmed back and reduced to emotional contagion.
Historically, what Hume does next is to develop his understanding (and definition) of “sympathy” in the direction of “benevolence.” “Sympathy” converges with benevolence as the latter supplements it in the founding of morality in an Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). Without appreciating the consequences for his use of “sympathy,” Hume starts developing the idea in the direction of “benevolence,” the latter being specific benefits that interest us in the good of mankind:
‘Tis true, when the cause is compleat, and a good disposition is attended with good fortune, which renders it really beneficial to society, it gives a stronger pleasure to the spectator, and is attended with a more lively sympathy (T 22.214.171.124; SBN 585).
Virtue in rags is still virtue, as Hume famously notes, and sympathy interests us in the good of all mankind (“society”) (T 126.96.36.199; SBN 584), including communities distant from us in location or time. In answering the objection that “good intentions are not good enough for morality,” Hume argues back in so many words that good intentions are indeed good enough, granted that good intentions plus good consequences (results) are even better. However, “sympathy” has now taken on the content of benevolence, that is, an interest in furthering the well being of mankind, not just being open to man’s experiences, including suffering. By the time Hume’s Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals is published in 1751, “sympathy” has been downgraded to the power of suggestion, nothing more; and the basis of morality is shifted to such sentiments as benevolence, displaying qualities useful and agreeable to oneself and others.
In the following passage in Treatise, we witness Hume’s development of the meaning of “sympathy”. “Sympathy” migrates from a communicability of affect, which includes a concept of the other that aligns with the modern concept of “empathy,” towards a narrower, but not exclusive, sense of emotional contagion. Within the context of the Treatise, Hume builds a complete sense of sympathy out of the contagiousness of the passions by adding the idea of the other to the communicability of affect. In the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals the contagiousness of the passions is all that will remain of sympathy:
‘Tis remarkable, that nothing touches a man of humanity more than any instance of extraordinary delicacy in love or friendship, where a person is attentive to the smallest concerns of his friend. . . The passions are so contagious, that they pass with the greatest facility from one person to another, and produce correspondent movements in all human breast. Where friendship appears in very signal instances, my heart catches the same passion, and is warmed by those warm sentiments, that display themselves me (T 188.8.131.52; SBN 604-5).
When put in context, this points to a remarkable development in Hume’s thinking. Hume moves sympathy from the center to the periphery of his account of human judgments (approbation and disapproval). This is complimented by the contrary movement of taste from the periphery to the center. The social advantages of sympathy in forming human relationships – friendship, enjoyment of the “characters of men,” fellow feeling, and sensitivity to how one’s actions have an impact on others – are shifted elsewhere, amazingly enough in the direction of the aesthetic sense of taste.
Hume explicitly writes:
Thus the distinct boundaries and offices of reason and of taste are easily ascertained. The former conveys the knowledge of truth and falsehood; the latter give the sentiment of beauty and deformity, vice and virtue (1751: 173f., 269; emphasis added).
Thus, Hume is engaging in what we might describe a journey back from morality to its foundation and infrastructure in taste. By 1751, “sympathy” has been reduced in Hume’s work to “natural sympathy,” which overlaps substantially with what we would today call “the power of suggestion”. The merit of benevolence and its utility in promoting the good of mankind through attributes useful and agreeable to oneself and others looms large in founding morality (for example, Hume 1751: 241).
By the time of the Enquiry (1751), the push down of “sympathy” behind compassion and taste is complete. The reactive aspects of “sympathy” get split off and migrate in the direction of compassion. Compassion takes on the content of qualities useful to mankind as benevolence. Taste dominates the field of fine-grained distinctions in the communicability of feelings between persons (“friends”) as well as in the appreciation of beauty. This former point is essential. Taste gives us an enjoyment of the qualities of the characters of persons in conversation, humor, and friendship that are a super-set of what empathy does today in our current usage with its fine-grained distinctions in accessing the experiences of other persons. The prospect of “delicacy of sympathy” in the social realm of human interrelations is left without further development by Hume. The true heir to Hume’s undeveloped “delicacy of sympathy”, without, however, explicitly having any idea of it, is the psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut whose transformations of empathy include humor, appreciation of art, and wisdom (Kohut 1966).
The other main witness to the vicissitudes of sympathy is Adam Smith, to whom we now turn.
Adam Smith explicitly distinguishes between sympathy and compassion (pity) in his 1759 The Theory of the Moral Sentiments. He also acknowledges a traditional overlap between the two, noting, however, the generalization of sympathy:
Pity and compassion are words appropriated to signify our fellow-feeling with the sorrow of others, sympathy, though its meaning was, perhaps, originally the same, may now, however, without much impropriety, be made use of to denote our fellow-feeling with any passion whatever (1759: 49).
Here sympathy is not some separate reactive affect that occurs in witnessing the pain and suffering of another individual. Rather sympathy operates as the communicability of affect (the passions) regardless of the particular passion. “Fellow feeling” is used as a high level category that enables Smith stylistically to suggest nuances and fine-grained distinctions in his phenomenological descriptions. An argument might be made that, when all is said and done, “sympathy” and “fellow feeling” are used synonymously by Smith. For example, in defining sympathy, Smith cannot use the same term without succumbing to the logical fallacy of petitio principi:
As we have no immediate experience of what other men feel, we can form no idea of the manner in which they are affected, but by conceiving what we ourselves should feel in the like situation [. . . . ] [I]t is by the imagination only that we can form any conception of what are his sensations [. . . .] By the imagination we place ourselves in his situation, we conceive ourselves enduring all the same torments, we enter as it were into his body, and become in some measure the same person with him, and thence form some idea of his sensation, and even feel something which, though weaker in degree, is not altogether unlike them. [. . . .] That this is the source of our fellow-feeling for the misery of others, that it is by changing places in fancy with the sufferer, that we come either to conceive or to be affected by what he feels, may be demonstrated by many obvious observations . . . (1759: 47-8)
In addition to using “fellow feeling” to define “sympathy,” the mechanism by which sympathy operates is the imagination. Specifically, it is the taking of the perspective of the other in the other’s situation. This points to three results.
(1) If “sympathy” is not synonymous with “fellow feeling,” then what is the difference? Sympathy is not responsive in the sense of pity or compassion, the latter being reactions to the suffering of another. Yet sympathy has its responsive dimension. Sympathy requires a responsive approbation or disapprobation of the beneficial or mischievous conduct of the other individual. In Smith, sympathy is fellow feeling plus (dis)approbation:
That where there is no approbation of the conduct of the person who confers the benefit, there is little sympathy with the gratitude of him who receives it: and that, on the contrary, where there is no disapprobation of the motives of the person who does the mischief, there is no sort of sympathy with the resentment of him who suffers it (1759: 143; chapter abstract).
This is a definitive textual answer. Of course, “little sympathy” is perhaps distinct from “absolutely and positively no sympathy”. But this is just understatement for effect. Sympathy is simply missing in the case of an unmerited boon conferred by a would-be benefactor. The bounds of (dis)approbation align closely with those of sympathy. Ultimately, sympathy is the basis of the moral sentiments for Smith because “to sympathize with” means “to align with the estimation of right or wrong based on fellow feeling”. The nuances that arise are many and varied; but Smith is more consistent than he is generally credited in standardly using sympathy as the source of intuitions about the merit (or demerit) of other individuals. This extends not only to their conduct but in the heartfelt attitude they bring to the conduct and its consequences. When we sympathize with the other – approving or disapproving based on the other’s perspective (not one’s own) – then we are aligned with the values of the shared community, especially the community of well-bred English gentlemen. When sympathy breaks down, when we have no fellow feeling with the other, then it is a strong indication that the other has put himself outside the community and is blameworthy, lacking merit. The result is an ethics of the well-bred English gentleman, including his attachments to reputation, prudence, temperance, and so on.
In addition, Smith’s spectator-like perspective aligns with that of the second person in contrast with Hume’s which has a closer resemblance to that of the third person. Stephen Darwall is keenly aware of this and makes the point: “It is not far wrong, indeed, to think of Smith as one of the first philosophers of the ‘second person,’ if not the very first” (Darwall 2006: 46). In many contexts, especially those is which (dis)approbation is not the main issue, Smith’s use of “sympathy” is indistinguishable from “communicability of affect”. This has led some commentators to equate Smith’s use of “sympathy” with empathy pure-and-simple. Thus Darwall, keenly aware of his own second person inquiry:
I prefer to use ‘sympathy’ for feelings of concern for others that are felt, not entirely as from their own point of view, but as from a third-person perspective of one who cares for them, and to use ‘empathy’ for feelings that either imaginatively enter into the other’s standpoint or result from his feelings by contagion (Darwall 2006: 45).
Of course, Darwall’s previous point is that Smith’s usage (unlike Hume’s) is precisely to take the second person perspective. Therefore, for Darwall, Smith’s usage of “sympathy” requires revision to equate “sympathy” with the third-person perspective, leaving room to rewrite the text using “empathy”. However, Darwall arguably overlooks the point indicated in the above-cited quote that, for Smith, sympathy is fellow-feeling plus (dis)approbation, not fellow feeling pure-and-simple.
(2) Do we merely “conceive what we ourselves should feel in the like situation” or are we allowed (or even required) to take on the characteristics of the other in so far as we are able to do so? This is similar to the question “How complete is the identification with the other?” While the above-cited text suggests that the one individual carries his or her characteristics into the situation of the other, the analysis does not stop there. To be sure, a person never completely stops being himself; yet the meta-rule is to put oneself in the other’s situation with the other’s character and circumstance:
But though sympathy is very properly said to arise from an imaginary change of situations with the person principally concerned, yet this imaginary change is not supposed to happen to me in my own person and character, but in that of the person with whom I sympathize. When I condole with you for the loss of your only son, in order to enter into your grief, I do not consider what I, a person of such a character and profession, should suffer, if I had a son, and if that son was unfortunately to die; but I consider what I should suffer if I was really you; and I not only change circumstances, but I change persons and characters. My grief, therefore, is entirely upon your account, and not in the least upon my own. It is not, therefore, in the least selfish (1759: 501-2).
We imagine what it would be like to be the other person with the other’s character. The ideal spectator runs a cognitive simulation in which one may indeed begin with one’s own characteristics as input, but quarantines one’s own peculiarities in favor of those of the other. To be sure, such an exercise is bound to be imperfect and incomplete. There is a strong identification, yet it remains transient, temporary, and incomplete. At that point, sentiments of approbation or disapprobation emerge, which inform the individual’s moral assessment of the situation and the other person in it.
(3) What is involved in feeling what the other feels, yet not approving of it? Smith allows an extensive continuum of degrees of fellow feeling, reaching from a slight hint of what the other is feeling to full blown identification. Sympathy mostly falls in the middle of this spectrum, a transient and trial identification with the other, soon interrupted. The one individual feels what the other feels, yet not quite as intensely. It seems as though there ought to be a logical space for the possibility of fellow feeling without sympathetic (dis)approbation, given that these are not completely synonymous. Yet it does not seem to occur to Smith to allow it. Consider the situation of the condemned criminal about to be hanged.
When an inhuman murder is brought to the scaffold, though we have some compassion for his misery, we can have no sort of fellow-feeling with his resentment, if he should be so absurd as to express any against either his prosecutor or his judgment (1759: 145).
Indeed we adopt the sentiments of the prosecutor and judgment. Taking a hint from Smith’s language here, we can say that the criminal has placed himself outside the limits of the human community with his murderous deeds, a human community from which he is about to be ejected by being hanged. The lesson learned here is that we may have compassion for lower forms of life, but sympathy is arguably co-extensive with the human and defines the foundation of our participation in the community. For Smith, “sympathize with” is synonymous with “align with the other’s feeling in such a way as to approve or disapprove along with the other” (not a quote from Smith, but Smith’s bottom line).
John Rawl’s magisterial A Theory of Justice (1971) contains sections on features of the moral sentiments and moral psychology, including a discussion of sympathy and the impartial sympathetic spectator. After the parties in a would-be society have adopted the principles of justice as fairness in the original position, the result is Kantian. Natural abilities such as strength, intelligence, inherited gifts, are unevenly distributed to individuals but are a collective asset so that the more fortunate are to benefit in ways that help those who are least well endowed. Inequalities are arranged for reciprocal advantage. By abstaining from the exploitation of the accidents of nature and social contingencies with the framework of equal liberty and the difference principle, persons express their respect for one another in the constitution of society itself (Rawls 1971: 179). Can this capture the utilitarian approach of the impartial, sympathetic spectator? At first it seems that it can:
Now while it is possible to supplement the impartial spectator definition with the contract point of view, there are other ways of giving it a deductive basis. Thus suppose that the ideal observer is thought of as a perfectly sympathetic being. Then there is a natural derivation of the classical principle of utility along the following lines. An institution is right, let us say, if an ideally sympathetic and impartial spectator would approve of it more strongly than any other institution feasible in the circumstances. For simplicity we may assume, as Hume sometimes does, that approval is a special kind of pleasure [. . . ] This special pleasure is the result of sympathy. In Hume’s account it is quire literally a reproduction in our experience of the satisfactions and pleasures which we recognize to be felt by others [. . . .] Men’s natural capacity for sympathy suitably generalized provides the perspective from which they can reach an understanding on a common conception of justice. (1971: 185-6)
In either case, contractual or utilitarian, the argument moves in the direction of fairness and equilibrium; yet the original (contractual) position more accurately captures the human condition – namely, that individuals have distinct abilities and gifts. In Rawl’s original position, the parties are behind the “veil of ignorance,” disinterested and lacking knowledge of their natural abilities or social situation. Inequalities are just only if they result in compensating benefits for everyone. In contrast, the classical utilitarians have perfect knowledge and sympathetic identification. Both result in a correct estimate of the net sum of satisfaction. But classical utilitarianism fails to distinguish between persons, in effect collapsing distinct persons with distinct abilities into a one dimensional, impartial sympathetic spectator. The parties in the original position would not agree to the approvals of the impartial sympathetic spectator as the standard of justice, according to Rawls. Why not? Such a spectator does not have access to the concept of risk – the risk that one might be born poor and marginalized rather than (say) rich and in the main stream. It simply is not captured. The veil of ignorance is designed to yield principles of justice as fairness whereby, even if your antipathetic enemy is choosing what role you will play in society (presumably you will end up poor and with limited natural abilities), the advantages that the other party has will be distributed in such a way as to contribute to everyone’s advantage. In contrast, for the impartial sympathetic spectator to yield justice as fairness, the parties are conceived as perfect altruists, whose desires conform to the approvals of such a spectator. “The greater net balance of happiness with which to sympathize, the more a perfect altruist achieves his desire” (1971: 189). In fact, the world is filled with individuals with competing interests, who, moreover, are antipathetic (hostile) to one another, and the utilitarian aligns everyone’s interests in a most counter-intuitive way. Justice is not necessary unless individuals are antipathetic and the interests of individuals come into conflict, the actual situation of the real world. In a world of conflicting interests, sympathy still has a role to play in transmitting affects, but it is not foundational. Is there then a logical space between self-interest and duty to account for the relationship between empathy and altruism?
In Nagel’s argument, the interest of others in the world and one’s own interest are in balance. It is not that the world comes ahead of one’s own – which, arguably, would look like utilitarianism and the greatest good of the greatest number. Although consequences are inevitably a part of the description of the ethical dilemma, the determination of interest is not exclusively reducible to the consequential calculation. Rather we are looking formally and logically at the priority of one’s own interest over against that of the other individuals in the world, and one’s own interest does not have any more priority. But it does not necessarily have any less, for the majority of the world would not be justified in inflicting pain on one individual even if it resulted in their greater good anymore than one individual would be justified in doing so to the majority. Is there a logical space available to establish a link between empathy and the austere ethics of duty (deontology) based on the structure of action? This is needed to avoid succumbing to the reactivity of moral sentiments (shame, guilt, benevolence, compassion, and so on). These are powerful motivators of moral behavior, and as such deserve cultivation, but are logically dubious founders of it.
This argument enables Thomas Nagel (1970) in effect to say “Act so as to reduce the pain (of persons) in the world.” Depending on one’s perspective, this is a special case by way of generalization of the self-interested maxim to “act so as to reduce my own pain” along with “I am in the world with others” and “we are all others (persons)”. For example, in being altruistic, both my own pain and that of the other are regarded impersonally. Actions that reduce my pain remain self-interested in an obvious way – I am no longer in pain. Acts that reduce the pain of the other are just an impersonal version of my acting to reduce the pain experienced personally.
The next step was not taken by Nagel who elsewhere disparages a version of empathy based on an incomplete and misleading definition. Nagel calls for “an objective phenomenology not dependent on empathy or the imagination” (1974: 402); but this phenomenology may turn out to be inconsistent with his commitment to finite human understanding. Without empathy and the imagination, the bat’s experience becomes the inaccessible thing in itself (ding an sich). The bat is the one who does not know what it is like to be a bat, since the bat lacks my concept of battiness (not to mention such distinctions as echo-location, flying mouse, and mammal). In Nagel 1970 he writes: “Any justification ends finally with the rationally gratuitous presence of the emotion of sympathy; if that condition were not met, one would simply have no reason to be moral” (1970: 11). Here “sympathy” means “pity” or “compassion” or “benevolence,” rather than the possibility of communicating any possible affect or sensation, which was Hume’s initial and primary meaning of “sympathy” (see Hume 1739: 319).
Yes, I should so act to reduce the pain in the world, including the other’s and my own too. But how do I know the other is in pain? The answer is empathy. In any particular situation and with apologies to Kant, altruism without empathy (sympathy) is like a concept without intuition. The vicarious experience of the other’s pain and the processing of it in empathic receptivity and interpretation is an essential part of how the would-be altruist comes to know of the other’s distress. This does not mean I cannot be wrong. It means that I can advance from the possibility of altruism to its implementation in actual situations through marshalling, capturing, and organizing the evidence of interrelational receptivity through empathy. Having established then that empathy provides an essential input to ethical altruism, is it perhaps capable of being elaborated into a foundation for an ethics of caring?
Michael Slote (2007, 2010) finds in empathy the basis for an ethics of caring that provides the basis for a moral sentimentalism. Drawing mainly on Hume, with an occasional nod to Smith, Slote shifts the analysis from an evaluation of behavior to the moral worth of agents engaging in action. One’s ability to empathize defines the boundary of the human community or as Slote puts it (2010: 13) provides “cement of the moral universe”. Slote finds significant inspiration in Hutcheson’s idea of a moral sense of approval or disapproval. Slote then substitutes empathy for that moral sense, however, with significant conditions and qualifications (2010: 33-4). Slote argues that empathy provides an “understandable mechanism for moral approval and disapproval” (2010: 33), lending philosophic rigor to the mere metaphor of moral sense. Slote claims to identify a second order empathy:
In particular, if agents’ actions reflect empathic concern for (the well-being or wishes of) others, empathic beings will feel warmly or tenderly toward them, and such warmth and tenderness empathically reflect the empathic warmth or tenderness of the agents. I want to say that such (in one sense) reflective feeling, such empathy with empathy, also constitutes moral approval, and possibly admiration as well, for agents and/or their actions (2010: 34-5).
Let us return to our paradigm example of the Good Samaritan and see how this works. We are fine as long as the Good Samaritan, for example, feels warmly or tenderly towards the traveler who was waylaid by robbers and left for dead. Empathy is properly understood as requiring a communicability of affect between the rescuer and the observer – in this case Slote or the ideal observer – who approve or disapprove of the moral worth of the agent. Of course, we can contingently imagine that the Samaritan, in the act of helping the stranger, recognizes that what he is doing has significant value, acknowledging himself for his good character and producing a warm feeling, whether of self-approval or mere self-recognition. This warm feeling of the Samaritan, in turn, becomes the target for the empathy of the ideal observer, who experiences a trace affect of it. However, the example works less well if the Samaritan is too busy helping the other to consider self-recognition or –acknowledgement. Even more, the example works not at all if the Samaritan, who is actually a Palestinian, sees that the victim is a Hebrew settler, but, in spite of their being sworn enemies, he recognizes the suffering humanity through a trace affect of suffering disclosed in his empathic receptivity, and decides, in spite of his antipathic negative feeling, to come to the traveler’s aid, not because of any feeling but because that is what duty requires of him. Ambivalence is not a problem and is likely in most scenarios (see Greenspan 1980).
Further issues loom for Slote with altruism, which is considered in more detail in his first empathy book, which complements the later one consistently (2007, 2010). Thus, he distinguishes empathy as a method of accessing the experiences of the other from specific emotions such as compassion, pity, love, and so on. However, Slote then mixes empathy with altruism: “A person who is fully empathic with and concerned about others will sometimes give up something that she wants in order to help another person gain something good” (Slote 2007: 116). In this context, Slote points out that this “give up something” is not irrational. Indeed it is not. This sounds like altruism because that is what it is. Only if “rationality” is mistaken for one’s own narrow self-interest (not Slote’s problem), whether long or short term, does it become impossible to help others without falling into unqualified egoism. In general, when, on the basis of empathy, a person does something to help another person, the helping shows up as a form of altruism. Thus Slote:
The criterion offered [. . .] in terms of empathic caring was a moral criterion, a criterion of moral permissibility, and when I spoke of supererogation, I was again speaking in specifically moral terms. In that sense, too, the empathically caring individual can be characterized as possessing (a) moral virtue, and I think it is fair to say that the present book has been primarily interested in the moral aspect of the ethics of care (Slote 2007: 118).
The moral aspect of the ethics of caring is precisely empathy, according to Slote. However, contra Slote, empathy does not require that one do anything other than listen empathically and talk empathically in response, thus falling short of the practical caring (for example, serving dinner) intended here by Slote. Indeed a quiet, rich empathic silence is often sufficient. If one decides to take action on the basis of empathy, then the action may be altruistic if the beneficiary is a stranger or the action may be caring (in the narrow sense of feeding one’s own hungry child) if the beneficiary is someone “near and dear,” who one is obligated to attend to in any case. Thus, it is important to distinguish directly helping others by caring for their physical needs, feeding the hungry, binding up the wounds of the injured, sheltering the injured traveler, and so on, and empathizing with the other in such a way to allow the other to regain their emotional equilibrium when it has been lost or upset (admittedly by traumas and suffering). If a person telling a moving story is moved to tears in the course of the narrative, strictly speaking, offering the individual a tissue to dry his eyes is an action. However, it is a largely symbolic gesture that says “I recognize the human suffering and wish to comfort it” rather than an action such as that of the Roman Centurion who cuts his cloak in half and gives it to the freezing beggar.
It is a useful rule of thumb that altruism ministers to one’s physical (bodily) needs whereas empathy responds to and is aroused by a person’s emotional and affective expressions of animate life. The two can diverge dramatically. For example, after the fall of the Soviet Union Rumanian orphanages were understaffed, bare bones institutions that rigged up mechanical, assembly line-like ways of delivering bottled milk to infants, like feeders in a bird cage. The results were the production of symptoms developmentally similar to neurological damage, autism, and infantile psychosis (M. A. Diego and N. A. Jones 2007: 161; Spitz 1946). Many of these symptoms were able to be reversed by adoptive, caring, nurturing parents, but, depending on the duration of the neglect, not all.
Much is made of the short circuiting of action in and by empathy by professional practitioners of empathy. This is due to the uses of empathy in psychotherapy, counseling, and psychoanalysis. In such situations, it would be counterproductive, if not harmful, for the therapist actively to intervene altruistically in the client’s life with specific maxims and advice about what to do. Psychotherapy activates many boundaries between therapist and client, including ethical ones and ones of action. Psychotherapy provides a counter-example to Slote. Neither therapeutic empathy nor empathic distress are a motive for action, though they can clarify the context of action or provide insight into both reasons and causes. If one grasps aspects of the other and his situation through empathy, then one may discover reasons that one did not know were relevant or engaged by his character or that character in a particular situation.
Next, going beyond imperfect duties such as altruism to perfect ones, Slote offers a general criterion of right and wrong action based in the notion of empathy – specifically empathic caring or concern for others:
[. . . ] One can claim that actions are morally wrong and contrary to moral obligation if, and only if, they reflect or exhibit or express an absence (or lack) of fully developed empathic concern for (or caring about) others on the part of the agent (2007: 31).
Slote proposes that empathy – more precisely, “empathic caring” – is a moral criterion. Are we then obligated to strive to develop our empathy (empathic caring) so that we are equal to the criterion? Slote does not explicitly assert that we are obligated to develop our empathy; yet without empathy we do not flourish as humans.
Slote asserts that he does not advocate implementing an obligation to be empathic. However, this risks getting stranded on the horns of a dilemma. First of all, such an obligation (Slote asserts) would set a bar too high for most people, given that we do not get training in empathy, and so risk violating the “ought implies can” injunction. That is, we cannot create an obligation, which we know in advance that we cannot live up to. Yet if we are to advance to “fully developed empathic concern” do we not have an obligation to develop empathy even if it is not required in any particular situation? At the very least, empathy would be an “imperfect duty to self and others” similar to developing one’s talents and gifts – empathy, humor, charity, wisdom – and using them to create community and a flourishing society.
“Fully developed empathic concern” is doing a lot of the work for Slote here. It will contain all the conditions and qualifications required to restrict empathic concern from requiring supererogatory deeds. Empathic concern does not. Empathic concern includes those geographically remote, and excluding them would unfairly subject them to violations of obligations. Empathic concern allows for the development of empathy in those whose initial (“natural”) endowments of it may be less generous than the average individual (practice improves talent). The argument is instructive and useful – as well as ad hoc.
In order to preserve empathy as a moral criterion, even against these issues, Slote argues against describing empathy as partialist (favoring those “near and dear”). Slote argues against the common sense intuition that people initially seem to have less empathy towards those who are different – different race (skin color), different religion, different gender, different diet than those to whom one is partial such as one’s family (2007: 35). Unfortunately, distrust seems to be the default attitude towards strangers, and often with good reason. Therefore, in a reaction formation meant to manage mistrust, many traditional cultures make it obligatory to shelter and protect guests. What better way than carefully to keep watch over them than to declare they are “guests”?
It is a further question of how the example of the Good Samaritan affects our own empathic receptivity as potential (ideal) observers of the would-be moral agent. In observing the suffering of the victim of the robbers as well as observing the Samaritan’s empathic suffering with the victim, we (as observers) have several empathic experiences. Like the Samaritan, we empathize directly with the distress of the victim. We also experience the suffering of the Samaritan who experiences a double pain. The Samaritan experiences first the vicarious experience (pain) of the suffering of the victim. In addition, the Samaritan experiences the pain experienced in sacrificing his own time, effort, and money in interrupting his (the Samaritan’s) trip, binding up the victims wounds, and leaving him with the Inn Keeper, promising to pay for any additional expenses upon his return. If the Samaritan gives himself credit for his good deed, in effect saying to himself “I acknowledge myself as an agent for doing the right thing in a tough spot,” then we (as observers) can arguably also have an empathic experience of the warm feeling of that self acknowledgement. Slote finds in this experience a second order empathy (Slote 2010: 39) that contains a warm feeling of approval. Slote then finds in this experience an important contribution to the moral basis of an ethics of caring. Some critics find this second order empathy to be a mis-description of the phenomenon, mistaking a response of what Hoffman calls “sympathetic distress” towards the suffering of the other for empathy (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Indeed Hoffman, who is consistently cited by Slote with agreement, clearly distinguishes “empathic distress” from “sympathetic distress,” granted that Slote does not use such a distinction. For empathy to become an input to morality, it is first transformed from “empathic distress” into “sympathetic distress,” at which point the latter can become the motive for pro-social (altruistic) behavior such as the Samaritan’s (Hoffman 2000: 87-88).
It is a matter of controversy that empathy includes a warm feeling of approval (as asserted by Slote 2010: 36-41). Slote implicitly lines up with Rawls where approval provides a special kind of pleasure, granted that Rawls (like Hume) restricts the argument to “sympathy” (Rawls 1971: 185-6). Approval or disapproval is not the only ethical response possible. Empathy is distinct from (ethical) approval in that it gives rise to a whole host of downstream responses (reactions). As distinct from empathy, certain forms of antipathy can also be marshaled as when a (hostile) enemy of the traveler experiences Schadenfreude (delight at someone’s misfortune) upon witnessing the latter’s misfortune. Indeed what makes the parable so powerful and dramatic is that the Samaritan (Palestinian) is actually the enemy of the victim, but through empathy recognizes suffering humanity and then in a separate decision acts ethically and humanely like a neighbor, not an enemy.
Thus, the altruistic person must frequently deal with overcoming empathic distress – that is, a too intensely felt experience of the other’s pain that goes beyond a vicarious experience of pain and becomes the individual’s own pain pure-and-simple (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Empathic distress can become so intense that one tries to flee from the situation rather than engaging other alternatives such as helping. Under this interpretation, instead of just being hard-hearted (which remains a possibility in principle), empathic distress is what happened to the first two would-be helpers who passed by the victim/traveler, crossing the road due to this empathic distress in order to put distance between themselves and the source of suffering.
However, one may object, does this not raise the bar too high on altruism? Altruism occasions a triple pain. It now produces three episodes of pain – first the initial distress (for example) of traveler waylaid and beaten by robbers; second, the vicarious experience of the victim’s pain as experienced by the would-be Good Samaritan; and finally the sacrifice (pain) incurred by the Samaritan in aiding the victim. Of course, if successful, altruism eliminates the initial suffering of the victim and by implication the vicarious pain in which the Good Samaritan is empathically connected to the target of altruism. This leaves altruism only with whatever pain is caused by the cost and effort incurred in aiding the victim. In contrast, empathy is left with the initial suffering, the vicarious experience of pain, and the question of what, if anything, to do about the suffering disclosed by one’s empathy. Of course, one possible answer is to act altruistically. Alternatively, one could also simply cross over – cross the road – and pass by. Thus, in answer to the objection that this analysis through empathy sets the bar too high for altruism, the answer is direct. Altruism is indeed a high bar; but one which we are challenged by and, with ethical effort, able to surmount. Empathy tells us what the other is experiencing; altruism what to do about it.
The Anglo-American and Continental traditions (neither of which is homogeneous in themselves) have enjoyed an expanding exchange of views in comparison with past periods when each tradition tended to maintain its own island of ideas. Still, the Continental tradition has its own voice and views on empathy and ethics. Three topics have arguably have been the target of a more dedicated inquiry from the Continental side: Nietzsche’s empathic sense of smell as a compliment to his philosophy of suspicion, especially in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887); the Holocaust, especially as interpreted by Hannah Arendt; and the role of the Other (with a capital “O”), especially in Levinas (1961). None of these topics are exclusively the domain of Continental thinking, but are rather invoked here as witnesses of a distinctly Continental contribution.
Although the word “Einfühlung” does not occur in Nietzsche, his approach is arguably an empathic one, especially as empathy activates the primitive sense of smell. Nietzsche’s status as an outsider, as an individual of the limit experience (Grenzerfahrung), informs his sense of smell – and his empathy – with the dynamics of moral sentimentalism in a fundamental way. Nietzsche’s empathy informs his suspicion time-and-again. Empathy functions as a complement to the method of suspicion. Nietzsche feels – and smells – more acutely and distinctly than the various persons that are intermittently the target of his debunking – the scholar (scientist), artist, priest, last man, the mass (herd) man, even the higher man. For example, behind the moral prescription of “love of one’s neighbor” lies the ascetic priest’s antidote to depression, namely, the performance of petty pleasures of doing (minor) acts of kindness to those who are less fortunate. Nietzsche’s empathy detects the petty pleasure as a trace affect, which, in turn, feeds his suspicion. Nietzsche detects the will to power in a cautious dose of the petty pleasure of doing a good deed that costs the doer nothing and benefits the recipient equally little, but has the result of disclosing a happiness of “slight superiority” (1887: Third Essay, Section 18).
For Nietzsche, the sense of smell functions empathically in disclosing a mostly unsuspected trace of weariness. Suspicion is frequently called out as being essential to Nietzsche’s debunking of established bourgeois morals and iconoclasm towards cherished values. Christian ethics, the love of Saint Paul (“agape”), and their implementation by the Church of Rome, are not what they seem to be according to the Christian account. Once called out, Nietzsche experiences what Hoffman calls “empathic distress” at the leveling and mediocrity from which contemporary man suffers – the emptiness, apathy, malaise, and depression – in short, the nihilism of which the average man is mostly unaware but from which he too suffers. However, Nietzsche does not take the next step to “sympathetic distress” (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Instead this underlying suffering is transmitted via emotional contagion through the sense of smell as further input to Nietzsche’s empathic processing: “Bad air, bad air! The approach of some ill-constituted thing, that I have to smell the entrails of some ill-constituted soul” (1887: First Essay, Section 11). Behind the Christian love of the “meek that inherit the earth” Nietzsche’s empathy discovers a trace affect of ressentiment; behind the anti-Semitism of the Church of Rome lies the vengefulness and hatred of slave morality. What passes for virtue is lack of opportunity for badness. Undertaking an inquiry into the formation of ideals such as the Christian “Last Judgment,” “the Kingdom of Heaven,” and [Christian] “faith, hope, and love,” using his empathy, Nietzsche discovers an empathic trace affect of “the intoxication of sweet revenge.” His suspicion then uses these traces to unmask pretensions. All the while, rhetorically exclaiming, “I’ll open my ears again (Oh! Oh! Oh! And close my nose)” (1887: First Essay, Section 14).
Nietzsche’s empathic debunking continues. He quotes from Dante and the Church Father Tertullian that the pleasures of the blessed in heaven will be enhanced by watching from above the tortures of those who are damned in Hell. Not empathy but rather what has come to be called, even in English, “Schadenfreude” – an enjoyment (Freude) at the damages (Schaden) being done to another. Yet even Schadenfreude implies an empathic communication of affect, since the observer’s enjoyment is enhanced by a deep grasp of the suffering of the damned, an appreciation enhanced by a trace affect of the suffering. However, the relationship of Schadenfreude to empathy is one of reactive antipathy. Schaenfreude like sympathy is reactive. In addition to the communication of affect, it includes a response to what is transmitted. Instead of approval or disapproval as in the case of sympathy, the response in Schadenfreud is one of enjoyment at the suffering of the other.
Bad conscience (guilt) seems like a mark of advancing civilization. However, suspicion fulfilled by empathy discloses otherwise. “Bad conscience” is an illness. The more advanced the civilization, the more advanced the guilt. This illness (bad conscience) is hostility, cruelty, destructiveness turned against oneself. This causes “the gravest and uncanniest illness, from which humanity has not yet recovered, man’s suffering of man” (1887: Essay Two, Section 16).
Individuals who escape bad conscience are rare. We can at least envision the possibility in figures in literature such as Achilles, Faust, or Nietzsche’s own cipher Zarathustra, the latter in his better moments of recovery from the great contempt. Nietzsche drives forward his empathic inquiry into the suffering of modern persons and their ideals by a debunking of ascetic ideals. Following his nose – and his empathy – Nietzsche calls again, “And therefore let us have fresh air! fresh air! And keep clear of the madhouse and hospitals of culture!” (1887: Third Essay, Section 14). The result? The priest does not discharge the ressentiment of the modern mass of men, leading their lives of silent desperation and suffering; rather the priest alters the direction of the ressentiment and turns it against the individual: “This is brazen and false enough: but one thing at least is achieved by it, the direction of ressentiment is altered” (1887: Third Essay, Section 16). In conclusion, using a suspicion informed by empathy, Nietzsche famously asserts the position: man would rather will nothing than not will, setting the stage for nihilism. Nietzsche’s empathy points to hidden (and not so hidden) suffering in unexpected places – art, science, religion, philosophy, and, above all, morals. However, in every case, a pattern emerges. Empathy complemented by suspicion shows that it is not so much suffering that man dreads as suffering’s meaninglessness. Thus, ascetic ideals give meaning to man’s suffering by holding out asceticism as a path to something higher. However, some events defy both suffering and meaning and leave us numb, like a deer in the headlights. We now turn to one such event.
The Holocaust represents a challenge to our empathy as we try to grasp the meaning of historic event from afar in anguished, benumbed remembrance. We can grasp the killing of a single individual as a crime and the killing of many as an even more serious crime. We are challenged to grasp the mutual slaughter of armies on fields of battle in the bloodbath known as “history,” but tentatively rise to the occasion as in Tolstoy’s account of the Battle of Borodino, Crane’s The Red Badge of Courage, or even Boden’s Black Hawk Down. But the systematic, bureaucratized, automated destruction of the Jewish population of Europe by the Nazis between 1938 and 1945 is a challenge to our empathy for so many reasons. It remains one of the defining events of post modern ethics. If we cannot empathize with it, we cannot imagine it. If we cannot imagine it, we cannot punish it. If we cannot punish it, we cannot forgive it. We are burdened with it in a way that defines, chokes, and diminishes our humanity. We are stuck with it in a way that defines, chokes, and diminishes what is possible for human beings; but in the face of which we have to go forward into possibility nonetheless. It is important to note this was accompanied by and included the extrajudicial killing of other “life unworthy of life” such as the mentally ill and retarded, gypsies, gays, communists, uncooperative members of other religious and political parties. However, the racial laws and anti-Semitic ideology that specifically preceded the event, targeting Jewish people, make it their Holocaust in a special and unhappy way.
Grasping these ideas require putting one’s thoughts and sensibility in a place that they usually do not venture. In the early days of World War II and prior to the automation of killing in the death factories such as Auschwitz, it was difficult for soldiers and paramilitaries to kill people for eight hours a day by shooting them. However, continuous killing is what was required of the Nazis soldiers when there are so many people to kill. That was what the so-called special intervention groups [Einsatzgruppen] had to do. In addition, it is difficult to watch people suffering over so long a period of time, especially if you have insufficient bullets to shoot or gas them all immediately. This is a challenge for any approach to genocide, even after the intended victims have been marked with a yellow star or otherwise “branded,” equated with vermin, insects, and dehumanized. On the street, people still look like humans when we confront them face-to-face or even face-to-back. The misuse of the Nazi concept of duty, which only superficially resembles a deontological one, has been often noted. It occurs again here and should never be mentioned without being challenged. Briefly, the fallacy consists in making an exception for a subset of humans, thus contradicting one’s own humanness. Even formally, the good Nazi morally contradicts himself – a consistency in shooting only one or a few types of persons (in addition to Jews – gypsies, communists, Catholic converts, gays, mentally retarded, physically disabled – the list grows tellingly) – is inconsistency pure-and-simple. Arendt is worth quoting at length:
. . . The murders were not sadists or killers by nature; on the contrary, a systematic effort was made to weed out all those who derived physical pleasure from what they did. The troops of the Einsatzgruppen [responsible for shooting] had been drafted from the Armed S.S., a military unit with hardly more crimes in its record than any ordinary unit of the German Army, and their commanders had been chosen by [Chief Commander] Heydrich from the S.S. elite with academic degrees. Hence the problem was how to overcome not so much their conscience as the animal pity by which all normal men are affected in the presence of physical suffering. The trick used by Himmler – who apparently was rather strongly afflicted with these instinctive reasons himself – was very simple and probably very effective; it consisted in turning these instincts around, as it were, in directing them toward the self. So that instead of saying: What horrible things I did to people! the murderers would be able to say: What horrible things I had to watch in the pursuance of my duties, how heavily the task weighed upon my shoulders (Arendt 1971: 105-6).
While life is filled with moral ambiguities and difficult ethical choices, this is hardly one of them. What was done was wrong and to be condemned in the strongest terms. Nor is lack of empathy what represents the moral problem. It is the killing.
What made it easier for the soldiers to do their “duty” – commit murder (genocide) – was the manipulation by the leaders to deflect the individual soldier’s natural empathy for the prisoner and to increase the soldier’s empathy for himself, deflecting the natural trajectory towards the other. The “animal pity” and “instinctive reasons” against killing humans are an incomplete form of empathy, based in a mechanism like emotional contagion. In Emile, Rousseau refers to a pre-reflective sentiment of pity. “I am, so to speak, in him, it is in order not to suffer that I do not want him to suffer. I am more interested in him for love of myself, and the reason for the precept is in nature itself, which inspires in me the desire of my well-being in whatever place I feel my existence” (cited in Birmingham 2006: 42). Himmler was afflicted with what Martin L. Hoffman (2000) describes as “empathic distress.”
Without being able to engage further in the infinite sorrow and commentary invoked by the Holocaust, the relevance to empathy is direct. The issue is whether empathy can be used for harm as well as good. In invading Poland and the Netherlands in 1939 and 1940, the Nazis attached sirens to the Stuka dive bombers creating an uncanny noise that seemed to get inside the heads and hearts of the civilian population causing empathic distress. Although it may sound strange to say it, especially after reading Slote, this was based on the Nazi empathy with the victims. On the Anglo-American side, Slote’s reply is that this is not “fully developed empathic concern”. Indeed it is not.
One might try to turn such an example in the direction of an ethics of caring based on empathy by saying in effect, “Look at how fundamental empathy is.” This is accurate. However, what is missing from such a turning is use of empathy separately from its ethically informed application.
The maneuver of the Nazi (or individual psychopathic criminal) of “getting inside someone’s head” is different than being distressed by what distresses him. At the very least, the latter requires a communicability of affect or emotional contagion. Nazis and psychopaths are believed to be able to “get into your head,” but arguably they are noticeably lacking in empathy. They are also thought to lack a conscience (or at least a properly developed one), so an appeal to the example of the psychopath may not be decisive. The variables of missing empathy and missing conscience inevitably confound one another.
Such examples as psychopaths and Nazis allegedly using empathy point in the direction of multiple empathic phenomena such as emotional contagion, gut reactions, and primal pity, that are not empathy pure-and-simple but rely on the same somatic and semantic functions. The distinction between the psychopath or Nazi “getting inside one’s head” and being empathic is a fine one. Like other “diseases” of empathy such as autism, the behavior and motivations lie along a continuum between extremes. At one extreme, empathy is conspicuous by its absence. At the other extreme, low level empathic functioning is in evidence as emotional contagion along with and aspects of pathological (or criminal) behavior in a high functioning, educated individual, who also enjoys aspects of normal empathy.
The anti-foundationalist argument asserts that empathy – whether fully developed or not – does not supply its own ethical application. Empathy does not supply its own ethical justification. Empathy does indeed supply the otherness of the other – simply stated, the other. It is a separate step to care for the other, say, altruistically, or not care for the other. The empathy provides me access to the suffering of the other. It is a further step to take action to reduce that suffering in line with one’s conscience and other ethical conditions and qualifications.
Thus, the supposedly empathic Nazi spends the day shooting the helpless enemies of the Aryan race and feels a full measure of suffering (of the victims), because his mirror neurons are working normally; but instead of saying “Look how they suffer” says “Look how hard my work is – look how much I suffer.” The fall back position for the Anglo-American philosopher such as Slote is to argue that “full, adult human empathy” requires an education (along the lines of Hoffman’s inductive discipline) that leads one to experience strongly with the distress of others. Such an induction of the other’s distress with one’s own results in an inhibition of deliberate harm to the other. But wait. We already have that. It’s not induction of empathy that is needed. This hypothetical Nazis is already suffering, but continues to shoot due to a defective, misguided sense of duty to the Fuhrer. He needs instruction in ethics: Killing is wrong, regardless of what the Fuhrer says. As noted above, this example is discussed by Hannah Arendt in the context of Himmler’s animal pity for his men – under one interpretation (not necessarily Arendt’s) how he provided leadership as an “empathic” Nazi (Arendt 1971a: 105-6). The counter-counter-argument is direct. It is not empathy that inhibits one’s performing harm but rather an ethical prohibition against doing so, regardless of whether one enjoys inflicting pain or not, that stops the hurtful action. In that sense, empathy doesn’t care – it tells you how the other feels – whereas ethics tells one what one ought to do about it. In the final analysis the Nazis or psychopath exemplifies a pathological, distorted, immoral use of empathy. It is a part of the possibility of empathy to be so used and abused, though human beings with integrity and character will undertake the positive development of empathy so that the misuse does not occur or is made less likely. Of course, this has the distressing implication that we are perhaps not as different from the average, everyday Nazi in regard to our empathic capacities as we might want to imagine.
The third contributor in the Continental tradition is Emmanuel Levinas. The paradox of Levinas and his contribution is that someone who makes a substantial contribution to engaging the Other (as with a capital “O”) still has so little to say about empathy, fellow feeling, or sympathy. In fact, nothing. Arguably, Levinas is the anti-empath; yet much of what he says can be marshaled and read as a contribution to the conversation about empathy. For Levinas, the other is radically different. This does not just “raise the bar” on empathy and make it hard; it makes it impossible.
Still, input to a process of empathy is in evidence. For Levinas, access to the other and the infinite depth of the other’s alterity is given through the other’s face. The face is a hot spot announcing the epiphany, the arrival in force, of the other. The infinity that is available in the face is the source of the ethical power of the other in making an unconditional demand on the individual to be regarded and treated ethically as under an obligation without limitation or qualification. Receptivity to the other occurs in the embodiment of the other’s transcendence in the face. The face plays a central role in announcing the other. The other, in turn, commands responsibility. The obligation and ethical demands that the other imposes on the individual are apparent to merest inspection in the face of another human being. “The epiphany of the face is ethical” (Levinas 1961: 199). The hunger, destitution, and suffering expressed in the face of the other shows up as a demand without further comment being permitted. The face puts a stop to my egoism, my enjoyment of the world as if the world were my oyster and only mine. In this context, the word “empathy” does not occur. Yet it is implicitly able to be conceptualized en passant as “the reduction of the other to the same by interposition of a middle and neutral term” such as “cognition of [transient] identity” (1961: 43). In contrast, “we name this calling into question of my spontaneity by the presence of the other ethics” (1961: 43).
To give meaning to one’s presence is an event irreducible to evidence. It does not enter into intuition; it is a presence more direct than visible manifestation, and at the same time a remote presence – that of the other …. The eyes break through the mask – the language of the eyes, impossible to dissemble. The eye does not shine; it speaks. The alternative of truth and lying, of sincerity and dissimulation, is the prerogative of him who abides in the relation of absolute frankness, in the absolute frankness which cannot hide itself (1961: 66).
From this perspective, it is ethics against empathy. The key term here is “absolute”. The other, the face – in this passage, the eye(s) – embody the absolute. The absolute points toward and includes the infinity that is constantly in play in Totality and Infinity. In contrast, empathy totalizes the self and the other in providing evidence as a trace affect of how the self and the other are similar or even transiently identified; whereas ethics requires the other as a radically other, infinitely other, ethical demand. Yet the reader cannot help but suspect that there is an enlarged sense of empathy beyond the specific intentionality of apprehending in evidence what another feels because I feel it too. Empathy provides evidence of the other in that I know what you feel, because I feel it too, at least as a trace affect. The face is also a “hot spot” of empathic clues and receptivity. Yet, for Levinas, evidence of the other would be the ethically irrelevant, toy problem of other minds in (merely) academic philosophy. In empathy, the self and other form (or would form) a totality; but the ipseity (the self) of the I and the other go beyond totality into the infinity of absolute separation and difference in which the self and other are infinitely incommensurable. From this perspective, empathy is a regression to intentional phenomenology, a regression to Heideggerian care, a regression to inauthenticity. An attempt to reconcile the tension between empathy and the other in Levinas argues that empathy, even as a method of gathering evidence, contains at its core an irreducible respect for the other and the other’s demand that, independent of approval or disapproval, recognizes the other’s infinite authority to block my arbitrary actions towards her or him.
The one is about to lie to the other or kill the other over some trivial (or grand) matter, but is stopped up short by the recognition that one would be killing a type (though not a token) of oneself. The contingent matter of fact of nature is then institutionalized, codified, and canonized into an obligation. “Thou shalt not kill, lie, steal” and so on. The obligation is now established. However, the step from a “stopped up short” to an obligatory “Thou shalt not. . . ” is contingent and problematic. As long as the affects (and so on) disclosed through empathy are such as to support the demand of the other and of one’s obligation to the other, then we are on firm ground. However, when the demand fails or is manipulated by advertising, social pressure, or propaganda to disqualify the other and reduce the other into an subhuman entity prior to extra-judicial execution, then the lack of an ethical (moral) criterion independent of affects is sorely missed. It is necessary to transform one’s empathic distress, experiencing the suffering of the other vicariously, into a sympathetic distress that engages the aspect of feeling sorry for the other, resulting in pro-social intervention to assist the other (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). No man (individual) is an island, and narrow self-interest is readily subordinated to the imperative to reduce suffering in the world includes both the self and other on the list of agents without necessarily giving one or the other priority.
The psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut defines empathy as the primary method of data gathering about other human beings in the discipline of psychoanalysis. Thus, Kohut writes: “Empathy does indeed in essence define the field of our observations” (1977: 306). He offers the resonant image of empathy being the oxygen within which the developing child lives, breathes, and grows up to be a healthy human being, and, in turn, in which the adult flourishes in his or her relationships in love and work. Tactically, empathy is a method of data gathering about what is going on with the other person, and without empathy one’s appreciation of the other is incomplete. Strategically, the empathy of the other person is that which humanizes the individual, and when one individual loses the other, the individual is left apathetic, lethargic, feeling lifeless, depressed. Empathy is the oxygen breathing life into the relationship between individual and other, a metaphor introduced by Heinz Kohut (1977) without, however, Kohut extending it to the ethical dimension. In the contemporary Continental tradition, such an extension of empathy is left to Larry Hatab and John Riker, who note that empathy is a primal existential condition that makes ethical life possible (Hatab 2000; Riker 2010). Such an approach, for example, limits that of Slote, Hume, and Smith, whose use of empathy (sympathy) does indeed overlap extensively with fellow feeling in the sense of the communicability of affect yet also is extended to encompass an essential aspect of approbation or disapprobation (and the primary “warmth” (Slote 2010)) of the other’s heartfelt attitude and sentiment.
Empathy is foundational for psychoanalysis, or, more precisely, Kohut’s version of psychoanalysis that has also come to be called “self psychology”. With insufficient, misdirected, or distorted empathy, the growing, developing person (child) is incomplete. In severe cases of lack of empathy the result is hospitalism (Spitz 1946), profound emotional detachment and lack of connectivity similar to infantile autism. In cases of less severe but still traumatic failures of empathy in parent-child relatedness, the results are defects of the self, similar to but not reducible to character disorders, displaying features of narcissistic grandiosity or the seemingly compulsive pursuit of materialistic ideals of status, stuff, and the conventional success of the inauthentic mass man. The social malaise spreads, displaying ethical failings from road rage to children demanding the latest stuff to school yard bullying, precipitating suicide. Getting something for nothing, inner emptiness, immature grandiosity, and fragile self-esteem are characteristic of disorders of the self, resulting from defective and incomplete empathy (Riker 2010: 15-18). Lack of self-regulation is expressed as the numbers of people who are overweight reaches epidemic proportions, psychiatric sedatives and mood stabilizers (that is, drugs) are a growth industry in avoiding ethical responsibility and the (imperfect) duties of developing one’s talents. Addictions and chronic over-indulgence in alcohol, gambling, sex, recreational (illegal) drugs, and rampant cheating on everything from school testing to income tax to faithlessness to one’s spouse express an unhealthy sense of entitlement. Individuals strive to bandage over the pervasive feelings of inner emptiness and feelings of being a fake in spite of the external trappings of material success. The resulting image is a Nietzschian one – everywhere fragments of persons and no where a complete, whole human being, capable of engaging life with integrity (wholeness). The antidote is empathy. Empathy functions as an on-going process of distinguishing, sustaining, and strengthening the structure of the self.
Paradoxically, the structure of the self is distinguished, sustained, and maintained through failures of empathy, but failures in a phase appropriate, non-traumatic context that enable growth and development going forward. In itself, empathy provides symptom relief to emotional upset and behavioral acting out with drugs or sex, which, as symptom relief, does not last over the long run. Empathy comes into its own when, in an on-going empathic relationship, empathy breaks down and fails in a phase-appropriate, non-traumatic way. These non-traumatic failures of empathy occur within a context of successful empathy that lays down and builds psychic structure in the self. This structure enables the individual to deal with the slings and arrows of outrageous fortune, as setbacks, breakdowns, defeats as well as accomplishments inevitably arise in the course of life. Empathy becomes the foundation of an ethics of excellence through its contribution to the development of the self.
Empathy heals the self, and a well-integrated self is one able to sustain the commitments required to keep one’s word, avoid cheating and self medication with alcohol and recreational drugs, productively engage in satisfying activities and relatedness to others, and contribute to the community.
Empathy is a form of receptivity to the other; it is also a form of understanding. In the latter case, one puts oneself in the place of the other conceptually. In the former, one is open experientially to the affects, sensations, emotions that the other experiences. Undertaking an ethical inquiry without empathy – sensitivity to what is happening to and with the other – would be like engaging in an epistemological inquiry without drawing on the resources of perception. Thus, empathy is a method of access as well as a foundational structure as such.
In the final analysis, morality is separate from empathy and neither necessarily grounds the other, although arguably both point to a common root in human beings as the source of possibility. It will not be practical to argue here at this late point whether humans are intrinsically good or evil. Human beings are intrinsically human. Here “human” means intrinsic possibility. Human possibilities include both good and evil as well as empathy. The evidence provided by the history of the 20th century is not encouraging, yet it is not too late to turn it around as regards the present and future of humanity. Humans are also capable of great good works as demonstrated in the agricultural revolution of high yield grains that ended hunger for decades, medical “miracles” such as the eradication of small pox and other diseases, which saved many, many millions of lives. No doubt, cynics will find a flaw in every accomplishment and assure that no good deed goes unpunished. Indeed the consequence of our actions often escape us; and the propagation of forgiveness is an innovation and recommendation well counseled (Arendt 1926/65, 1971; Tutu 1999). Likewise, it is a part of the possibility of empathy to be so used and abused, although humans with integrity and character will undertake the positive development of full, adult empathy so that the misuse does not occur or is made less likely.
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 24, 2011 | Originally published: