Empedocles (c.492—432 B.C.E.)

empedoclesEmpedocles (of Acagras in Sicily) was a philosopher and poet: one of the most important of the philosophers working before Socrates (the Presocratics), and a poet of outstanding ability and of great influence upon later poets such as Lucretius. His works On Nature and Purifications (whether they are two poems or only one – see below) exist in more than 150 fragments. He has been regarded variously as a materialist physicist, a shamanic magician, a mystical theologian, a healer, a democratic politician, a living god, and a fraud. To him is attributed the invention of the four-element theory of matter (earth, air, fire, and water), one of the earliest theories of particle physics, put forward seemingly to rescue the phenomenal world from the static monism of Parmenides. Empedocles’ world-view is of a cosmic cycle of eternal change, growth and decay, in which two personified cosmic forces, Love and Strife, engage in an eternal battle for supremacy. In psychology and ethics Empedocles was a follower of Pythagoras, hence a believer in the transmigration of souls, and hence also a vegetarian. He claims to be a daimôn, a divine or potentially divine being, who, having been banished from the immortals gods for ‘three times countless years’ for committing the sin of meat-eating and forced to suffer successive reincarnations in an purificatory journey through the different orders of nature and elements of the cosmos, has now achieved the most perfect of human states and will be reborn as an immortal. He also claims seemingly magical powers including the ability to revive the dead and to control the winds and rains.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Physics and Cosmology
    1. Physics
    2. Cosmology
  4. Biology
    1. Origin of Species
    2. Embryology
    3. Perception and Thought
  5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul
    1. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls
    2. Meat-eating and Sin
    3. Theology
    4. Physics and Theology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Commentaries
    2. Studies

1. Life

The most detailed source for Empedocles’ life is Diogenes Laertius, Lives of the Eminent Philosophers 8.51-75. Perhaps because of his claims to divine status and magical powers a remarkable number of apocryphal stories gathered around the life of Empedocles in antiquity. His death in particular attracted attention and is reported to have occurred in several, clearly bathetic, ways: that he fell overboard from a ship and drowned; that he fell from his carriage, broke his leg and died; that he hanged himself; or the most famous account that, when he felt he was shortly to die and because he wished to appear to have been apotheosized, he leapt into the crater of Etna. In this story the ruse was unfortunately discovered when one of his trademark bronze sandals was thrown up by the volcano.

From more reliable sources it seems that he was born at Acragas in Sicily around 492 B.C.E. and died at the age of sixty. He was the son of a certain Meton, and was from an important and wealthy local aristocratic family: his grandfather, also called Empedocles, is reported to have been victorious in horse-racing at the Olympic Games in 496 B.C.E. It is not known where or with whom he studied philosophy, but various teachers are assigned to him by ancient sources, among them Parmenides, Pythagoras, Xenophanes, Anaxagoras and Anaximander (from whom he is said to have inherited his extravagant mode of dress). Whether or not he was his pupil, Empedocles was certainly very familiar with the work of Parmenides from whom he took the inspiration to write in hexameter verse, and whose physical system he adopts in part, and partly seeks to rectify.

He is reported to have been wealthy and to have kept a train of boy attendants and also to have provided dowries for many girls of Acragas. In dress he affected a purple robe with a golden girdle, bronze sandals, and a Delphic laurel-wreath, and in his manner he was grave and cultivated a regal public persona. These attributes contrast with his political outlook which is uniformly reported to have been actively pro-democratic. He began his political career with the prosecution of two state officials for their arrogant behaviour towards foreign guests which was seen as a sign of incipient tyrannical tendencies. He is also credited with activities against other anti-democratic citizens, and even with putting down an oligarchy and instituting a democracy at Acragas by use of his powers of rhetorical persuasion. Two speeches of his in favour of equality are also mentioned. His surviving poetry certainly shows considerable rhetorical skills, and indeed he is credited by Aristotle with the invention of rhetoric itself. Another report is of his breaking up a shadowy aristocratic political organisation called the ‘Thousand’. As a whole the tradition presents a picture of Empedocles as a popular politician, rhetorician, and champion of democracy and equality. This appears to fit in with the known history of Acragas where after the death of the popular and enlightened tyrant Theron in 473 B.C.E. his son Thrasydaeus proved to be a violent despot. After his forcible removal a democracy was established despite continuing political tensions.

As well as a being a philosopher, poet and politician, Empedocles was famous for his medical skills and healing powers. In his works he presents himself as a wandering healer offering to thousands of eager followers ‘prophecies’ and ‘words of healing for all kinds of illnesses’ (fr. 112 (Fragment numbers are those of Diels-Kranz)). He also promises his addressee Pausanias ‘you will learn remedies (pharmaka) for ills and help against old age’ and even ‘you will lead from Hades the life-force of a dead man’. To what degree this represents the real Empedocles is not known, but a tradition grew up of him as both a renowned physician and a practitioner of more magical cures, or as a charlatan. These stories however, may well derive from Empedocles’ own words in his poetry. On the other hand his work does show considerable interest in biology and especially in embryology and he was eminent enough as a writer on medicine to be attack ed by the writer of the Hippocratic treatise On Ancient Medicine who attempts to separate medicine from philosophy and rejects Empedocles’ work along with all philosophical medical works as irrelevant. The stories of his wonder-working such as curing entire plagues, reviving the dead and controlling the elements are clearly exaggerated at least, but it is becoming clearer, especially since the discovery of the Strasbourg fragments (see below), that, contrary to many former interpretations, Empedocles did not make a clear separation between his philosophy of nature and the more mystical, theological aspects of his philosophy, and so may well have seen no great difference in kind between healing ills through empirical understanding of human physiognomy and healing by means of sacred incantations and ritual purifications. His public as well may have made no great distinction between ‘scientific’ and sacred medicine as is suggested by the account of Empedocles curing a plague by restoring a fresh water-supply, after which he was venerated as a god.

2. Works

Empedocles work survives only in fragments, but luckily in a far greater number than any of the other Presocratics. These fragments are mostly quotations found in other authors such as Aristotle and Plutarch. Although many works, including tragedies and a medical treatise, are attributed to Empedocles by ancient sources no fragments of these have survived, and the extant fragments all come from a work of hexameter poetry traditionally entitled On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Phusika) and some from a possibly separate work called Purifications (Katharmoi). Of these two titles On Nature is by far the better attested and nearly all the fragments which are cited by ancient authors along with the title of the work they came from are attributed to On Nature, while only two are attributed to the Purifications. Because the fragments contain both material that clearly refers to physics and cosmology – the four elements, the cosmic cycle etc. – and also material concerning the fate of the soul, sin and purification, traditionally the former were placed in reconstructions of On Nature, and the latter in the Purifications. Indeed Empedocles’ writings contain ideas and themes that may seem quite incompatible with one another. On Natureas usually reconstructed seemed the work of a mechanist physicist which seeks to replace the traditional gods with four lifeless impersonal elements and two cosmic forces of attraction and repulsion, Love and Strife. The Purifications on the other hand seemed the work of a deeply religious Pythagorean mystic: it was often thought that Empedocles either wrote the Purifications as a move away from the mechanistic materialist position in On Nature, or that the Purifications were an addendum to On Nature, looking at the world from quite a different perspective.

However there have long been doubts about whether there were really two poems or only one poem (perhaps called On Nature and Purifications or with On Nature and Purifications as alternative titles for the same work) which contained both physical and religious material. First, although we may think of a poem called Physics as restricting itself to physical concerns alone, this may well be an anachronistic retrojection of modern rationalistic ideas of a gulf between physics and religion. Further, ancient book titles tend to be generic and there is a long tradition of works called either On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Physika) by various authors, with the earliest attested title for such works being On the Nature of the Universe (Peri Phuseôs tôn Ontôn ‘On the Nature of Things that Exist’), and so neither title may be Empedocles’ own and the two may perhaps be interchangeable different titles for the same work. Although there is still argument on this subject the Strasbourg fragments now suggest strongly that both physical and religious material was originally together in On Nature.

In 1990 the first ancient papyrus fragments of Empedocles were rediscovered at the University of Strasbourg and were published in 1999. Since these were also the first papyrus fragments of any of the Presocratics their discovery caused considerable excitement. Among other important new information they give about Empedocles’ philosophy, with great good fortune fr. a, the longest of the new fragments, was found to be a continuation of the longest of the previously known fragments (fr. 17) and thus now the two together form a continuous text of 69 lines. Fr. 17 is cited by Simplicius as being from book one of On Nature, and again very fortunately Strasbourg fr. a(ii) contains a marginal note by the manuscript copyist identifying line 30 of fr. a(ii) as line 300 of book one of On Nature. Since the Strasbourg fragments seem to have come from a single piece of papyrus, and they also overlap with a formerly known religious fragment usually placed in the Purifications (fr. 1 39) it now seems very likely that Empedocles introduced the themes of sin and purification early on in the physical poem. In fact it can now be argued that all of the fragments of the Purifications can be accommodated in the early part of book one of On Nature.

3. Physics and Cosmology

a. Physics

The foundations of Empedocles’ physics lie in the assumption that there are four ‘elements’ of matter, or ‘roots’ as he calls them, using a botanical metaphor that stresses their creative potential: earth, air, fire and water. These are able to create all things, including all living creatures, by being ‘mixed’ in different combinations and proportions. Each of the elements however, retains its own characteristics in the mixture, and each is eternal and unchanging. The positing of these four roots of matter forms part of a tradition of opposite material creative principles in Presocratic philosophy, but it also has its origins in an attempt to counter the theories of Parmenides who had argued that the world is single and unchanging since nothing can come from nothing and nothing can be destroyed into nothing: the theory known as Eleatic monism. Empedocles’ response was to appropriate Parmenides’ ideas and to use them against themselves. Nothing can come from nothing nor be destroyed into nothing (fr. 12), and therefore, in order to rescue the reality of the phenomenal world, there must be assumed to exist something eternal and unchanging beneath the constant change, growth and decay of the visible world. Empedocles then, transfers the changelessness that Parmenides attributes to the entire world to his four elements, and replaces the static singularity Parmenides’ world with a dynamic plurality. The four elements correspond closely to their expression at the macroscopic level of nature, with the traditional quadripartite division of the cosmos into earth, sea, air, and the fiery aether of the heavenly bodies: these four naturally occurring ‘elements’ of the cosmos clearly represent a fundamental natural division of matter at the largest scale. This division at the macroscopic level of reality is applied reductively at the microscopic level to produce a parallelism between the constituents of matter and the fundamental constituents of the cosmos, but the reduction of the world into four types of material particles does not deny the reality of the world we see, but instead validates it. Empedocles stresses this parallel between the elements at the different levels of reality by using the terms ‘sun’ ‘sea’ and ‘Earth’ interchangeably with ‘fire’, ‘water’ and ‘earth’. Of the four elements, although Empedocles stresses their equality of powers, fire is also granted a special role both in its hardening effect on mixtures of the other elements and also as the fundamental principle of living things.

b. Cosmology

Empedocles also posits two cosmic forces which work upon the elements in both creative and destructive ways. These he personifies as Love (Philia) – a force of attraction and combination – and Strife (Neikos) – a force of repulsion and separation. Whether these cosmic forces are to be envisaged in simply mechanistic terms as descriptions of the way things happen, or as expressions of internal properties of the elements, or as external forces that act upon the elements, is not clear. It is also unclear whether the two forces are to be seen as impersonal mechanistic physical forces or as intelligent divinities that act in purposive ways in creation and destruction. Evidence can be found for all these interpretations. What is clear is that these two forces are engaged in an eternal battle for domination of the cosmos and that they each prevail in turn in an endless cosmic cycle. The details of this cosmic cycle are also difficult to establish, but the most widely accepted interpretation is represented in the following diagram:


Beginning from the top of the diagram and proceeding clockwise, when Love is completely dominant she draws all the elements fully together into a Sphere in which, although the elements are not fused together into a single mass, each is indistinguishable from the others. The Sphere then, is an a-cosmic state during which no matter can exist, and no life is possible. Then as Love’s power gradually weakens and Strife begins to grow in power, he gradually separates out the elements from the Sphere until there is enough separation for matter to come into existence, for the world to be created and for all life to be born. When Strife has achieved total domination we again get an a-cosmic state in which the elements are separated completely and the world and all life is destroyed in a Whirl. Then Love begins to increase in power and to draw the elements together again, and as she does so the world is again created and life is again born. When Love has achieved full dominan ce we return once more to the sphere. As Empedocles puts it in fr. 17.1-8:

A twofold tale I shall tell: at one time it grew to be one only from many, and at another again it divided to be many from one. There is a double birth of what is mortal, and a double passing away; for the uniting of all things brings one generation into being and destroys it, and the other is reared and scattered as they are again being divided. And these things never cease their continuous exchange of position, at one time all coming together into one through Love, at another again being borne away from each other by Strife’s repulsion.

The cosmos exists in a state of constant flux then, beneath which there is a certain sort of stability in the eternity of the elements. The world is in a constant state of organic evolution, and there appear to be two different creations and two different worlds which have no direct link between them. According the most widely accepted interpretation Empedocles considered that we ourselves inhabit the world under the increasing power of Strife.

4. Biology

Empedocles’ physics have a particularly biological focus as is indicated by his choice of the botanical metaphor of ‘roots’ for what were later called ‘elements’. The term ‘roots’ stresses the creative potential of the roots rather than illustrating the way they create things by being mixed in different combinations: ‘elements’ (stoicheia in Greek, elementa in Latin) is the word for the letters of the alphabet, and is a metaphor that stresses the ability of the elements of matter to form different types of matter by interchange of position just as a limited number of letters are able to form all sorts of different words on the page. To illustrate this aspect of the creative abilities of his roots Empedocles uses an analogy with the way painters can use a limited number of colours to create all sorts of different colours and represent all the different productions of nature.
Fr. 23:

As painters, men well taught by wisdom in the practice of their art, decorate temple offerings when they take in their hands pigments of various colours, and after fitting them in close combination – more of some and less of others – they produce from them shapes resembling all things, creating trees and men and women, animals and birds and water-nourished fish, and long-lived gods too, highest in honor; so let not error convince you in your mind that there is any other source for the countless perishables that are seen, but know this clearly, since the account you have heard is divinely revealed.

Among other aspects, this analogy exhibits Empedocles’ tendency to think about the creative abilities of the elements in terms of their biological products, here a characteristically Empedoclean list of creatures representing the different orders of nature: plants, humans, land animals, birds, and fish, as well as gods. If painters use a mixture of a small number of pigments to produce copies of the works of nature, then the same process is productive of those works of nature. In other ways as well in his presentation of the cosmic cycle and the endless combination and separation of the elements he tends to elide the distinction between the elements and the life-forms they produce. Just as in the parallel he draws between the elements of the cosmos on both microscopic and macroscopic levels, so a close parallel is drawn between living creatures and their constituent elements.

a. Origin of Species

Empedocles presents us with the earliest extant attempt at producing a detailed rational mechanism for the origin of species. Greek traditions include the aetiological myths of the origin of a particular species of animal by transformation from a human being (many of these ancient mythological aetiologies are collected by Ovid in the Metamorphoses). The origins of humans, or of particular heroes, founders of cities or of races is frequently explained by what I term a botanical analogy: they originally emerged autochthonously from the ground just as plants do today, and this is also standard in ancient scientific theories as well: the original spontaneous generation of life from the earth, with all creatures emerging in their present species. Empedocles attempts to provide a comprehensive mechanism for the origins not simply of humans or of a particular animal but of all animal life, including humans, and a rational mechanism that would seem to do away with the need for any design in creatures or any external agency to order them and separate them into their individual species.

In Strasbourg fr. a(ii) 23-30 we now find the following lines in which Empedocles seemingly introduces his account of zoogony:

I will show you to your eyes too, where they find a larger body: first the coming together and the unfolding of birth, and as many as are now remaining of this generation. This [is to be seen] among the wilder species of mountain-roaming beasts; this [is to be seen] in the twofold offspring of men, this [is to be seen] in the produce of the root-bearing fields and of the cluster of grapes mounting on the vine. From these convey to your mind unerring proofs of my account: for you will see the coming together and unfolding of birth.

Empedocles promises an exposition of zoogony and the origin of species which, from the examples he gives – wild animals, humans and plants – is clearly intended to encompass all animal and plant life, including humans. He appeals to present day species as proofs of his theories: we can see both the products of this process of zoogony around us in nature today and also, it seems, we can see the same processes still going on today. That the theory refers to present day species rather than creatures in some counter world is underlined by the stress Empedocles puts on ‘as many as are now remaining of this generation’. So the theory is intended to explain the origin and development of all life and refers specifically to the animals and plants around us today, both as examples of and as proofs of the theory he will propose. This process of generation he describes by the repeated ‘the coming together and the unfolding of birth’. This seems to posit two processes which work, either together or separately, to produce the life we see around us today: a process of coming together and also a process of unfolding or perhaps more strictly ‘unleafing’ since the metaphor originates from the leaves of plants. So the second part of this process of zoogony involves a botanical metaphor: just as in the traditional botanical analogy of the myths of autochthony, an appeal to the development and growth of plants is used to describe the process of the development of all life.

According to fragments B57, B59, B60, and B61, first of all individual limbs and organs were produced from the earth. These wandered separately at first and then under the combining power of Love they came together in all sorts of wild and seemingly random hybrid combinations, producing double fronted creatures, hermaphrodites, ox-faced man creatures and man-faced ox-creatures. This weird picture is explained by Aristotle in the Physics and later in more detail by Simplicius in his commentary on the Physics as a theory of the origin of species in which, as we would put it, a certain form of natural selection is operative. The creatures assembled wrongly from parts of disparate animals will die out, either immediately, or by being unable to breed, and only the creatures by chance put together from homogeneous limbs will survive and so go on to found the species that we see today. The production of species and their ordering then is explained by a mechanistic process long recognised as a forerunner of Darwin’s theory of natural selection. Unlike in Darwin’s theory however, there would seem to be no gradual evolution of one species into another, and all of the variety of nature is produced in a great burst of birth in the beginning and is then whittled down by extinctions into the creatures we see today. That this theory intends to account for the origins of both humans and animals is ensured by the component parts of the ox-headed man-creatures and man-headed ox-creatures. There will clearly also be created by this system man-headed man-creatures and ox-headed ox-creatures, that is to say normal oxen and normal humans, although they are not mentioned. Further evidence that this zoogony relates to present day creatures is given by Aristotle and Simplicius who tell us that this process is still going on today.

However, Empedocles also adds to this theory another explanation of the origins of humans very much along the lines of traditional myths of autochthony. In fr. B62 and Strasbourg fr. d he describes the ‘shoots’ of men and women arising from the earth, drawn up by fire as it separates out from the other elements during the creation under the power of increasing Strife. As his choice of the word ‘shoots’ indicates these are not yet fully articulated people with distinct limbs but ‘whole-nature forms’ that ‘did not as yet show the lovely shape of limbs, or voice or language native to man’. We may assume that as Strife increases in power these ‘shoots’ will, just as plant buds do, gradually become fully articulated with distinct limbs and features. So human origins are accounted for by a botanical analogy, with humans as biological productions of the earth itself. This theory is also intended to account for modern-day as humans, as Strasbourg fr. d tells us ‘even now daylight beholds their remains’. So both the creation under Love and the creation under Strife refer to the origins of modern plants, animals, and humans. This is problematic since according to the picture of the cosmic cycle given above the world created by Strife is quite separate from that created by Love, and two quite different explanations are given by Empedocles for each creation of life. Various attempts have been made to account for this, including a radical revision of the cosmic cycle in order to allow both creations of life to take place within the same world, and also seeing the two different worlds of the cosmic cycle as more useful devices for examining different aspects of creation separately than absolutely chronologically separate phases of a cycle: the work of Love in combining creatures and the work of Strife in articulating them would then actually take place at the same time, but are simply described as operative in chronologically separate phases.

b. Embryology

Empedocles is an exponent of the pangenetic theory of embryology. In this theory inheritance of characteristics from both mother and father is explained by each of the two parents’ limbs and organs creating tiny copies of themselves. These miniature limbs and organs then flow together in the generative seed and when the two seeds combine in the womb the father’s seed may provide the model for the nose, while the mother’s seed the model for the eyes and so on. This is an elegant way of accounting for inheritance of characteristics, but this is unlikely to be the whole story. As Aristotle points out there are strong conceptual similarities between Empedocles’ embryology and the creation under Love in which we see the coming together of pre-formed limbs creating life. So Empedocles thinks of the original formation of animals as a process analogous to the present day formation of the embryo in the womb. From his description in Strasbourg fr. a (ii) 23-30 ‘the coming together and unfolding of birth’ we seem to have two processes that are at work in the formation of both present day creatures and the original creation of life. The ‘coming together’ describes both the original coming together of the limbs of the first creatures and also the coming together of the tiny limbs in conception. The other side of the creative process, the ‘unfolding’ is illustrated by the creation under Strife of the ‘shoots of men and pitiable women’ whose limbs are at first not fully articulated or defined: they will undergo a process of ‘unfolding’ just like plant buds and become fully developed humans. This ‘unfolding’ is clearly paralleled in embryology by the gradual development and growth of the embryo in the womb. Therefore it may be best to think of the tiny limbs and organs contained in the generative seed not as fully developed limbs and organs, but as the genetic material that contains the potential for the development of limbs and organs. This is so mewhat speculative, but would provide Empedocles with a much more nearly truly evolutionary theory of the origin of species than had previously been ascribed to him. Certainly the differentiation into the two sexes is described in terms of potential: the warmth of the womb determines whether the embryo will be male or female, cf. fr B 65: ‘They were poured in pure places; some met with cold and became women’, fr. B 67: ‘For the male was warmer . . . this is the reason why men are dark, more powerfully built, and hairier’. It may be that other characteristics are also determined or informed by environmental factors as well.

c. Perception and Thought

Empedocles seems to have been the first philosopher to give a detailed explanation of the mechanism by which we perceive things. His theory, criticised by Aristotle and Theophrastus, is that all things give off effluences and that these enter pores in the sense organs. The pores and the effluences will be of varying shapes and sizes and so only certain effluences enter certain sense-organs if they meet pores of the correct size and shape to admit them. Further, perception is achieved by the attraction of similars: we perceive light colours with fire in the eye, dark colours with water, smell is achieved by the presence of breath in the nostrils etc.

As Theophrastus complains, perception is closely linked to thought by Empedocles, cf. fr. B109:

With earth, we perceive earth, with water water, with air divine fire, with fire destructive fire, with love love, and strife with baneful strife.

fr. B 107:

All things are fitted together and constructed out of these, and by means of them they think and feel pleasure and pain.

In B 109 Empedocles moves from perception of physical elements to ethical perceptions using the same theory of perception by similars, while in B 107 we can see the theory used to account more directly for thought itself. Hence for Empedocles there is a close link between what we perceive and what we think. Further our thoughts will also be affected by our own physical constitutions (B 108). This process of the attraction of like to like is operative from the most fundamental level with the parts of the roots of matter being attracted to their like, right up to the highest level of the purest mixture which is the highest form of thought. Hence it seems that everything in nature has a share in perception and intelligence, cf. fr. 110.10: ‘know that all things have intelligence and a share of thought’.

5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul

a. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls

Plutarch cites the following fragment as coming from ‘the beginning of Empedocles’ philosophy’, fr. B 115:

There is a decree of necessity, ratified long ago by gods, eternal and sealed by broad oaths, that whenever one in error, from fear, defiles his own limbs, having by his error made false the oath he swore – daimôns to whom life long-lasting is apportioned – he wanders from the blessed ones for three-times countless years, being born throughout the time as all kinds of mortal forms, exchanging one hard way of life for another. For the force of air pursues him into the sea, and sea spits him out onto earth’s surface, earth casts him in the rays of blazing sun, and sun into the eddies of air; one takes him from another, and all abhor him. I too am now one of these, an exile from the gods and a wanderer, having put my trust in raving Strife.

Traditionally Plutarch’s seeming attribution of this fragment to On Naturewas assumed to be incorrect and it was placed in the Purifications instead. However from the evidence of the Strasbourg fragments it seems that it may well be that Plutarch was correct, since they contain a description of the details of the sin Empedocles accuses himself of in fr. 115, cf. Strasbourg fr. d lines 5-6:

‘Alas that merciless day did not destroy me sooner, before I devised with my claws terrible deeds for the sake of food’

In fr. 115 Empedocles describes himself as a ‘daimôn’, a being to whom long life has been granted, but who has committed the sin of meat-eating and bloodshed and consequently is punished by banishment from the company of the immortal gods. The banishment lasts three myriads of years, either ‘three-times countless years’ or thirty thousand years. In either case he must atone for his sin by being repeatedly reincarnated into all the different living forms of the different orders of nature. Elsewhere he says: ‘For before now I have been at some time boy and girl, bush, bird, and a mute fish in the sea’ (fr. B 117). Empedocles then, has already suffered this nearly endless cycle of reincarnations having been seemingly hurled down to the lowest rung of the scale of nature but has worked his way up, has been purified at last and, as he tells us in fr. B. 112, is himself now an immortal god. There are others too numbered among the daimôns, those who ‘at the end … come among men on earth as prophets, minstrels, physicians and leaders, and from these they arise as gods, highest in honour.’ (fr. 146). It is not entirely clear whether we are meant to imagine the daimôns as an entirely separate class of blessed being with a different creation and a different fate from ourselves, the ordinary mortals, or as people who began as ordinary mortals but who, having purified themselves and having achieved perfection, are now approaching divine status. The latter reading would perhaps make more sense in terms of Empedocles’ didactic ethical mission: if we are all potentially perfectable, then his purificatory teaching becomes much more crucial. Empedocles himself, as his life shows, has achieved all four of the states that qualify the daimôns for immortality, he is a prophet, a minstrel, a physician and a leader, and can now pass on his wisdom to those on earth whom he is about to leave behind when he rejoins the company of the immortals. As can be seen from the description above, there are strong similarities between Empedocles and the teachings of Pythagoras on the transmigration of souls. Empedocles is clearly a follower of Pythagoras, in his ethics and psychology at least, and shares his vegetarianism and pacifism.

b. Meat-eating and Sin

Slaughter and meat-eating are the most terrible of sins, indeed for him animal slaughter is murder and meat-eating is cannibalism, as shown by fr. 137:

The father will lift up his dear son in changed form, and blind fool, as he prays he will slay him, and those who take part in the sacrifice bring the victim as he pleads. But the father, deaf to his cries, slays him in his house and prepares an evil feast. In the same way son seizes father, and children their mother, and having bereaved them of life devour the flesh of those they love.

Here, in terms reminiscent of Hesiod’s description of the coming horrors of the Iron Age in Works and Days, we see the appalling consequences of meat-eating: murder, cannibalism, the destruction of whole families and, by extrapolation, of entire societies. This is a radical position in both political and religious terms. Plato’s Protagoras in the eponymous dialogue can simply assume that all men agree that warfare is ‘a fine and noble thing’. For Empedocles warfare, one fundamental plank of the Greek city state, is the most appalling of all evils and is punished by the immortals by hurling the perpetrators not only out of their society, but out of human society and even down to the level of the lowest forms of nature.

c. Theology

In religious terms as well traditional animal sacrifice, another fundamental basis of Greek society, becomes the grossest impiety of all. A probably apocryphal tale reports that Empedocles sacrificed an ox made of honey and meal at Olympia, the religious heart of Greece: a pointed act of criticism of traditional religion. Further evidence for his radical theology lies in his appropriation of the names of the Olympian gods for his roots of matter and his cosmic forces. Implicitly he argues that the Olympian gods came into being as misinterpretations of the natural world: the real ‘gods’ are the elements of nature and the cosmic forces that direct their endless evolutionary cycle. His religious and ethical teachings then are of purification of the soul in an attempt to achieve perfection and unity with perfect Love. He pictures a time in the past, a sort of golden age, when this universal harmony existed, fr. B 128:

They did not have Ares as god or Kydoimos, nor king Zeus, nor Kronos, nor Poseidon but queen Kypris [Love]. Her they propitiated with holy images and painted animal figures, with perfumes of subtle fragrance and offerings of distilled myrrh and sweet-smelling frankincense, and pouring on the earth libations of golden honey. Their altar was not drenched by the unspeakable slaughter of bulls, but this was the greatest defilement among men – to bereave of life and eat noble limbs.

fr. B 130:

All creatures, both animals and birds, were tame and gentle to men, and bright was the flame of their friendship.

Originally people worshipped only one god, Love, and this resulted in universal harmony, even between humans and animals. Implicitly the argument runs that the worship of the Olympian gods he mentions, Ares, Zeus and Poseidon, and the sacrifices they demand have destroyed this harmony, resulting in worship also of Kydoimos, the personification of the noise of battle. Traditional religion with their sacrificial slaughter and meat-eating have had a degrading effect on society.

d. Physics and Theology

As I say above it now seems very likely that Empedocles discussed purificatory topics early on in his poem On Nature. Unlike for modern rationalists then, it seems that for Empedocles there was no fundamental divide between physics and religion. Indeed as can be seen from fr. B 115 above the sin of the daimôn results in an expiatory journey of the soul not only through the different orders of living creatures but through the physical elements of the cosmos. Empedocles draws a close analogy between the cycle of the soul and the cycle of the cosmos itself. This is a hallmark of his work: frequently he uses the same language whether describing the journey of the soul or the cycle of the elements. Sometimes in the Strasbourg fragments the description of the elements coming together under the power of Love is rendered as ‘we are coming together’. His sin, in fr. 115, he describes as resulting from having put his trust in raving Strife, one of his cosmic forces, and conversely in fr. 130 we see the people of the golden age worshipping the other cosmic force, Love. Clearly there is more than a little cross-over between physics and ethics for Empedocles. How this works in detail is hard to pin down but perhaps the best reading we can give of On Natureis that it represents the detailed expression of the cycle of the soul at the level of the entire cosmos. The endless evolutionary cycling of the elements is in fact part of the cycle of the soul.

(Note: all translations are by M. R. Wright except those of the Strasbourg fragments which are by O. Primavesi and A. Martin.)

6. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and Commentaries

  • Bollack, J. Empédocle, (Paris, 1965-9), 4 vols. With Greek text, French translation, and commentary.
  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (Berlin, 1952), vol. 1, ch. 31, 276-375. Greek text of both fragments (B) and testimonia (A) with German translation.
  • Wright, M. R. (2nd edn.), Empedocles the Extant Fragments (London, 1995). With Greek text, English translation, introduction and commentary.
  • Inwood, B. The Poem of Empedocles (Toronto, 1992). With Greek text, facing English translation and introduction.
  • Martin, A. and O. Primavesi, L’Empédocle de Strasbourg: (P. Strasb. gr. Inv. 1665-1666) (Berlin/Strasbourg, 1998). With Greek text, French and English translations, introduction, commentary, and English summary.

b. Studies

  • Gemelli Marciano, L. “Le ‘demonologie’ empedoclee: problemi di metodo e altro”, Aevum Antiquum 1 (2003), 205-35
  • Gemelli Marciano, L. Le metamorfosi della tradizione: mutamenti de significato e neologismi nel Peri physeos di Empedocle (Bari, 1999).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy vol. 2 (Cambridge 1969), ch. 3
  • Kingsley, P. Ancient Philosophy, Mystery and Magic: Empedocles and Pythagorean Tradition (Oxford, 1995)
  • Kirk, G. S. and J.E. Raven, M. Schofield, (2nd edn.), The Presocratic Philosophers (Cambridge 1983), ch. 10.
  • O’Brien, D. Empedocles’ Cosmic Cycle (Cambridge, 1969)
  • Osborne, C. ‘Empedocles recycled’, Classical Quarterly NS 37 (1987), 24-50
  • Osbourne, C. ‘Rummaging in the recycling bins of Upper Egypt: a discussion of A. Martin and O. Primavesi, ZL’ Empédocle de Strasbourg’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (Oxford, 2000), 329-56.
  • Sedley, D. N. ‘Empedocles’ life cycles’, in Proceedings of the Symposium Tertium Mykonense (forthcoming, 2004)
  • Solmsen, F. ‘Love and Strife in Empedocles’ cosmology’, Phronesis 10 (1965), 123-45; repr. in R.E. Allen and D.J. Furley (eds), Studies in Presocratic Philosophy, (London, 1975), vol. 2, 221-64.
  • Trépanier, S. ‘Empedocles on the ultimate symmetry of the world’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 24 (2003), 1-57
  • Trépanier, S. Empedocles: An Interpretation (London, 2004)

Author Information

Gordon Campbell
Email: gordon.l.campbell@may.ie
National University of Ireland, Maynooth