Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Encyclopedists

“Encyclopedists” is the name usually applied to the group of French philosophers and men of letters who collaborated in the production of the famous Encyclopedie, or were in sympathy with its principles. The work was planned by Denis Diderot, and was announced as a Dictionnaire raisonne des sciences, des arts, et des metiers. The intention was to provide a complete alphabetical treatment of the whole field of human knowledge from the standpoint of the “Enlightenment”. The contributors included a number of remarkable men. First in importance, acting with Diderot on equal terms, was D’Alembert. A large part of the work was done by the Chevalier de Jaucourt, a man of encyclopedic learning. When he died in 1755, Montesquieu left behind an unfinished article on “Taste.” Voltaire wrote some articles, and constantly advised on the development of the plan. Roussear contributed articles on music, but ultimately quarreled with the editors, whose plan was so different from his. Turgot wrote on economic subjects, and in the latter part of the work Haller, the physiologist, and Conddorcet were engaged.

The first volume appeared in 1751, the second in the following January, and immediately excited the antagonism of the Church and the conservatives. On February 12, 1752, the two volumes were suppressed by the Council, as containing maxims contrary to royal authority and to religion. Further publication was suspended for eighteen months, but from 1753 to 1757 it went on without interruption. After the seventh volume, the forces of conservatism rallied to a fresh attack. The sale of the volumes already printed; as well as the printing of any more, was forbidden. Diderot, however, made his plans to continue privately to prepare the remaining volumes. D’Alembert withdrew, but Diderot toiled on and completed the work (28 volumes, Paris, 1751-72). Andre Franois Lebreton acquired a large interest in the undertaking and all the contributions were set up as they were written, but when Diderot had corrected the last proof, Lebreton and his foreman, without informing his partners, secretly cut out such parts from each articles as he thought too radical or likely to give offense. In this way many of the best articles were mutilated, and to prevent the restoration of the eliminated matter, Lebreton burned the original manuscripts. Subsequently a supplement was published (5 volumes, Amsterdam, Paris, 1776-77), also an index (2 volumes, 17880).

The Encyclopedie was both a repository of information and a polemical arsenal. It was an idea of the editors that if civilization should by entirely destroyed, mankind might turn to their volumes to learn to reconstruct it. No other collection of general information so large and so useful was then in existence. Yet mere learning was not what lay nearest to the hearts of Diderot and his fellows; the prided themselves even more on the firm and bold philosophy of some of the writers. The metaphysics is founded chiefly on Locke, who “may be said to have created metaphysics as Newton created physics,” by reducing the science to “what in fact should be the experimental physics of the soul.” Beyond this there is little unity of opinion, though the same spirit rules throughout. It includes a prejudice in favor of democracy, as the ideal form of government, and the worship of theoretical equality, but contempt for the populace, “which discern”; the reduction of religion to sentiments of morality and benevolence, and great dislike for its minister, especially the religious orders. By its generous professions of philosophic tolerance, and apparent acquiescence in what for the moment it was too weak to overpower, the philosophic school won a hearing for doctrines which were essentially subversive of the established order of things in both Church and State, and prepared the way for overt revolution.

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Last updated: April 13, 2001 | Originally published: