The field of environmental ethics concerns human beings’ ethical relationship with the natural environment. While numerous philosophers have written on this topic throughout history, environmental ethics only developed into a specific philosophical discipline in the 1970s. This emergence was no doubt due to the increasing awareness in the 1960s of the effects that technology, industry, economic expansion and population growth were having on the environment. The development of such awareness was aided by the publication of two important books at this time. Rachel Carson’s Silent Spring, first published in 1962, alerted readers to how the widespread use of chemical pesticides was posing a serious threat to public health and leading to the destruction of wildlife. Of similar significance was Paul Ehrlich’s 1968 book, The Population Bomb, which warned of the devastating effects the spiraling human population has on the planet’s resources. Of course, pollution and the depletion of natural resources have not been the only environmental concerns since that time: dwindling plant and animal biodiversity, the loss of wilderness, the degradation of ecosystems, and climate change are all part of a raft of “green” issues that have implanted themselves into both public consciousness and public policy over subsequent years. The job of environmental ethics is to outline our moral obligations in the face of such concerns. In a nutshell, the two fundamental questions that environmental ethics must address are: what duties do humans have with respect to the environment, and why? The latter question usually needs to be considered prior to the former. In order to tackle just what our obligations are, it is usually thought necessary to consider first why we have them. For example, do we have environmental obligations for the sake of human beings living in the world today, for humans living in the future, or for the sake of entities within the environment itself, irrespective of any human benefits? Different philosophers have given quite different answers to this fundamental question which, as we shall see, has led to the emergence of quite different environmental ethics.
As noted above, perhaps the most fundamental question that must be asked when regarding a particular environmental ethic is simply, what obligations do we have concerning the natural environment? If the answer is simply that we, as human beings, will perish if we do not constrain our actions towards nature, then that ethic is considered to be “anthropocentric.” Anthropocentrism literally means “human-centeredness,” and in one sense all ethics must be considered anthropocentric. After all, as far as we know, only human beings can reason about and reflect upon ethical matters, thus giving all moral debate a definite “human-centeredness.” However, within environmental ethics anthropocentrism usually means something more than this. It usually refers to an ethical framework that grants “moral standing” solely to human beings. Thus, an anthropocentric ethic claims that only human beings are morally considerable in their own right, meaning that all the direct moral obligations we possess, including those we have with regard to the environment, are owed to our fellow human beings.
While the history of western philosophy is dominated by this kind anthropocentrism, it has come under considerable attack from many environmental ethicists. Such thinkers have claimed that ethics must be extended beyond humanity, and that moral standing should be accorded to the non-human natural world. Some have claimed that this extension should run to sentient animals, others to individual living organisms, and still others to holistic entities such as rivers, species and ecosystems. Under these ethics, we have obligations in respect of the environment because we actually owe things to the creatures or entities within the environment themselves. Determining whether our environmental obligations are founded on anthropocentric or non-anthropocentric reasoning will lead to different accounts of what those obligations are. This section examines the prominent accounts of moral standing within environmental ethics, together with the implications of each.
Although many environmental philosophers want to distance themselves from the label of anthropocentrism, it nevertheless remains the case that a number of coherent anthropocentric environmental ethics have been elaborated (Blackstone, 1972; Passmore, 1974; O’Neill, 1997; and Gewirth, 2001). This should be of little surprise, since many of the concerns we have regarding the environment appear to be concerns precisely because of the way they affect human beings. For example, pollution diminishes our health, resource depletion threatens our standards of living, climate change puts our homes at risk, the reduction of biodiversity results in the loss of potential medicines, and the eradication of wilderness means we lose a source of awe and beauty. Quite simply then, an anthropocentric ethic claims that we possess obligations to respect the environment for the sake of human well-being and prosperity.
Despite their human-centeredness, anthropocentric environmental ethics have nevertheless played a part in the extension of moral standing. This extension has not been to the non-human natural world though, but instead to human beings who do not yet exist. The granting of moral standing to future generations has been considered necessary because of the fact that many environmental problems, such as climate change and resource depletion, will affect future humans much more than they affect present ones. Moreover, it is evident that the actions and policies that we as contemporary humans undertake will have a great impact on the well-being of future individuals. In light of these facts, some philosophers have founded their environmental ethics on obligations to these future generations (Gewirth, 2001).
Of course, it is one thing to say that human beings in the future have moral standing, it is quite another to justify the position. Indeed, some philosophers have denied such standing to future people, claiming that they lie outside of our moral community because they cannot act reciprocally (Golding, 1972). So, while we can act so as to benefit them, they can give us nothing in return. This lack of reciprocity, so the argument goes, denies future people moral status. However, other philosophers have pointed to the fact that it is usually considered uncontroversial that we have obligations to the dead, such as executing their wills and so on, even though they cannot reciprocate (Kavka, 1978). While still others have conceded that although any future generation cannot do anything for us, it can nevertheless act for the benefit of its own subsequent generations, thus pointing to the existence of a broader transgenerational reciprocity (Gewirth, 2001).
However, perhaps we do not have obligations to future people because there is no definitive group of individuals to whom such obligations are owed. This argument is not based on the simple fact that future people do not exist yet, but on the fact that we do not know who they will be. Derek Parfit has called this the “non-identity problem” (Parfit, 1984, ch. 16). The heart of this problem lies in the fact that the policies adopted by states directly affect the movement, education, employment and so on of their citizens. Thus, such policies affect who meets whom, and who has children with whom. So, one set of policies will lead to one group of future people, while another set will lead to a different group. Our actions impact who will exist in the future, making our knowledge of who they will be incomprehensible. Since there is no definitive set of future people to receive the benefits or costs of our actions, to whom do we grant moral standing? Secondly, and of particular importance for environmental ethics, how could any future people legitimately complain that they have been wronged by our environmentally destructive policies? For if we had not conducted such policies, they would not even exist.
In response to the non-identity problem, it has been argued that while we do not know exactly who will exist in the future, we do know that some group of people will exist and that they will have interests. In light of this, perhaps our obligations lie with these interests, rather than the future individuals themselves (DesJardins, 2001, p. 74). As for the second aspect of the problem, we might claim that although future generations will benefit from our environmentally destructive policies by their very existence, they will nevertheless have been harmed. After all, cannot one be harmed by a particular action even if one benefits overall? To illustrate this point, James Woodward gives the example of a racist airline refusing to allow a black man on a flight that subsequently crashes (Woodward, 1986). Isn’t this man harmed by the airline, even though he benefits overall?
Even if we do decide to grant moral standing to future human beings, however, that still leaves the problem of deciding just what obligations we have to them. One set of difficulties relates to our ignorance of who they are. For not only do we lack information about the identity of future people, but we have neither knowledge of their conceptions of a good life, nor what technological advances they may have made. For example, why bother preserving rare species of animal or oil reserves if humans in the future receive no satisfaction from the diversity of life and have developed some alternative fuel source? Our ignorance of such matters makes it very difficult to flesh out the content of our obligations.
By way of reply to such problems, some philosophers have argued that while we do not know everything about future people, we can make some reasonable assumptions. For example, Brian Barry has argued that in order to pursue their idea of the good life – whatever that happens to be – future people will have need of some basic resources, such as food, water, minimum health and so on (Barry, 1999). Barry thus argues that our obligations lie with ensuring that we do not prevent future generations from meeting their basic needs. This, in turn, forces us to consider and appropriately revise our levels of pollution, resource depletion, climate change and population growth. While this might seem a rather conservative ethic to some, it is worth pointing out that at no time in humanity’s history have the needs of contemporaries been met, let alone those of future people. This unfortunate fact points to a further problem that all future-oriented anthropocentric environmental ethics must face. Just how are the needs and interests of the current generation to be weighed against the needs and interests of those human beings in the future? Can we justifiably let present people go without for the sake of future humans?
Clearly then, the problems posed by just a minimal extension of moral standing are real and difficult. Despite this, however, most environmental philosophers feel that such anthropocentric ethics do not go far enough, and want to extend moral standing beyond humanity. Only by doing this, such thinkers argue, can we get the beyond narrow and selfish interests of humans, and treat the environment and its inhabitants with the respect they deserve.
If only human beings have moral standing, then it follows that if I come across a bear while out camping and shoot it dead on a whim, I do no wrong to that bear. Of course, an anthropocentric ethic might claim that I do some wrong by shooting the bear dead – perhaps shooting bears is not the action of a virtuous individual, or perhaps I am depleting a source of beauty for most other humans – but because anthropocentrism states that only humans have moral standing, then I can do no wrong to the bear itself. However, many of us have the intuition that this claim is wrong. Many of us feel that it is possible to do wrong to animals, whether that be by shooting innocent bears or by torturing cats. Of course, a feeling or intuition does not get us very far in proving that animals have moral standing. For one thing, some people (hunters and cat-torturers, for example) no doubt have quite different intuitions, leading to quite different conclusions. However, several philosophers have offered sophisticated arguments to support the view that moral standing should be extended to include animals (see Animals and Ethics).
Peter Singer and Tom Regan are the most famous proponents of the view that we should extend moral standing to other species of animal. While both develop quite different animal ethics, their reasons for according moral status to animals are fairly similar. According to Singer, the criterion for moral standing is sentience: the capacity to feel pleasure and pain (Singer, 1974). For Regan, on the other hand, moral standing should be acknowledged in all “subjects-of-a-life”: that is, those beings with beliefs, desires, perception, memory, emotions, a sense of future and the ability to initiate action (Regan, 1983/2004, ch. 7). So, while Regan and Singer give slightly different criteria for moral standing, both place a premium on a form of consciousness.
For Singer, if an entity possesses the relevant type of consciousness, then that entity should be given equal consideration when we formulate our moral obligations. Note that the point is not that every sentient being should be treated equally, but that it should be considered equally. In other words, the differences between individuals, and thus their different interests, should be taken into account. Thus, for Singer it would not be wrong to deny pigs the vote, for obviously pigs have no interest in participating in a democratic society; but it would be wrong to subordinate pigs’ interest in not suffering, for clearly pigs have a strong interest in avoiding pain, just like us. Singer then feeds his principle of equal consideration into a utilitarian ethical framework, whereby the ultimate moral goal is to bring about the greatest possible satisfaction of interests. So there are two strands to Singer’s theory: first of all, we must consider the interests of sentient beings equally; and secondly, our obligations are founded on the aim of bringing about the greatest amount of interest-satisfaction that we can.
Tom Regan takes issue with Singer’s utilitarian ethical framework, and uses the criterion of consciousness to build a “rights-based” theory. For Regan, all entities who are “subjects-of-a-life” possess “inherent value”. This means that such entities have a value of their own, irrespective of their good for other beings or their contribution to some ultimate ethical norm. In effect then, Regan proposes that there are moral limits to what one can do to a subject-of-a-life. This position stands in contrast to Singer who feeds all interests into the utilitarian calculus and bases our moral obligations on what satisfies the greatest number. Thus, in Singer’s view it might be legitimate to sacrifice the interests of certain individuals for the sake of the interest-satisfaction of others. For example, imagine that it is proven that a particular set of painful experiments on half a dozen pigs will lead to the discovery of some new medicine that will itself alleviate the pain of a few dozen human beings (or other sentient animals). If one’s ultimate norm is to satisfy the maximum number of interests, then such experiments should take place. However, for Regan there are moral limits to what one can do to an entity with inherent value, irrespective of these overall consequences. These moral limits are “rights”, and are possessed by all creatures who are subjects-of-a-life.
But what does all this have to do with environmental ethics? Well, in one obvious sense animal welfare is relevant to environmental ethics because animals exist within the natural environment and thus form part of environmentalists’ concerns. However, extending moral standing to animals also leads to the formulation of particular types of environmental obligations. Essentially, these ethics claim that when we consider how our actions impact on the environment, we should not just evaluate how these affect humans (present and/or future), but also how they affect the interests and rights of animals (Singer, 1993, ch. 10, and Regan, 1983/2004, ch. 9). For example, even if clearing an area of forest were proven to be of benefit to humans both in the short and long-term, that would not be the end of the matter as far as animal ethics are concerned. The welfare of the animals residing within and around the forest must also be considered.
However, many environmental philosophers have been dissatisfied with these kinds of animal-centered environmental ethics. Indeed, some have claimed that animal liberation cannot even be considered a legitimate environmental ethic (Callicott, 1980, Sagoff, 1984). For these thinkers, all animal-centered ethics suffer from two fundamental and devastating problems: first of all, they are too narrowly individualistic; and secondly, the logic of animal ethics implies unjustifiable interference with natural processes. As for the first point, it is pointed out that our concerns for the environment extend beyond merely worrying about individual creatures. Rather, for environmentalists, “holistic” entities matter, such as species and ecosystems. Moreover, sometimes the needs of a “whole” clash with the interests of the individuals that comprise it. Indeed, the over-abundance of individuals of a particular species of animal can pose a serious threat to the normal functioning of an ecosystem. For example, many of us will be familiar with the problems rabbits have caused to ecosystems in Australia. Thus, for many environmentalists, we have an obligation to kill these damaging animals. Clearly, this stands opposed to the conclusions of an ethic that gives such weight to the interests and rights of individual animals. The individualistic nature of an animal-centered ethic also means that it faces difficulty in explaining our concern for the plight of endangered species. After all, if individual conscious entities are all that matter morally, then the last surviving panda must be owed just the same as my pet cat. For many environmental philosophers this is simply wrong, and priority must be given to the endangered species (Rolston III, 1985).
Animal-centered ethics also face attack for some of the implications of their arguments. For example, if we have obligations to alleviate the suffering of animals, as these authors suggest, does that mean we must stop predator animals from killing their prey, or partition off prey animals so that they are protected from such attacks (Sagoff, 1984)? Such conclusions not only seem absurd, but also inimical to the environmentalist goal of preserving natural habitats and processes.
Having said all of this, I should not over-emphasize the opposition between animal ethics and environmental ethics. Just because animal ethicists grant moral standing only to conscious individuals, that does not mean that they hold everything else in contempt (Jamieson, 1998). Holistic entities may not have independent moral standing, according to these thinkers, but that does not equate to ignoring them. After all, the welfare and interests of individual entities are often bound up with the healthy functioning of the “wholes” that they make up. Moreover, the idea that animal ethics imply large-scale interferences in the environment can be questioned when one considers how much harm this would inflict upon predator and scavenger animals. Nevertheless, clashes of interest between individual animals and other natural entities are inevitable, and when push comes to shove animal ethicists will invariably grant priority to individual conscious animals. Many environmental ethicists disagree, and are convinced that the boundaries of our ethical concern need to be pushed back further.
As noted above, numerous philosophers have questioned the notion that only conscious beings have moral standing. Some have done this by proposing a thought experiment based on a “last-human scenario” (Attfield, 1983, p. 155). The thought experiment asks us to consider a situation, such as the aftermath of a nuclear holocaust, where the only surviving human being is faced with the only surviving tree of its species. If the individual chops down the tree, no human would be harmed by its destruction. For our purposes we should alter the example and say that all animals have also perished in the holocaust. If this amendment is made, we can go further and say that no conscious being would be harmed by the tree’s destruction. Would this individual be wrong to destroy the tree? According to a human or animal-centered ethic, it is hard to see why such destruction would be wrong. And yet, many of us have the strong intuition that the individual would act wrongly by chopping down the tree. For some environmental philosophers, this intuition suggests that moral standing should be extended beyond conscious life to include individual living organisms, such as trees.
Of course, and as I have mentioned before, we cannot rely only on intuitions to decide who or what has moral standing. For this reason, a number of philosophers have come up with arguments to justify assigning moral standing to individual living organisms. One of the earliest philosophers to put forward such an argument was Albert Schweitzer. Schweitzer’s influential “Reverence for Life” ethic claims that all living things have a “will to live”, and that humans should not interfere with or extinguish this will (Schweitzer, 1923). But while it is clear that living organisms struggle for survival, it is simply not true that they “will” to live. This, after all, would require some kind of conscious experience, which many living things lack. However, perhaps what Schweitzer was getting at was something like Paul W. Taylor’s more recent claim that all living things are “teleological centers of life” (Taylor, 1986). For Taylor, this means that living things have a good of their own that they strive towards, even if they lack awareness of this fact. This good, according to Taylor, is the full development of an organism’s biological powers. In similar arguments to Regan’s, Taylor claims that because living organisms have a good of their own, they have inherent value; that is, value for their own sake, irrespective of their value to other beings. It is this value that grants individual living organisms moral status, and means that we must take the interests and needs of such entities into account when formulating our moral obligations.
But if we recognize moral standing in every living thing, how are we then to formulate any meaningful moral obligations? After all, don’t we as humans require the destruction of many living organisms simply in order to live? For example we need to walk, eat, shelter and clothe ourselves, all of which will usually involve harming living things. Schweitzer’s answer is that we can only harm or end the life of a living entity when absolutely necessary. Of course, this simply begs the question: when is absolutely necessary? Taylor attempts to answer this question by advocating a position of general equality between the interests of living things, together with a series of principles in the event of clashes of interest. First, the principles state that humans are allowed to act in self-defense to prevent harm being inflicted by other living organisms. Second, the basic interests of nonhuman living entities should take priority over the nonbasic or trivial interests of humans. Third, when basic interests clash, humans are not required to sacrifice themselves for the sake of others (Taylor, 1986, pp. 264-304).
As several philosophers have pointed out, however, this ethic is still incredibly demanding. For example, because my interest in having a pretty garden is nonbasic, and a weed’s interest in survival is basic, I am forbidden from pulling it out according to Taylor’s ethical framework. For some, this makes the ethic unreasonably burdensome. No doubt because of these worries, other philosophers who accord moral standing to all living organisms have taken a rather different stance. Instead of adopting an egalitarian position on the interests of living things, they propose a hierarchical framework (Attfield, 1983 and Varner, 1998). Such thinkers point out that moral standing is not the same as moral significance. So while we could acknowledge that plants have moral standing, we might nevertheless accord them a much lower significance than human beings, thus making it easier to justify our use and destruction of them. Nevertheless, several philosophers remain uneasy about the construction of such hierarchies and wonder whether it negates the acknowledgement of moral standing in the first place. After all, if we accept such a hierarchy, just how low is the moral significance of plants? If it is low enough so that I can eat them, weed them and walk on them, what is the point of granting them any moral standing at all?
There remain two crucial challenges facing philosophers who attribute moral standing to individual living organisms that have not yet been addressed. One challenge comes from the anthropocentric thinkers and animal liberationists. They deny that “being alive” is a sufficient condition for the possession of moral standing. For example, while plants may have a biological good, is it really good of their own? Indeed, there seems to be no sense in which something can be said to be good or bad from the point of view of the plant itself. And if the plant doesn’t care about its fate, why should we (Warren, 2000, p. 48)? In response to this challenge, environmental ethicists have pointed out that conscious volition of an object or state is not necessary for that object or state to be a good. For example, consider a cat that needs worming. It is very unlikely that the cat has any understanding of what worming is, or that he needs worming in order to remain healthy and fit. However, it makes perfect sense to say that worming is good for the cat, because it contributes to the cat’s functioning and flourishing. Similarly, plants and tress may not consciously desire sunlight, water or nutrition, but each, according to some ethicists, can be said to be good for them in that they contribute to their biological flourishing.
The second challenge comes from philosophers who question the individualistic nature of these particular ethics. As mentioned above, these critics do not believe that an environmental ethic should place such a high premium on individuals. For many, this individualistic stance negates important ecological commitments to the interdependence of living things, and the harmony to be found in natural processes. Moreover, it is alleged that these individualistic ethics suffer from the same faults as anthropocentric and animal-centered ethics: they simply cannot account for our real and demanding obligations to holistic entities such as species and ecosystems. Once again, however, a word of caution is warranted here. It is not the case that philosophers who ascribe moral standing to individual living things simply ignore the importance of such “wholes”. Often the equilibrium of these entities is taken extremely seriously (See Taylor, 1986, p. 77). However, it must be remembered that such concern is extended only insofar as such equilibrium is necessary in order for individual living organisms to flourish; the wholes themselves have no independent moral standing. In the next section, those philosophers who claim that this standing should be extended to such “wholes” will be examined.
While Albert Schweitzer can be regarded as the most prominent philosophical influence for thinkers who grant moral standing to all individual living things, Aldo Leopold is undoubtedly the main influence on those who propose “holistic” ethics. Aldo Leopold’s “land ethic” demands that we stop treating the land as a mere object or resource. For Leopold, land is not merely soil. Instead, land is a fountain of energy, flowing through a circuit of soils, plants and animals. While food chains conduct the energy upwards from the soil, death and decay returns the energy back to the soil. Thus, the flow of energy relies on a complex structure of relations between living things. While evolution gradually changes these relations, Leopold argues that man’s interventions have been much more violent and destructive. In order to preserve the relations within the land, Leopold claims that we must move towards a “land ethic”, thereby granting moral standing to the land community itself, not just its individual members. This culminates in Leopold’s famous ethical injunction: “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise” (Leopold, 1949/1989, pp. 218-225).
Several philosophers, however, have questioned Leopold’s justification of the land ethic. For one thing, it seems that Leopold jumps too quickly from a descriptive account of how the land is, to a prescriptive account of what we ought to do. In other words, even if Leopold’s accounts of the land and its energy flows are correct, why should we preserve it? What precisely is it about the biotic community that makes it deserving of moral standing? Unfortunately, Leopold seems to offer no answers to these important questions, and thus no reason to build our environmental obligations around his land ethic. However, J. Baird Callicott has argued that such criticisms of Leopold are unfair and misplaced. According to Callicott, Leopold lies outside of mainstream moral theory. Rather than assign moral standing on the identification of some particular characteristic, such as consciousness or a biological good of one’s own, Leopold is claimed to accord moral standing on the basis of moral sentiment and affection. Thus, the question is not, what quality does the land possess that makes it worthy of moral standing? But rather, how do we feel about the land (Callicott, 1998)? In this light, the land ethic can be seen as an injunction to broaden our moral sentiments beyond self-interest, and beyond humanity to include the whole biotic community. This, so the argument goes, bridges the gap between the descriptive and the prescriptive in Leopold’s thought.
Of course, some have questioned whether sentiment and feelings are suitable foundations for an environmental ethic. After all, there seem to be plenty of people out there who have no affection for the biotic community whatsoever. If Leopold’s injunction is ignored by such people, must we simply give up hope of formulating any environmental obligations? In the search for more concrete foundations, Lawrence E. Johnson has built an alternative case for according moral standing to holistic entities (Johnson, 1993). Johnson claims that once we recognize that interests are not always tied to conscious experience, the door is opened to the possibility of nonconscious entities having interests and thus moral standing. So, just as breathing oxygen is in the interests of a child, even though the child has neither a conscious desire for oxygen, nor any understanding of what oxygen is, so do species have an interest in fulfilling their nature. This is because both have a good of their own, based on the integrated functioning of their life processes (ibid., p. 142). Children can flourish as living things, and so too can species and ecosystems; so, according to Johnson, both have interests that must be taken into account in our ethical deliberations.
But even if we accept that moral standing should be extended to holistic entities on this basis, we still need to consider how we are then to flesh out our moral obligations concerning the environment. For some, this is where holistic ethics fail to convince. In particular, it has been claimed that holistic ethics condone sacrificing individuals for the sake of the whole. Now while many holistic philosophers do explicitly condone sacrificing individuals in some situations, for example by shooting rabbits to preserve plant species, they are reluctant to sacrifice human interests in similar situations. But isn’t the most abundant species destroying biotic communities Homo sapiens? And if human individuals are just another element within the larger and more important biotic community, is it not necessary under holistic ethics to kill some of these “human pests” for the sake of the larger whole? Such considerations have led Tom Regan to label the implications of holistic ethics as “environmental fascism” (Regan, 1983/2004, p. 362). In response, proponents of such ethics have claimed that acknowledging moral standing in holistic entities does not mean that one must deny the interests and rights of human beings. They claim that granting moral standing to “wholes” is not the same thing as taking it away from individuals. While this is obviously true, that still leaves the question of what to do when the interests of wholes clash with the interests of individuals. If humans cannot be sacrificed for the good of the whole, why can rabbits?
The answer that has been put forward by Callicott claims that while the biotic community matters morally, it is not the only community that matters. Rather, we are part of various “nested” communities all of which have claims upon us. Thus, our obligations to the biotic community may require the culling of rabbits, but may not require the culling of humans. This is because we are part of a tight-knit human community, but only a very loose human-rabbit community. In this way, we can adjudicate clashes of interest, based on our community commitments. This communitarian proposal certainly seems a way out of the dilemma. Unfortunately, it faces two key problems: first, just who decides the content and strength of our various community commitments; and second, if human relationships are the closest, does all this lead back to anthropocentrism? As for the first point, if deciding on our community attachments is left up to individuals themselves, this will lead to quite diverse and even repugnant moral obligations. For example, if an individual believes that he has a much stronger attachment to white males than to black women, does this mean that he can legitimately favor the interests of the former over the latter? If not, and an objective standard is to be imposed, we are left with the enormous problem of discovering this standard and reaching consensus on it. Secondly, if our moral commitments to the biotic community are trumped by our obligations to the human community, doesn’t this lead us back down the path to anthropocentrism – the very thing the holist wants to avoid?
Without doubt, extending moral standing to the degree of holistic ethics requires some extremely careful argumentation when it comes to working out the precise content of our environmental obligations.
Not all philosophers writing on our obligations concerning the environment see the problem simply in terms of extending moral standing. Instead, many thinkers regard environmental concerns to have warranted an entirely new ideological perspective that has been termed, after its biological counterpart, “ecology”. While the ideas and beliefs within this “radical ecology” movement are diverse, they possess two common elements that separates them from the ethical extensionism outlined above. First of all, none see extending moral standing as sufficient to resolve the environmental crisis. They argue that a broader philosophical perspective is needed, requiring fundamental changes in both our attitude to and understanding of reality. This involves reexamining who we are as human beings and our place within the natural world. For radical ecologists, ethical extensionism is inadequate because it is stuck in the traditional ways of thinking that led to these environmental problems in the first place. In short, it is argued that ethical extensionism remains too human-centered, because it takes human beings as the paradigm examples of entities with moral standing and then extends outwards to those things considered sufficiently similar. Secondly, none of these radical ecologies confine themselves solely to the arena of ethics. Instead, radical ecologies also demand fundamental changes in society and its institutions. In other words, these ideologies have a distinctively political element, requiring us to confront the environmental crisis by changing the very way we live and function, both as a society and as individuals.
Deep ecology is perhaps most easily understood when considered in opposition to its “shallow” counterpart. According to deep ecologists, shallow ecology is anthropocentric and concerned with pollution and resource depletion. Shallow ecology might thus be regarded as very much the mainstream wing of environmentalism. Deep ecology, in contrast, rejects anthropocentrism and takes a “total-field” perspective. In other words, deep ecologists are not aiming to formulate moral principles concerning the environment to supplement our existing ethical framework. Instead, they demand an entirely new worldview and philosophical perspective. According to Arne Naess, the Norwegian philosopher who first outlined this shallow-deep split in environmentalism, deep ecologists advocate the development of a new eco-philosophy or “ecosophy“ to replace the destructive philosophy of modern industrial society (Naess, 1973). While the various eco-philosophies that have developed within deep ecology are diverse, Naess and George Sessions have compiled a list of eight principles or statements that are basic to deep ecology:
But while Naess regards those who subscribe to these statements as supporters of deep ecology, he does not believe it to follow that all such supporters will have the same worldview or “ecosophy”. In other words deep ecologists do not offer one unified ultimate perspective, but possess various and divergent philosophical and religious allegiances.
Naess’s own ecosophy involves just one fundamental ethical norm: “Self-realization!” For Naess, this norm involves giving up a narrow egoistic conception of the self in favor of a wider more comprehensive Self (hence the deliberate capital “S”). Moving to this wider Self involves recognizing that as human beings we are not removed from nature, but are interconnected with it. Recognizing our wider Self thus involves identifying ourselves with all other life forms on the planet. The Australian philosopher Warwick Fox has taken up this theme of self-realization in his own eco-philosophy, “transpersonal ecology”. Fox does not regard environmental ethics to be predominantly about formulating our moral obligations concerning the environment, but instead views it as about the realization of an “ecological consciousness”. For Fox, as with Naess, this consciousness involves our widest possible identification with the non-human world. The usual ethical concern of formulating principles and obligations thus becomes unnecessary, according to Fox, for once the appropriate consciousness is established, one will naturally protect the environment and allow it to flourish, for that will be part and parcel of the protection and flourishing of oneself (Fox,1990).
Critics of deep ecology argue that it is just too vague to address real environmental concerns. For one thing, in its refusal to reject so many worldviews and philosophical perspectives, many have claimed that it is difficult to uncover just what deep ecology advocates. For example, on the one hand, Naess offers us eight principles that deep ecologists should accept, and on the other he claims that deep ecology is not about drawing up codes of conduct, but adopting a global comprehensive attitude. Now, if establishing principles is important, as so many ethicists believe, perhaps deep ecology requires more precision than can be found in Naess and Sessions’s platform. In particular, just how are we to deal with clashes of interests? According to the third principle, for example, humans have no right to reduce the richness and diversity of the natural world unless to meet vital needs. But does that mean we are under an obligation to protect the richness and diversity of the natural world? If so, perhaps we could cull non-native species such as rabbits when they damage ecosystems. But then, the first principle states that non-human beings such as rabbits have inherent value, and the fifth principle states that human interference in nature is already excessive. So just what should we do? Clearly, the principles as stated by Naess and Sessions are too vague to offer any real guide for action.
However, perhaps principles are not important, as both Naess and Fox have claimed. Instead, they claim that we must rely on the fostering of the appropriate states of consciousness. Unfortunately, two problems remain. First of all, it is not at all clear that all conflicts of interest will be resolved by the adoption of the appropriate state of consciousness. For even if I identify myself with all living things, some of those things, such as bacteria and viruses, may still threaten me as a discrete living organism. And if conflicts of interest remain, don’t we need principles to resolve them? Secondly, and as we saw with Leopold’s land ethic, just what are we to do about those who remain unconvinced about adopting this new state of consciousness? If there aren’t any rational arguments, principles or obligations to point to, what chance is there of persuading such people to take the environmental crisis seriously?
At this point deep ecologists would object that such criticisms remain rooted in the ideology that has caused so much of the crisis we now face. For example, take the point about persuading others. Deep ecologists claim that argument and debate are not the only means we must use to help people realize their ecological consciousness; we must also use such things as poetry, music and art. This relates back to the point I made at the beginning of the section: deep ecologists do not call for supplementary moral principles concerning the environment, but an entirely new worldview. Whether such a radical shift in the way we think about ourselves and the environment is possible, remains to be seen.
Social ecology shares with deep ecology the view that the foundations of the environmental crisis lie in the dominant ideology of modern western societies. Thus, just as with deep ecology, social ecology claims that in order to resolve the crisis, a radical overhaul of this ideology is necessary. However, the new ideology that social ecology proposes is not concerned with the “self-realization” of deep ecology, but instead the absence of domination. Indeed, domination is the key theme in the writings of Murray Bookchin, the most prominent social ecologist. For Bookchin, environmental problems are directly related to social problems. In particular, Bookchin claims that the hierarchies of power prevalent within modern societies have fostered a hierarchical relationship between humans and the natural world (Bookchin, 1982). Indeed, it is the ideology of the free market that has facilitated such hierarchies, reducing both human beings and the natural world to mere commodities. Bookchin argues that the liberation of both humans and nature are actually dependent on one another. Thus his argument is quite different from Marxist thought, in which man’s freedom is dependent on the complete domination of the natural world through technology. For Bookchin and other social ecologists, this Marxist thinking involves the same fragmentation of humans from nature that is prevalent in capitalist ideology. Instead, it is argued that humans must recognize that they are part of nature, not distinct or separate from it. In turn then, human societies and human relations with nature can be informed by the non-hierarchical relations found within the natural world. For example, Bookchin points out that within an ecosystem, there is no species more important than another, instead relationships are mutualistic and interrelated. This interdependence and lack of hierarchy in nature, it is claimed, provides a blueprint for a non-hierarchical human society (Bookchin, 2001).
Without doubt, the transformation that Bookchin calls for is radical. But just what will this new non-hierarchical, interrelated and mutualistic human society look like? For Bookchin, an all powerful centralized state is just another agent for domination. Thus in order to truly be rid of hierarchy, the transformation must take place within smaller local communities. Such communities will be based on sustainable agriculture, participation through democracy, and of course freedom through non-domination. Not only then does nature help cement richer and more equal human communities, but transformed societies also foster a more benign relationship with nature. This latter point illustrates Bookchin’s optimistic view of humanity’s potential. After all, Bookchin does not think that we should condemn all of humanity for causing the ecological crisis, for instead it is the relationships within societies that are to blame (Bookchin, 1991). Because of this, Bookchin is extremely critical of the anti-humanism and misanthropy he perceives to be prevalent in much deep ecology.
One problem that has been identified with Bookchin’s social ecology is his extrapolation from the natural world to human society. Bookchin argues that the interdependence and lack of hierarchy within nature provides a grounding for non-hierarchical human societies. However, as we saw when discussing Aldo Leopold, it is one thing to say how nature is, but quite another to say how society ought to be. Even if we accept that there are no natural hierarchies within nature (which for many is dubious), there are plenty of other aspects of it that most of us would not want to foster in our human society. For example, weak individuals and weak species are often killed, eaten and out-competed in an ecosystem. This, of course, is perfectly natural and even fits in with ecology’s characterization of nature as interconnected. However, should this ground human societies in which the weak are killed, eaten and out-competed? Most of us find such a suggestion repugnant. Following this type of reasoning, many thinkers have warned of the dangers of drawing inferences about how society should be organized from certain facts about how nature is (Dobson, 1995, p. 42).
Some environmental philosophers have also pointed to a second problem with Bookchin’s theory. For many, his social ecology is anthropocentric, thus failing to grant the environment the standing it deserves. Critics cite evidence of anthropocentrism in the way Bookchin accounts for the liberation of both humans and nature. This unfolding process will not just occur of its own accord, according to Bookchin, rather, human beings must facilitate it. Of course, many philosophers are extremely skeptical of the very idea that history is inevitably “unfolding” towards some particular direction. However, some environmental philosophers are more wary of the prominent place that Bookchin gives to human beings in facilitating this unfolding. Of course, to what extent this is a problem depends on one’s point of view. After all, if humans cannot ameliorate the environmental problems we face, is there much point doing environmental ethics in the first place? Indeed, Bookchin himself has been rather nonplussed by this charge, and explicitly denies that humans are just another community in nature. But he also denies that nature exists solely for the purposes of humans. However, the critics remain unconvinced, and believe it to be extremely arrogant to think that humans know what the unfolding of nature will look like, let alone to think that they can bring it about (Eckersley, 1992, pp. 154-156).
Like social ecology, ecofeminism also points to a link between social domination and the domination of the natural world. And like both deep ecology and social ecology, ecofeminism calls for a radical overhaul of the prevailing philosophical perspective and ideology of western society. However, ecofeminism is a broad church, and there are actually a number of different positions that feminist writers on the environment have taken. In this section I will review three of the most prominent.
Val Plumwood offers a critique of the rationalism inherent in traditional ethics and blames this rationalism for the oppression of both women and nature. The fundamental problem with rationalism, so Plumwood claims, is its fostering of dualisms. For example, reason itself is usually presented in stark opposition to emotion. Traditional ethics, Plumwood argues, promote reason as capable of providing a stable foundation for moral argument, because of its impartiality and universalizability. Emotion, on the other hand, lacks these characteristics, and because it is based on sentiment and affection makes for shaky ethical frameworks. Plumwood claims that this dualism between reason and emotion grounds other dualisms in rationalist thought: in particular, mind/body, human/nature and man/woman. In each case, the former is held to be superior to the latter (Plumwood, 1991). So, for Plumwood, the inferiority of both women and nature have a common source: namely, rationalism. Once this is recognized, so the argument goes, it becomes clear that simple ethical extensionism as outlined above is insufficient to resolve the domination of women and nature. After all, such extensionism is stuck in the same mainstream rationalist thought that is the very source of the problem. What is needed instead, according to Plumwood, is a challenge to rationalism itself, and thus a challenge to the dualisms it perpetuates.
However, while it is perfectly possible to acknowledge the rationalism present in much mainstream ethical thinking, one can nevertheless query Plumwood’s characterization of it. After all, does rationalism necessarily
promote dualisms that are responsible for the subjugation of women and nature? Such a claim would seem odd given the many rationalist arguments that have been put forward to promote the rights and interests of both women and the natural world. In addition, many thinkers would argue that rationalist thought is not the enemy, but instead the best hope for securing proper concern for the environment and for women. For as we have seen above, such thinkers believe that relying on the sentiments and feelings of individuals is too unstable a foundation upon which to ground a meaningful ethical framework.
Karen J. Warren has argued that the dualisms of rationalist thought, as outlined by Plumwood, are not in themselves problematic. Rather, Warren claims that they become problematic when they are used in conjunction with an “oppressive conceptual framework” to justifysubordination. Warren argues that one feature inherent within an oppressive conceptual framework is the “logic of domination”. Thus, a list of the differences between humans and nature, and between men and women, is not in itself harmful. But once assumptions are added, such as these differences leading to the moral superiority
of humans and of men, then we move closer to the claim that we are justified in subordinating women and nature on the basis of their inferiority. According to Warren, just such a logic of domination has been prevalent within western society. Men have been identified with the realm of the “mental” and “human”, while women have been identified with the “physical” and the “natural”. Once it is claimed that the “natural” and the “physical” are morally inferior to the “human” and “mental”, men become justified in subordinating women and nature. For Warren then, feminists and environmentalists share the same goal: namely, to abolish this oppressive conceptual framework (Warren, 1990).
Other ecofeminists take a quite different approach to Plumwood and Warren. Rather than outlining the connections between the domination
of women and of nature, they instead emphasize those things that link women and the natural world. Women, so the argument goes, stand in a much closer relationship to the natural world due to their capacity for child-bearing. For some ecofeminists, this gives women a unique perspective on how to build harmonious relationships with the natural world. Indeed, many such thinkers advocate a spiritualist approach in which nature and the land are given a sacred value, harking back to ancient religions in which the Earth is considered female (Mies & Shiva, 1993).
For writers such as Plumwood, however, emphasizing women’s “naturalness” in this way simply reinforces the dualism that led to women’s oppression in the first place. Placing women as closer to nature, according to Plumwood, simply places them closer to oppression. Other critics argue that the adoption of a spiritualist approach leads feminists to turn their attention inwards to themselves and their souls, and away from those individuals and entities they should be trying to liberate. However, in response, these ecofeminists may make the same point as the deep ecologists: to resolve the environmental problems we face, and the systems of domination in place, it is the consciousness and philosophical outlook of individuals that must change.
Given the increasing concern for the environment and the impact that our actions have upon it, it is clear that the field of environmental ethics is here to stay.
However, it is less clear in what way the discipline will move forward. Having said that,
there is evidence for at least three future developments. First of all, environmental ethics needs to be and will be informed by changes in the political efforts to ameliorate environmental problems. Environmental ethics concerns formulating our moral obligations regarding the environment. While this enterprise can be, and often is, quite abstract, it is also meant to engage with the real world. After all, ethicists are making claims about how they think the world ought to be. Given this, the effectiveness of states and governments in “getting there” will affect the types of ethics that emerge. For example, the Kyoto Protocol might be regarded as the first real global attempt to deal with the problem of climate change. However, without the participation of so many large polluters, with the agreed reductions in greenhouse gas emissions so small, and with many countries looking like they may well miss their targets, many commentators already regard it as a failure. Ethicists need to respond not just by castigating those they blame for the failure. Rather they must propose alternative and better means of resolving the problems we face. For example, is it more important to outline a scheme of obligations for individuals
rather than states, and go for a bottom-up solution to these problems? Alternatively, perhaps businesses
should take the lead in tackling these problems. Indeed, it may even be in the interests of big business to be active in this way, given the power of consumers. It is quite possible then, that we will see business ethics address many of the same issues that environmental ethics has been tackling.
However, the effects of environmental ethics will not be limited to influencing and informing business ethics alone, but will undoubtedly feed into and merge with more mainstream ethical thinking.
After all, the environment is not something one can remove oneself from. In light of this, once it is recognized that we have environmental obligations, all areas of ethics are affected, including just war theory, domestic distributive justice, global distributive justice, human rights theory and many others. Take global distributive justice as an example: if one considers how climate change will affect people throughout the world so differently – affecting individuals’ homes, sanitation, resistance from disease, ability to earn a living and so on – it is clear that consideration of the environment is essential to such questions of justice. Part of the job of the environmental ethicist will thus be to give such disciplines the benefit of his or her expertise.
Finally, environmental ethics will of course be informed by our scientific understanding of the environment. Whether it be changes in our understanding of how ecosystems work, or changes in the evidence concerning the environmental crisis, it is clear that such change will inform and influence those thinkers writing on our environmental obligations.
London School of Economics and Political Science
Last updated: April 23, 2007 | Originally published: