We get a great number of our beliefs from what others tell us. The epistemology of testimony concerns how we should evaluate these beliefs. Here are the main questions. When are the beliefs justified, and why? When do they amount to knowledge, and why?
When someone tells us p, where p is some statement, and we accept it, then we are forming a testimonially-based belief that p. Testimony in this sense need not be formal testimony in a courtroom; it happens whenever one person tells something to someone else. What conditions should be placed on the recipient of testimonially-based beliefs? Must the recipient of testimony have beliefs about the reliability of the testifier, or inductive support for such a belief? Or, on the other hand, is it enough if the testifier is in fact reliable, and a recipient may satisfy his epistemic duties without having a belief about that reliability? What external environmental conditions should be placed on the testifier? For the recipient to know something, must the testifier know it, too?
For our basic case of testimonially-based belief, let us say that person T, our testifier, says p to person S, our epistemic subject, and S believes that p. This article will first survey arguments related to S-side issues, then those related to T-side issues.
This article considers the epistemology of testimonially-based belief. Let’s unpack that phrase. Discussing the basis of different beliefs presupposes that one important way we should categorize beliefs is by where they came from. The basis of a belief is its source or root. When we look across the room and see a chair, we form a perceptually-based belief that there is a chair nearby. When we believe that p and believe that p entails q, and then conclude that q, we form a deductively-based belief that q. When we observe that gravity has operated in the past and we infer that it will continue to operate in the future, we form an inductively-based belief about gravity. When we remember what we ate this morning, we form a memorially-based belief about our breakfast. And when someone tells us that p, and we accept it, we form a testimonially-based belief that p. Testimony in this sense need not be formal testimony in a courtroom, but happens whenever one person tells something to someone else.
It will be helpful to use the same terminology throughout this article. For our basic case of testimonially-based belief, let us say that T, our testifier, says p to S, our epistemic subject, and S believes that p. Different permutations will be considered, but this will be the terminology for the basic case.
Actual beliefs might not, of course, have only one basis. A belief might be partly testimonially-based and partly perceptually-based, just as it might be partly inductively-based and partly memorially-based. However, an understanding of pure cases, which we will pursue in this article, should illuminate hybrid instances.
Now, the epistemology of a belief is a particular sort of evaluation. Epistemologists assign honors like “knowledge” or “justification” to beliefs based on whether those beliefs are up to snuff epistemically. The epistemology of testimonially-based belief, then, concerns the epistemic status of S’s belief that p. Is it justified? Is it rational? Is it warranted? Is it sufficiently supported by evidence? Is S entitled to believe it? Does S know that p?
One way to speak of the epistemology of testimonially-based belief is to speak directly of the epistemic status at issue: we can talk about testimonially-based knowledge, testimonially-based justification, or testimonial evidence.
Many of the contemporary disputes in the epistemology of testimony occur in two broad fields. One dispute, or set of disputes, concerns the extent of the internal conditions placed on testimonially-based belief related to the recipient, S. (To phrase the debate in terms of internal conditions is not to beg the question against epistemic externalism the externalist is characterized precisely by his failure to place such demands regarding the internal accessibility. See, for instance, the title of Bergmann 2006b: Justification Without Awareness: A Defense of Epistemic Externalism.) When is a testimonially-based belief justified, or rational, or reasonable, or permissible, or within our epistemic entitlements? Is testimonially-based justification really a special case of inferentially-based justification, or is it (instead) analogous to perceptually- or memorially-based justification? What sorts of epistemic demands do we properly place on those who believe what others tell them? Coady 1973 uses the terms “reductionism” and “anti-reductionism” to describe approaches to these issues. Speaking broadly, reductionism views testimony as akin to inference and places a relatively heavy burden on the recipient of testimony, while anti-reductionism views testimony as akin to perception or memory and places a relatively light burden on the recipient of testimony.
A second area involves the external conditions on the testifier, T, in order for S to know that p. Must T know that p herself? Must T’s testimony even be true? Must T reliably testify that p?
This article will first survey arguments related to S-side issues, then those related to T-side questions. These two areas do not by any means exhaust the topics of great interest to epistemology, but are a useful first place to begin.
As noted in the final section of this article, there are some important disputes about exactly what counts as “testimony.” For the most part, this article will make do with a rough “T told S that p” formulation. However, especially in T-side issues, a key issue is frequently whether a proposed counterexample counts as testimonially-based belief. This article can only suggest some of the relevant considerations to that issue, rather than canvassing it in detail.
This article focuses chiefly on the epistemology of testimony in general, rather than the epistemology of human testimony. Because there is considerable controversy about what is required, as a conceptual matter, for testimonially-based knowledge or justification or rationality, it seems wisest to get as clear a view of the nature of testimonial justification and testimonial knowledge, as such, before proceeding to more obviously practical considerations related to an evaluation of particular actual testimonially-based beliefs. To the extent that we only consider the epistemology of testimony in general, our conclusions may be relatively thin and unsatisfying. However, controversy regarding the basic nature of epistemic phenomena across the universe of possible testimonially-based beliefs means that this sort of preliminary brush-clearing is important.
The most prominent debate in the epistemology of testimony is between “reductionism” and “non-reductionism,” terms due to Coady 1973. The earliest clear statements of these positions appear in David Hume and Thomas Reid. Hume said, “[T]here is no species of reasoning more common, more useful, and more necessary to human life, than that which is derived from the testimony of men, and the reports of eye-witnesses and spectators. … [O]ur assurance in any argument of this kind is derived from no other principle than our observation of the veracity of human testimony, and of the usual conformity of facts to the reports of witnesses.” (Hume 1748, section X, at 74.) Hume’s picture is that we properly form beliefs based on testimony only because we have seen other confirmed instances. Testimonially-based justification is therefore reducible to a combination of perceptually-, memorially-, and inferentially-based justification. (In theory, one might also include a priori insight among the sources to which testimonial justification is reduced, though Hume does not do so.)
Reid, however, argued that children properly trust others even when they lack any past inductive basis in their experience: “[I]f credulity were the effect of reasoning and experience, it must grow up and gather strength, in the same proportion as reason and experience do. But, if it is the gift of Nature, it will be strongest in childhood, and limited and restrained by experience; and the most superficial view of human nature shews, that the last is really the case, and not the first. … [N]ature intends that our belief should be guided by the authority and reason of others before it can be guided by our own reason.” (Reid 1764, chapter 6, section 24, at 96.) Reid suggests that we have an innate faculty, unconfirmed by personally-observed earlier instances, which properly causes us to trust those who testify. Testimonially-based justification flows from the reliability of this faculty, and so it is not reducible to perceptually- and inferentially-based justification.
The reducibility of testimonially-based justification is thus one way to characterize the debate between Hume and Reid and their modern successors over the internal conditions on testimonially-based beliefs. A second way to characterize such disputes is to ask to what extent testimonially-based beliefs are implicitly inferential. A Humean approach holds that we infer the reliability of a present bit of testimony from the reliability of earlier instances, while a Reidian approach holds that testimonially-based beliefs are properly non-inferential, or direct. The inferentialist sees testimonially-based belief as the acceptance (or the hypothetical acceptance) of an argument like this:
The non-inferentialist sees testimony as less like an invitation to an argument and more like the input to a machine. T tells S that p, and, seizing upon T’s act of communication, S’s testimony-processing faculty causes S to believe that p.
(Audi 1997 helpfully distinguishes between hypothetical and actual inferences. He holds that testimonially-based beliefs are formed directly, but are nonetheless justified on the basis of other beliefs; such beliefs could be used to support the testimonially-based belief, but need not be part of its actual genesis.)
Lackey 2006a gives relatively full recent lists of the adversaries in the S-side literature in terms of reductionism (at 183 n.3) versus nonreductionism (at 186 n.19), while Graham 2006:93 does the same in terms of inferential versus direct views. These lists appear below, just before the bibliography.
A third way to characterize disputes over testimonially-based beliefs is to ask to what extent testimonially-based justification is analogous to perceptually-based justification. The Humean-reductionist tradition sees strong disanalogies, while the Reidian-non-reductionist tradition sees a strong analogy between the sources. See, for instance, Lackey 2005:163 (“non-reductionists maintain that testimony is just as basic a source of justification (knowledge, warrant, entitlement, and so forth) as sense-perception, memory, inference, and the like”); Graham 2004:n.4 (“The central claim the Anti-Reductionist makes is that the epistemologies of perception, memory, and testimony should all look more or less alike.”).
None of these formulations captures contemporary debates perfectly well. Few contemporary philosophers will endorse Hume’s reductionist or inferentialist approach to testimonially-based belief in anything close to full form. Some philosophers would demand that S have positive reasons to believe in T’s reliability, or place other demands on S, but almost all of them stop short of insisting that S have a sufficiently-large inductive base to justify an inference that p from other beliefs, or to reduce testimonially-based justification to perceptually-, memorially-, and inferentially-based beliefs. Regarding the analogy between the epistemology of perceptually- and testimonially-based beliefs, even Reid, the prototype non-reductionist, saw significant disanalogies between beliefs based on perception and testimony. See Reid 1785 (article 2, chapter 20, at 203): “There is no doubt an analogy between the evidence of the senses and the evidence of testimony. … But there is a real difference between the two as well as a similarity. When we believe something on the basis of someone’s testimony, we rely on that person’s authority. But we have no such authority for believing our senses.”
Rather than characterizing the internal dispute solely in terms of reductionism, or inferentialism, or a perceptual-testimonial analogy, this article will simply consider arguments in favor of a relatively demanding approach to testimony versus arguments in favor of a relatively less demanding approach. Details about exactly which demands different authors would make on testimonially-based belief are best explained individually. Rather than applying labels like “Reductionist” or “Inferentialist,” this article simply uses “Liberal” and “Conservative.” Liberals are less demanding on testimonially-based justification and allow testimonially-based beliefs to count as justified, or as knowledge, more liberally; conservatives are more demanding and dispense testimonially-based epistemic honors more conservatively. In considering each demand, this article will also ask whether the demand might also reasonably be placed on perceptually-based beliefs as well.
The usage of “liberal” and “conservative” here has a kinship with the technical use of these terms in Graham 2006:95, but it is not the same. Graham uses the labels “reactionary,” “conservative,” “moderate,” and “liberal” to refer to those who accept or reject specific basic principles of epistemic justification. Graham’s “reactionary” accepts only principles regarding a priori insight, internal experiences, and deduction, rejecting principles related to memory, enumerative induction, inference to the best explanation, perception, and testimony. Graham’s “conservative” rejects only principles regarding perception and testimony; his “moderate” rejects only the principle regarding testimony, while his “liberal”—Graham’s own view—accepts the principle for testimony as well. Graham’s use of these principles in comparing testimony to perception and memory is discussed below.
Some philosophers place demands on testimonially-based beliefs regarding some epistemic honors, but not others. For instance, Audi 1997 is relatively demanding regarding testimonially-based justification, but because he does not think justification is required for knowledge, he is relatively lenient regarding testimonially-based knowledge. Burge 1993:458-59 is relatively lenient regarding what he calls testimonial “entitlement,” but reserves the label “justification” for instances where S is aware of an entitlement. Graham 2006:104ff. is relatively lenient regarding testimonially-based “pro tanto” justification—that is, he allows testimonially-based beliefs to have some justification relatively easily—but more demanding when considering whether S would have enough pro-tanto justification to have a justified belief. Plantinga 1993:82 similarly distinguishes between S having some testimonially-based evidence from having enough for S to have knowledge: “Testimonial evidence is indeed evidence; and if I get enough and strong enough testimonial evidence for a give fact … the belief in question may have enough warrant to constitute knowledge.”
Finally for preliminaries, we should distinguish arguments about what demands to place on testimonially-based beliefs from arguments about how those demands might be satisfied. Coady, Burge, and Graham suggest in different ways that we have a priori reason to accept testimonially-based beliefs, but they are all liberal about whether to place a general demand that testimonially-based beliefs be based on reasons such as the ones they offer. This article very briefly surveys their three approaches in a separate section.
Faulkner 2000 argues that the fact that testimony comes from a person, rather than an inanimate object, is a reason to be more demanding on testimonially-based beliefs than on perceptually-based beliefs. Lackey 2006a:176 and 188 n.44 also endorses this argument. People like T can lie, but the matter in our perceptual environment cannot. See also Audi 2006:40: “[T] must in some sense, though not necessarily by conscious choice, select what to attend to, and in doing so can also lie or, in a certain way, mislead … For the basic sources, there is no comparable analogue of such voluntary representation of information.”
One way to make the point more precise is to claim that because free actions are particularly indeterministic—that is, because determinism is false, and so the past plus laws is not enough to guarantee future free actions—the environment for a testimonially-based belief cannot be regular and law-governed in the way that the environment for a perceptually-based belief can be. Graham 2004 considers such an argument in detail. He argues, however, that the presence of human freedom in testimonial cases is not a significant reason to prefer a conservative approach. He argues that if a libertarian approach to human freedom undermines the predictability of human actions, then it would also undermine a conservative approach to testimony; if T’s actions were unpredictable, then S could never have a proper basis on which to believe that T is likely to be honest, for instance. However, Graham argues that if libertarianism does not undermine predictability—either because it is false, or because counterfactuals of freedom are nonetheless somehow true—then testimonial liberalism is not threatened by human freedom, because the environments for testimonially-based beliefs can in fact be as predictable as the environments for perceptually-based beliefs.
Green 2006:82ff. argues that freedom is not distinctive of testimonially-based beliefs. Faulkner and Lackey both refer to this factor as a reason to distinguish perceptually-based beliefs from testimonially-based beliefs. However, perceptually-based beliefs can also suffer from the influence of deception. Fake objects, for instance, can be the result of deception, and perceptual-based beliefs about fake objects can obviously go awry because of the influence of agency on a perceptual environment. If the possibility of deception is a good reason to think that S requires positive reasons to believe T, then there seems to be equally strong reason to require that S have positive reasons to believe that the objects of her perceptually-based beliefs are genuine. The conservative might respond that deception may sometimes be at stake in a perceptually-based belief, but deception is always a possibility for testimonially-based ones. However, this seems clearly untrue as a conceptual matter; it is at least possible for T to be a reliable robot lacking freedom. And even among common human experience, there are cases where people lack the time to deliberate about deception; human free human action is not always at stake in testimonially-based belief.
While she criticizes reductionism, Lackey 2006a argues that S does need positive reasons to believe T’s testimony. She relies on an example in which T is an extraterrestrial alien, dropping what appears to S to be a diary written in English, describing events on T’s home planet. Because, Lackey thinks, S has no reason to believe that the diary really is English, is not ironic, and so on, S’s belief is unjustified. “[H]earers need positive reasons in order to acquire testimonial justification, thereby avoiding the charge of … gullibility and intellectual irresponsibility.” Lackey 2006a:179; compare the title of Fricker 1994, “Against Gullibility.”
Testimonial liberals might respond to Lackey’s counterexample by simply reporting different intuitions. S is entitled to believe even reports from aliens that are apparently in English, and may assume without evidence (and in the absence of counter-evidence) that they are sincere and so on. Intuitions about the vice of gullibility may differ: liberals might say that it is in fact a vice to be too skeptical of others’ reports when there is no positive reason to doubt them.
Green 2006:67ff. argues that a perceptual analogue to the alien case can be constructed. S is suddenly transported to an unfamiliar perceptual environment and seems to see certain objects outside what looks like a window. But S may have no reason to think that the window is not, for instance, a television screen showing a greatly-magnified image of a scene far away, rather than a window opening onto nearby ordinary-sized objects. If S’s perceptually-based beliefs in that scenario do not required positive reasons to believe that his perceptual environment and faculties are functioning normally, then it is not clear why S need such reasons in the testimonial case.
In arguing against gullibility, Fricker 1994 argues in favor of S’s duty to monitor T for signs of untrustworthiness, suggesting that neglecting such a duty makes S gullible. Those who advocate S’s presumptive right to trust T, she argues, must dispense with any duty in S to monitor T for signs of untrustworthiness. Goldberg and Henderson 2005 argue, however, that the testimonial non-reductionist can also countenance a requirement that S be sensitive to signs of T’s untrustworthiness; Fricker 2006c responds. Particularly after Fricker’s reply, it is not immediately obvious that the dispute between Goldberg and Henderson and Fricker is over anything epistemically substantive; at first glance the dispute is merely over the label “anti-reductionism” would properly apply to a view that imposes on S a robust duty to monitor T. However, the substantive issue about how best to characterize and understand the epistemic significance of the sensitivity to defeaters is of relevance even if it does not push toward either testimonial liberalism or conservatism.
Fricker 2004:119 suggests that S has an unusual amount of freedom related to the formation of testimonially-based beliefs. The action of trusting a testifier is one which is taken in a self-aware way, unlike the formation of a perceptually-based belief. Audi 2006:40 makes a similar suggestion: “[S] commonly can withhold belief, if not at will then indirectly, by taking on a highly cautionary frame of mind.”
Green 2006:64 argues that we have similar freedom to reject even perceptually-based beliefs. We can indulge skeptical scenarios, like being a brain in a vat, without much difficulty. Further, there might be beings who accept testimony as readily as we accept the deliverances of our senses; there does not seem to be anything inherent about testimony that makes us freer to reject it.
Strawson 1994:24 suggests that testimony as a source of beliefs requires other sources, such as perception: “[T]he employment of perception and memory is a necessary condition of the acquisition and retention of any knowledge (or belief) which is communicated linguistically…” Audi 2006:31 notes, “In order to receive your testimony about the time, I must hear you or otherwise perceive—in some perhaps very broad sense of ‘perceive’—what you say… [T]estimony is … operationally dependent on perception.” Audi 2002:80 says, “[A]part from perceptual justification for believing something to the effect that you attested to p, I cannot acquire justification for believing it on the basis of your testimony.”
For human beings, S’s sensations that accompany her reception of T’s testimony will also supply ground for perceptually-based beliefs. However, it seems possible to imagine beings who go directly from sensations to the formation of testimonially-based beliefs, lacking even the ability to form perceptually-based beliefs on the basis of those sensations. They would have the ability to receive testimony, but not necessarily the ability to form related perceptually-based beliefs. They might reason inductively about these testimonially-based beliefs through forming higher-order beliefs about the existence of the sensations.
Burge 1993:460 offers a related response. He argues that an a priori entitlement like the belief in a mathematical proof might be dependent on sense perception in the sense that, for instance, I must see the writing on a page in order to understand the proof. However, he argues that such a role for perception does not contribute to the “rational or normative force behind [such] beliefs.” Likewise, perceptually-based beliefs might allow human beings to obtain testimonially-based beliefs without contributing to the justification or other epistemic status of such beliefs. If that is correct, then the operational dependence that Strawson and Audi highlight is not of epistemic consequence.
Plantinga 1993 and Audi 2006 suggest that testimony differs from sources like perception in the way in which testimonially-based beliefs can be defeated by other sources, or the way in which other sources of evidence can trump testimonially-based evidence. Plantinga says (at 87), “[I]n many situations, while testimony does indeed provide warrant, there is a cognitively superior way. I learn by way of testimony that first-order logic is complete…. I do even better, however, if I come to see these truths for myself…” Audi says (at 39), “[W]e cannot test the reliability of one of these basic sources [that is, for Audi, a source like perception or memory, but not testimony] or even confirm an instance of it without relying on that very source. … With testimony, one can, in principle, check reliability using any of the standard basic sources.”
One response to Plantinga and Audi is to point out instances in which perceptually- or memorially-based beliefs could be checked, or trumped, by testimonially-based beliefs. For instance, S might see a strange phenomenon, strange enough that S asks others nearby if they are seeing what S thinks he’s seeing. S might be worried about his perceptual or memorial faculties, and so seek testimony to confirm them. Graham 2006:102 makes a similar point. After listing several ways in which sources besides testimony can be defeated, he notes, “That a source is a source of defeaters for beliefs from another source, or even from itself, does not show that the other source depends for justification on inferential support from another source, or even itself. … The fact that my perception defeats your testimony does not show that testimony is inferential and not direct. Indeed, the fact that testimony-based beliefs sometimes defeat perceptual beliefs does not show that testimony is prior to perception.”
Most testimonial liberals include a defeater condition on testimonially-based knowledge or justification. S’s entitlement to believe T is defeasible, if other contrary information about p, or about T, is available to S. A conservative could argue, in line with the well-known approach of BonJour, that including such a requirement, but not a requirement of positive reasons to believe in T’s reliability, would be inconsistent, or an “untenable half-way house.” BonJour 1980 and 2003 consider an S informed by a reliable clairvoyant faculty that p, but who also has either (a) strong evidence that ~p, or (b) strong evidence that his clairvoyant power is unreliable, or (c) no evidence to believe that the faculty is reliable. While a defeater condition could handle cases (a) or (b), BonJour argues that those who say that knowledge or justification is defeated in these cases should also say that it is defeated in case (c). Replacing the clairvoyant faculty with T, we can construct an exactly parallel argument that those testimonial liberals who admit that S lacks justification or knowledge where S has evidence that ~p, or evidence that T is unreliable, should also concede that S lacks knowledge or justification where S has no evidence that T is reliable. (Compare Lackey 2006a:168 and 186 n.21, noting that the way in which accounts of testimony typically add a defeater condition is the same as the way they add such a condition in response to BonJour’s counterexamples.)
The testimonial liberal can resist this argument, however, in the same way that BonJour’s opponents resist his claims in general, by reporting contrary intuitions on his examples. Green 2007 offers one attempt to defend the tenability of an approach to either knowledge or justification that imposes a no-defeater requirement, but not a positive-reasons-to-believe-in-reliability condition, based on the way that the law handles fraud cases. The law holds that plaintiffs who sue for fraud lack “justified reliance” if they have defeaters for their fraudulently-induced belief, but not if they merely lack a reason to believe that the defendant is reliable. (Compare Bergmann 2006a:691 (“One perfectly sensible externalist reply is to say that although the no-defeater requirement seems intuitively obvious, the awareness requirement does not.”)).
When T tells S that p, one might demand that S have (on pain of “ignorant” or “unjustified” status) other beliefs concerning T or T’s trustworthiness. The existence or epistemic quality of these higher-order beliefs would matter regarding the evaluation of S’s underlying belief that p. Fricker 2006b:600 suggests that in forming testimonially-based beliefs by trusting T, S typically has a higher-order belief about T and his trustworthiness: “Once a hearer forms belief that [p] on a teller T’s say-so, she is consequently committed to the proposition that T knows that [p]. But her belief about T which constitutes this trust, antecedent to her utterance, is something like this: T is such that not easily would she assert that [p], vouch for the truth of [p], unless she knew that [p].” Weiner 2003 (chapter 3 at 5) likewise suggests that testimonially-based beliefs, unlike perceptually-based ones, are typically attended by beliefs about T: “When we form beliefs through perception, we may do so automatically, without any particular belief about how our perceptual system works. When we form beliefs through testimony, at some level we are aware that we are believing what a person says, and that this person is presenting her testimony as her own belief.”
Green 2006:87ff. argues, however, that it is not clear that testimony is really different from perception in this respect. Many recipients of testimony have a vague belief about T, but for many others this belief is at best implicit, and for others it is hard to say that even an implicit belief arises. Likewise for perceptually-based belief: many perceivers form beliefs that they are receiving information from their perceptual environments and their perceptual faculties; for others this belief is either vague, or implicit, or not really there at all. There does not seem to be any necessary inhibition of higher-order beliefs from the very nature of perception, nor any necessary production of higher-order beliefs from the very nature of testimony.
The most common objection to putting greater demands on testimonially-based beliefs is that these heightened demands simply cannot be satisfied in cases that, intuitively, do amount to knowledge or justified belief. Plantinga 1993:79 puts the point this way:
Reid is surely right in thinking that the beliefs we form by way of credulity or testimony are typically held in the basic way, not by way of inductive or abductive evidence from other things I believe. I am five years old; my father tells me that Australia is a large country and occupies an entire continent all by itself. I don’t say to myself, “My father says thus and so; most of the time when I have checked what he says has turned out to be true; so probably this is; so probably Australia is a very large country that occupies an entire continent by itself.” I could reason that way and in certain specialized circumstances we do reason that way. But typically we don’t. Typically we just believe what we are told, and believe it in the basic way. … I say I could reason in the inductive way to what testimony testifies to; but of course I could not have reasoned thus in coming to the first beliefs I held on the basis of testimony.
Relatedly, Lackey 2006a argues that a general inductive basis for belief in “testimony” would fail because the category of testimonially-based beliefs is too heterogeneous to support the relevant induction. The inference from particular instances of confirmed testimony to new cases is only as strong as the basis for believing that new instances will be similar to old ones. But those who testify about, say, events in Greece 2500 years ago, will be very different from those who testify about middle-sized dry goods in the next room.
A kindred point that liberals make in favor of the insufficient-inductive-base argument is to point out Hume’s mistaken explanation for why our testimonialy-based beliefs are supported inductively. For instance, Coady 1992:79-82 documents several places where Hume, in describing the inductive base for a belief in the reliability of testimony, actually uses evidence drawn from other people. As Van Cleve 2006:67 summarizes the argument, “the vast majority (or perhaps even the totality) of what passes for corroboration of testimony itself relies on other testimony.” Compare Shogenji 2006:332: “[I]n justifying the epistemic subject’s trust in testimony the reductionist cannot cite other people’s perception and memory—for example, the reductionist cannot cite perception and memory of the person who provides the testimony. Only the epistemic subject’s own perception and memory are relevant to the justification of her trust in testimony.”
Van Cleve responds to this argument, however, by suggesting that corroboration of testimony is not inherently dependent on others; over the course of his life, Van Cleve says he has verified a great number of instances of testimony—both the existence of the Grand Canyon and Taj Mahal, but also “thousands of more quotidian occurrences of finding beer in the fridge or a restroom down the hall on the right after being told where to look.” He concludes that it is not necessary that our inductive base is necessarily weak: “[W]hat matters is not the proportion of testimonial beliefs I have checked, but the proportion of checks taken that have had positive results.” Van Cleve 2006:68.
Shogenji 2006 makes a unique defense of a conservative approach to testimonially-based beliefs. He argues that if Coady is right that we need to believe in the general reliability of testimony in order to interpret testimonial utterances—a Davidsonian argument that this article considers below—then if S has a non-testimonial basis for interpreting a statement in a particular way, S can likewise infer the general reliability of testimony from that basis. Shogeni says (at 339-340),
[B]y the time the epistemic subject is in possession of testimonial evidence by interpreting people’s utterances, her belief in the general credibility of their testimony is well supported. For, unless the hypothesis that testimony is generally credible is true, the epistemic subject is unable to interpret utterances and hence has no testimonial evidence. … The unintelligibility of testimony without general credibility is … not an objection to reductionism about testimonial justification, but a consequence of the dual role of the observation used for interpretation—the observation confirms the interpretation of utterances and the credibility of testimony at the same time. … [E]ven a young child’s trust in testimony can be justified by her own perception and memory. In order for people’s utterances to be testimonial evidence for her, the child must have interpreted the utterances, but the kind of experience that allows her to interpret the utterances is also the kind of experience that supports the general credibility of testimony.
Shogeni also argues that the ubiquity of testimonially-based beliefs—and therefore the ubiquity of reliance on the reliability of testimony—can be used to give greater confirmation for the reliability of testimony. Because the general reliability of testimony is implicated in so many of our beliefs, we have a large number of opportunities to add small bits of confirmation to the hypothesis that testimony is reliable. He says (at 343-344),
Beliefs based on testimony are part of the web of beliefs we regularly rely on when we form a variety of expectations. This means that the hypothesis that testimony is credible plays a crucial role when we form these expectations. As a result, even if we do not deliberately seek confirmation of the credibility hypothesis, it receives tacit confirmation whenever observation matches the expectations that are in part based on the credibility hypothesis. Even if the degree of tacit confirmation by a single observation is small, there are plenty of such observations. Their cumulative effect is substantial and should be sufficient for justifying our trust in testimony.
Interestingly, Shogeni does not argue that we should be more demanding of testimonially-based beliefs than we are for perceptually-based beliefs; he notes (at 345 n.15) that Shogenji 2000 “uses essentially the same reasoning as described here to show that the reliability of perception can be confirmed by the use of perception without circularity.”
What can the liberal say in response to such an argument? One response would be to abandon Coady’s Davidsonian argument that interpreting testimonial utterances requires an assumption that testimony is reliable. If that is not right—as liberals such as Graham and Plantinga have argued—then the possibility of interpretation is not enough to justify belief in the reliability of testimony.
Finally, even if the inductive base for testimonially-based beliefs is poor, the conservative can reply to this sort of argument by simply denying that we have very much testimonially-based justification or testimonially-based knowledge. Van Cleve 2006:68 suggests this route for children, suggesting that they do, in fact, lack epistemic justification for their testimonially-based beliefs: “Children … go through a credulous phase during which they believe without reason nearly everything they are told. As reductionists, however, we must hold that these beliefs are justified only in a pragmatic sense, not in an epistemic sense.”
Some liberals support lenient principles to govern testimonially-based beliefs on the basis of their great similarity to principles that many people believe govern perceptually-based beliefs.
For instance, Graham 2006:95ff. considers those who believe what he calls PER (“If S’s perceptual system represents an object as F (where F is a perceptible property), and this causes or sustains in the normal way S’s belief of x that it is F, then that confers justification on S’s belief that x is F”) and MEM (“If S seems to remember that [p] and this causes or sustains in the normal way S’s belief that [p], then that confers justification on S’s belief that [p]”), but who reject what he calls TEST (“If a subject S (seemingly) comprehends a (seeming) presentation-as-true by a (seeming) speaker that [p], and if that causes or sustains in the normal way S’s belief that [p], then that confers justification on S’s belief that [p]”). Graham then defends TEST against those who accept PER and MEM. He notes (at 101-102) that those who accept PER and MEM would already reject the idea that a difference in the degree of reliability should amount to a difference in epistemic kind, and would also already accept that perceptual or memorial beliefs can be direct, even though they can be defeated by other sorts of beliefs. He likewise argues (at 100) that the reasons to adopt PER, rather than seeing perceptual beliefs as inferential, are directly parallel to the reasons to adopt TEST as well.
Green 2006 argues that testimonially-, memorially-, and perceptually-based beliefs are on an epistemic par, in the sense that, over the universes of possible beliefs based on the three sources, the set of explanations of the epistemic status of those beliefs displays the same structure. (He excludes beliefs that cannot be perceptually-based, but could be testimonially- or memorially-based; we cannot literally perceive mathematical facts, but we can be told them, or remember them.) Green argues first that such parity is a more economical account of epistemic phenomena—and so an account more likely to be true—than accounts that distinguish sharply between the three sources. Second, he argues (at 218 ff.) that the epistemic parity of these sources follows from the epistemic innocence of certain transformations which will turn instances of testimonially-based beliefs into instances of beliefs based on the other two sources, or vice-versa—that is, the claim that such transformations preserve the structure of the explanation of epistemic status.
Turning perceptually-based beliefs into testimonially-based beliefs requires anthropomorphizing our sense faculties and environments—considering a possible world in which our sense faculties are monitored and operated by little persons who present messages to us about our environment, by causing perceptual sensations just like the ones in normal perceptually-based beliefs. Green suggests that the structure of the explanation for the epistemic status of such testimonially-based beliefs would have the same structure as the explanations for the epistemic status of perceptually-based beliefs before the transformation. The mere fact that a faculty for obtaining information is operated by a person, Green claims, should not make a difference in how that source of information produces justified beliefs and knowledge. The opposite transformation—from testimonially-based beliefs into perceptually-based beliefs—requires treating our testifier T as a machine, akin to, say, a telescope. This transformation would treat human beings as an environmental medium through which information about the world passes in complicated ways. Deception is possible when we get information from a testifier, but it is also possible when we get information from a telescope (for instance, if someone has put a fake picture on the end of it).
The conservative could respond to Green’s argument by claiming that these transformations are, in fact, not epistemically innocent. Anthropomorphizing our sense faculties would inherently introduce the element of human agency, and treating T as a perceptual device would remove it. As summarized above, however, Green argues that agency is already potentially at stake in cases of perception, for instance because of the possibility that someone else has substituted a fake object.
Several thinkers likewise draw analogies between testimonially-based beliefs and memorially-based ones. Dummett 1994, for instance, quoted above on relationship between the T-side and S-side debates, suggests that both memory and testimony are both merely means of preserving or transmitting knowledge, not of creating it, and are similarly direct and lacking need for supporting beliefs. Schmitt 2006 argues that transindividual reasons—that is, reasons that T has, but which also count as reasons for S’s belief—are no more problematic than the transtemporal reasons at stake in memory—that is, reasons that S has at time 1, but which also count as reasons for S’s belief at time 2. Foley 2001 argues that trust in others, at stake in testimony, is no less justified than trust in oneself, at stake in memory.
As noted above, Green 2006 argues that testimony and memory are also on an epistemic par. Green’s method of transforming testimonially-based beliefs into memorially-based beliefs is to treat the testifier T as S’s epistemic agent, and then to apply the fiction of the law of agency, qui facit per alium, facit per se—“he who acts through another, acts himself.” If T’s earlier actions are treated as if they were actually S’s own actions, then the transfer of information from T to S will be the same sort of transfer of information that happens when, using memory, S at time 1 transfers information to S at time 2. Green’s claim is that this transformation keeps the structure of the explanation of epistemic status of the resulting belief the same. On the other hand, turning memorially-based beliefs into testimonially-based beliefs requires treating S at time 1 as a different person from S at time 2. If the earlier time slice is someone else, and we treat the recovery of information from a memory trace as the interpretation of a message from that person, then memorially-based beliefs are transformed into testimonially-based ones. Green’s claim is that that transformation should not create or preserve epistemic status, or affect the structure of its explanation.
As with the response to Green’s argument for an analogy between perception and testimony, the conservative could claim that there is something inherently different between relying on one’s own earlier efforts and relying on someone else’s; replacing “S at time 1” with “T,” or vice versa, inherently changes the structure of the explanation of beliefs’ epistemic status.
Another argument against demands on testimonially-based beliefs is that, even if those demands might be able to be satisfied by those who are particularly careful in considering earlier cases of confirmation, it is improper to place too many intellectual demands on people’s everyday beliefs. Graham 2006:100 puts it this way: “[E]ven if the reduction is possible, requiring it is overly demanding; the requirement to reduce hyper-intellectualizes testimonial justification.” Young children, for instance, lack the intellectual capacity to consider complicated issues regarding the reliability of their parents or others who give them testimonially-based beliefs, and so it is improper to place epistemic demands on them.
Lackey 2005 defends a conservative approach to testimony against the infants-and-young-children objection by considering whether a similar problem could afflict any approach to testimonial-based justification that includes a non-defeater condition. No one suggests that testimonially-based justification is indefeasible; rather, S is only justified on the basis of T’s testimony if S lacks a defeater for her belief that p. For instance, if T tells S that p, but S already believes that q and if q then ~p, she cannot just add the belief that p, rendering her beliefs inconsistent. Defeaters can be standardly divided into doxastic, normative, and factual defeaters. Doxastic defeaters are like those in the case we just considered: other beliefs that S has that make it improper for her to believe p, or to accept testimony that p from T. Normative defeaters are other beliefs that S would have, if she performed her epistemic duties. Factual defeaters defeat S’s justification in virtue of being true. The standard example is the fake barn; if S just happens to see the one real barn amidst a countryside full of fakes, S’s belief about the barn is not justified, or at least does not count as knowledge. Similarly, if S just happens to meet T, the one reliable testifier in a sea of unreliable ones, then she has a factual defeater. Some epistemologists, though, are fake-barn-case skeptics, and think that these cases are not obviously cases where justification or knowledge fails.
Lackey’s argument is that if young children, or animals, are not capable of satisfying a positive-reasons demand on testimonially-based beliefs because they are not capable of appreciating reasons, then for the same reason they are likewise not capable of satisfying a no-defeater condition, either regarding normative or doxastic defeaters. Those who are not capable of understanding a reason for a belief presumably also cannot understand either a conflict in beliefs, as required by an appreciation of doxastic defeaters.
The liberal can resist Lackey’s argument in at least three ways. One way would be to deny that the existence of a no-defeaters condition requires a defeater-recognition capacity. It is true, this response would go, that young children must deal properly with any doxastic and normative defeaters in order to be justified, but young children simply lack such defeaters. Young children who lack the capacity to appreciate reasons or the resolution of conflicting claims lack the epistemic obligations presupposed by normative defeaters. They lack the ability to investigate for defeaters, but fortunately they also lack the duty to do so. This route, however, is unattractive to Lackey, because she thinks it quite clear that if young children are exposed to enough counterevidence for one of their beliefs, they become unjustified in holding that belief. The liberal might attempt to resist that intuition, however.
A second route for the liberal would be to retreat from the suggestion that children lack the capacity to appreciate reasons at all. Rather, he might insist that young children, while in principle capable of appreciating reasons or defeaters, have a particularly bad inductive base with respect to confirmed reports. It is not the cognitive incapacity of the child, but her evidentiary incapacity, that undermines the reasonableness of a demand for inductively-based reasons to believe T. All of the confirmed reports of a young child, for instance, are likely confined to a very small part of the world and to only a few testifiers. The leap to believe what his parents tell him about other subjects seems inductively very weak. This sort of response would dodge Lackey’s argument only by reconstruing the argument as a special form of the bad-inductive-base argument.
A third route for the liberal, taken in Goldberg 2008, would stress the role of reliable caretakers in shielding children from improper testimonially-based beliefs. While children themselves may not be able to appreciate the significance of defeating evidence, for instance, their parents can. Goldberg argues that the presence of such an external defeater-detection system is critical for testimonially-based knowledge in young children. Goldberg draws (at 29) the lesson he regards as radical: that “the factors in virtue of which a young child’s testimonial belief amounts to knowledge include information-processing that takes place in mind/brains other than that of the child herself.”
Moran 2005, Ross 1986, and Hinchman 2005 and 2007 argue that, because the testifier T has assumed responsibility for the truth of p, S’s responsibilities are necessarily lessened. In telling S that p, T is not offering S evidence that p, but instead asking S to trust him. Because the reception of testimony is inconsistent with S basing his belief on evidence, S’s responsibilities are necessarily lessened when he forms a testimonially-based belief. To trust T is to rely on his assurance, not to assume responsibility for the truth of p oneself. Hinchman 2007:3 summarizes the argument: “[H]ow could [T] presume to provide this warrant [for S’s belief that p]? One way you could provide it is by presenting yourself to A as a reliable gauge of the truth. … The proposal … simply leaves out the act of assurance. Assuring [S] that p isn’t merely asserting that p with the thought that you thereby give [S] evidence for p, since you’re such a reliable asserter (or believer). That formula omits the most basic respect in which you address people, converse with people—inviting them to believe you, not merely what you say.”
However, Goldberg 2006 argues that both reductionists and non-reductionists—both liberals and conservatives, in the terminology of this article—can subscribe to a buck-passing principle, very similar to the assumption-of-responsibility view. Even if T has assumed the responsibility for certain epistemic desiderata regarding p, S may have very demanding responsibilities of his own. For instance, S may have an epistemic duty to select those most worthy of buck-passing, much as a client has a duty to select a proper lawyer, even though the client does not know as much about the law as the lawyers he selects. On Green 2006’s suggestion that T is S’s epistemic agent or employee, it is consistent to say both (a) that T takes responsibilities for handling particular areas of S’s epistemic business, but (b) that S has responsibilities to select T properly—just as employees assume responsibility for particular functions of their employees, but employers still retain critical responsibilities to select employees well. Weiner 2003b has similarly argued that the view of testimony as an assurance does not contradict a requirement that S have evidence for his testimonially-based beliefs.
Some testimonial liberals contend that there is good a priori reason to believe that testimonially-based beliefs are justified. Coady 1992 argues, building on Donald Davidson’s views about radical interpretation, that we must presuppose the reliability of testifiers in order to interpret their utterances. If we were to encounter a group of Martians interacting with each other using bits of language in response to external stimuli, we could not interpret the Martians’ language unless we were to assume that the bits of language that correlate with particular external stimuli are bits of language that refer to those stimuli. Unless we assume that the language used by the Martians generally tracks the world in which they live, we could not begin to interpret their utterances. Hence testimony, in order to be interpreted, must be generally reliable.
Graham 2000c argues, however, that it is possible for testifiers to be generally unreliable, even though they interpret each others’ statements on the assumption that they are incorrect. He imagines (at 702ff.) a group of people who are both honest and good at interpreting each others’ utterances, but who because of perceptual failures, or failures in memory, have mostly false beliefs about the world outside their immediate perceptual environment. These people could interpret utterances fine, but would still be unreliable testifiers. (For a response to a similar argument from Davidson, see Plantinga 1993:80f.)
Burge 1993 argues that S is a priori entitled to accept T’s statement, because it is, on its face, intelligible and presented as true. He summarizes his argument (at 472–473):
We are a priori entitled to accept something that is prima facie intelligible and presented as true. For prima facie intelligible propositional contents prima facie presented as true bear an a priori prima facie conceptual relation to a rational source of true presentations-as-true: Intelligible propositional expressions presuppose rational abilities and entitlement; so intelligible presentations-as-true come prima facie backed by a rational source or resource of reason; and both the content of intelligible propositional presentations-as-true and the prima facie rationality of their source indicate a prima facie source of truth. Intelligible affirmation is the face of reason; reason is a guide to truth. We are a priori prima facie entitled to take intelligible affirmation at face value.
One response to Burge’s argument is to suggest that he seems to be skipping over the assumption that T’s rational faculties are functioning properly. It may be that if S sees a T statement and sees that it is intelligible, S may be entitled to think that it came from a process that is geared toward presenting true statements; part of what it is to understand that something is a piece of testimony is to see that it is malfunctioning if it turns out to be false, or to have been unreliably produced. But the critic can ask why, without more, we should be entitled to assume that this process has turned out well. Absent the assumption that T is in an environment conducive to proper function of T’s truth-seeking processes—an assumption that is false in many possible worlds—it would seem that S should not be entitled to rely on T’s word, simply from the fact that it is the presentation of a rational source.
Burge might respond that the worlds in which T’s truth-seeking faculties are not functioning properly are worlds that we may ignore, because they are not relevant alternatives (like, for instance, the brain-in-a-vat worlds that non-skeptics feel entitled to ignore). However, Burge’s argument does not depend on whether we are in a possible world where testifiers tend to be reliable. It would seem to work just as well in worlds where they are not. But it does not seem plausible that everyone in any possible world is entitled to believe that they are in worlds where testifiers are usually reliable.
Graham 2006 argues that TEST, his principle that T’s statement supplies pro tanto justification, is an a priori necessary conceptual truth, even though testifiers are not reliable in all possible worlds. Such a view of testimony fits with Graham’s general metaepistemological view that epistemic principles should be necessary a priori conceptual truths about the proper aim of our beliefs. However, Plantinga 1993:80 criticizes the suggestion that testimony is necessarily evidence. He argues, in accord with Reid’s statements about the provisions of “Nature,” that testimony only supplies evidence the contingent human design plan provides—in line with an environment in which testifiers generally speak the truth—that properly functioning human beings trust statements from others.
For S to come to know that p by relying on T’s testimony, S must satisfy whatever internal conditions there are for knowledge, but this is not enough. P must actually be true, of course, but T must also be properly connected to the fact that p; as Gettier 1963 teaches, there is also some sort of environmental condition on our testifier T in order for S to know. Several authors give a relatively simple answer to the environmental condition: T must, himself, know that p. Others give other similar conditions, such as someone knowing that p on a non-testimonial basis. Lackey 2003 gives an extensive list of such thinkers, whom we might call testimonial knowledge-preservationists. The discussion, like much of the post-Gettier literature, revolves around the discussion of counterexamples and principles intended to cover them.
If S’s testimonially-based knowledge that p requires T’s (or someone’s) knowledge that p, it would seem that testimony is “a second-class citizen of the epistemic republic,” as Plantinga 1993:87 puts it, because, unlike perception, testimony is not a source of knowledge for the epistemic community as a whole; it is only a way of spreading knowledge around that community. Much as a political libertarian might see government as a tool useful only for redistributing wealth, but not creating it, knowledge-preservationists might see testimony as a tool useful only for spreading knowledge, but not creating it.
In general, someone attracted to knowledge-preservationism—the thesis that S’s testimonially-based knowledge that p requires T to know that p—can resist counterexamples in three ways. First, he can deny that, as described, S really knows that p (the “Ignorant-S” response). Second, he can claim that T, as described, really does know that p (the “Knowing-T” response). Third, he can deny that S’s belief that p is really based on T’s testimony that p (the “Not-Testimony” response). More generally, where a different account of the testimonial environmental condition is at stake, and a counterexample claims to find an S who knows that p, but in which that environmental condition fails, the defender of the account has the same three options: deny that S knows, argue that the environmental condition is actually met, or deny that the case is the proper sort of testimonially-based belief. If none of the responses is available, of course, the counterexample is effective, and the environmental condition needs revision.
If knowledge by T is not the key environmental desideratum to S’s knowledge, what is? Several thinkers propose substituting a focus on information. Goldberg 2001:526 argues that his example should convince epistemologists of testimony to “widen our scope of interest from an exclusive focus on content-preserving cases of [testimonially-based] belief and knowledge to include all cases in which information is conveyed in a testimonially-based way from speaker to hearer.” The alternative account to the testimonial environmental desideratum, then, is that T possess information that p. (Goldberg’s 2005 counterexamples might, however, undermine even that account.) Graham 2000:365 takes a similar view, explaining it at length: “According to the model I prefer, knowledge is not transferred through communication, rather Information is conveyed.” Green 2006:47ff. follows Graham and suggests that positional warrant is the key environmental desideratum: information sufficient to support a belief that p, if a doxastic subject were present.
Lackey 1999 presents cases in which T does not know that p, because either T has personal doubts about p, or because T should have doubts about p, but in which T still reliably passes along the information that p to S. T’s defeaters are not necessarily transmitted to S.
Her first example is a biology teacher who does not believe her lesson about evolution, but passes it on reliably because the school board requires her to do so. Because the children reliably believe their lesson, Lackey says, they know it, despite the fact that their testifier does not. Both the Ignorant-S and Not-Testimony responses have some plausibility here. Audi 2006:29 suggests the Ignorant-S response: “If … [the students] simply take [the teacher’s] word, they are taking the word of someone who will deceive them when job retention requires it…. It is highly doubtful that this kind of testimonial origin would be an adequate basis of knowledge.” Schoolchildren who discovered that their teacher did not actually believe her own lesson would presumably be startled and unsettled. They perhaps relied on a premise like “My teacher knows the truth about this lesson,” and while it might be possible to get knowledge by reasoning on the basis of a falsehood, this is not obviously such a case. Teachers depend on their students viewing them as trustworthy sources of information. A teacher who refuses to believe her own lesson is like a host who refuses to eat the meal he serves a guest. “If the teacher doesn’t believe the lesson,” a student could reason, “why should I?” To attempt a Not-Testimony response—perhaps termed in this case a Not-Testimony-From-T response—we might recharacterize the case as testimony from the school board, rather than the teacher. A school teacher who tells students what she doesn’t believe isn’t really testifying, the suggestion might go; she is merely acting as a conduit for the real testifier, the school board, who does in fact know the lesson.
Lackey has defended her intuitions in the biology teacher case by suggesting that, even though T does not know or believe that p, it is still perfectly proper for her to assert that p, disputing the account of knowledge as the norm of assertion contained in Williamson 2000. Because the reliability of her lessons means that the teacher is behaving properly in telling her students that p, there is likewise nothing epistemically amiss in her students then believing that p on her say-so. A full discussion of whether knowledge is the norm of assertion, however, is not possible here.
Lackey’s second example is someone with matching misperceptions and pathological lies. For instance, whenever she sees a zebra, she thinks it is an elephant, but has a pathological urge to tell people that what she thinks are elephants are zebras, and so on. The Ignorant-S response seems possible; it is not at all obvious that relying on someone like that is a way to gain knowledge. Such a T seems close to insane, and even if someone who is insane happens to be a reliable speaker about what she has seen, S would have to know that in order to gain knowledge from her statements. A similar response seems possible for Lackey’s third and fourth examples, where T is gripped by skeptical worries or by the belief that her perceptual abilities are faulty. If T is really and seriously worried about whether she is a brain in a vat, or has radically unreliable powers of perception, such that we would conclude that she does not know everyday things about his environment, then it is hard to see how S could come to know those things by relying on his say-so. Lackey’s last example is someone who is presented with evidence that her powers of perception are radically unreliable, but who retains her perceptually-based beliefs anyway. In response, the knowledge-preservationist could argue that defeating evidence serious enough to make T’s belief that p improper would, it seems, be serious enough to make T’s testimony that p similarly improper, and likewise S’s reliance on that testimony. (For a defense of these suggested responses to Lackey’s examples, based on the idea that S takes T as his agent, and so an S who trusts a relevantly misbehaving T should be charged with T’s misbehavior, see Green 2006:137ff.)
Graham 2000a:379ff. promotes an example similar to Lackey’s misperceptions-and-pathological lies case. T has been raised in an environment where the word “blue” refers to the color red, “red” to blue, “green” to yellow, and “yellow” to green. Scientists aware of T’s malady install spectrum-reversing glasses on T, so that his testimony now comes out right. Unlike someone who looks at a zebra, thinks it is a giraffe, but has a pathological desire to call it a zebra, we might think such a T is sane. Still, there is some reason to think that the Ignorant-S response may work. If S were to learn that when T looks at the sky, it seems red to him, S would be very alarmed, and would not likely trust what T tells him about the colors of nearby objects. That fact suggests that S has a defeater for his belief based on T’s testimony now; it implicitly relies on the false premise that T is using words and perceiving colors normally. The fact that there are two large errors in S’s assumptions, albeit matching errors that cause T’s color reports to come out true, makes the status of S’s knowledge shaky.
Green 2006:27ff. argues that T can testify to S, and support knowledge, even if T entirely lacks phenomenology entirely, and so is a zombie, or a machine. For instance, we might receive a phone call from our credit card company noting suspicious behavior in our account, but it could be a computer-generated voice speaking to us. (In a possible world without phishing scams, we might also receive such a message through email.) If beliefs require conscious phenomenology, such testifiers would know nothing, and so would not know p. Possible cases of machine testimony might be phenomenologically indistinguishable from normal cases of testimonially-based beliefs. The Ignorant-S response, denying that such beliefs would be knowledge, seems clearly closed. We can surely get knowledge from a machine. The Knowing-T response, by affirming knowledge in T, would require knowledge without any phenomenal beliefs, which seems very implausible. The Not-Testimony response is the most promising route for the knowledge-preservationist: denying that beliefs based on the testimony of machines would really be “testimonially-based belief.” Machines that cannot know things likewise cannot perform speech acts, and testimony is a speech act.
In defense of his view that machine testimony really is testimony, Green (at 36ff.) relies on his intuition that if two beliefs (a) have the same epistemic status, (b) have the same contents, (c) are the result of the exercise of the same cognitive ability by S, and (d) have the same phenomenology for S, then the two beliefs should be regarded by the epistemologist as similarly based; we should regard either both, or neither, as testimonially-based. “Testimonially-based belief” is, on this view, an epistemic tool, and describing the full range of epistemic phenomena would be unnecessarily duplicative if we were required to use two different terms or concepts to cover such similar beliefs. Further, epistemic principles like those defended by Graham 2006:95 would cover zombies or machines. Graham includes broad conditions in TEST: “If a subject S (seemingly) comprehends a (seeming) presentation-as-true by a (seeming) speaker that [p] ….” Green at 41 also argues that beliefs that come from the linguistic output of machines need to be categorized in some way, and using a category other than “testimonially-based belief” seems to multiply epistemic categories beyond necessity. On the other hand, the intuition that testimony is a type of speech act, requiring that T be conscious, is very strong in some people. To the extent that such thinkers would retain “testimonially-based belief” as an epistemic concept, such thinkers would reach beyond epistemic status, content, cognitive ability, and phenomenology to determine that concept’s application.
Hawthorne 2004 and Stanley 2005’s interest-sensitive approaches to knowledge suggest another way in which S might know, but T would not. For instance, T’s life might depend on getting to the bank tomorrow—the mob wants its money, won’t take a check, and will kill him if it doesn’t get it by the Saturday deadline. By Hawthorne and Stanley’s lights, T might not know that the bank is open tomorrow, even if he has a fairly-clear recollection that banks in this town are open on Saturdays, because knowledge requires enough certainty to satisfy a particular subject’s needs. But S, who does not owe the mob any money, but who would like to have enough cash in his pocket to buy his kids an ice-cream cone in the park on Saturday afternoon, can make do with less certainty than can T. If T tells S that the bank is open tomorrow, then, assuming other factors work out, T could presumably pass along his between-ice-cream-cone-and-mob-repayment-level certainty to S. That amount of certainty would be enough for S to come to know, though it wasn’t enough for T. Put abstractly, T might properly tell S that p, aware knowing that, given S’s stakes, S only needs a relatively low amount of Grahamian pro tanto justification, or relatively Plantingian little warrant, in order for S to know, even though T himself might be in a much higher stakes situation, and so would not have enough justification to know that p. On this sort of view, T may assert that p if T has enough certainty for his audience’s needs, but which might not be enough for T’s own. (See Green 2006:142.)
Denying the Hawthorne-Stanley interest-sensitive view of knowledge is, of course, one easy way to resist this sort of counterexample. Another way to defend knowledge-preservationism against such an attack is to insist that asserter’s knowledge is the norm of assertion: T should only assert that p if he has enough certainty for T’s own needs. The idea might be that S, hearing T say that p, will assume that T has enough evidence for himself, and would normally be shocked and disturbed were he to learn that T thought that his evidence was insufficient for T’s own purposes, but passed along the statement that p anyway. Likewise, we might be attracted to the intuition that a low-stakes T, with enough certainty that p for his own purposes, should have every right to assert that p, no matter the audience (for instance, by asserting that p on the internet, where anyone might read it, including a high-stakes S).
Goldberg 2001 presents a case where T testifies falsely, but S still gains testimonially-based knowledge. T tells S that q: “T saw Jones wearing a pink shirt last night at the party.” But S knows that Jones was out of town last night, and so decides that T must have mistaken someone else for Jones. So S instead believes p: “T saw someone wearing a pink shirt last night at the party.”
The knowledge-preservationist might respond with a combination of the Knowing-T and Not-Testimony responses. T does, of course, also believe p, that he saw someone with a pink shirt. Did he tell S that? If so, then T told S that p, and spoke truly and knowingly. If, however, we regard T as not telling S that p, but only that q, it seems plausible to say that S actually inferred that p from T’s testimony that q (and in a manner unlike the way that conservatives, discussed above, argue that inference is involved in ordinary testimonially-based beliefs). So the knowledge-preservationist can argue that either T knew and testified that p, in which case the example has door-#2 problems, or else T didn’t tell S that p, in which case the example has door-#3 problems.
Green 2006:30 discusses an instance where T conceptualizes the object of belief differently than does S. T tells S that some object m is F, not knowing that object m is the same as object n. S knows that m is n and does not distinguish the two, and so believes that n is F. But T didn’t know that. For instance, Lois Lane knows that Superman is Clark Kent, but Jimmy Olsen does not. Jimmy tells Lois that Clark’s favorite ice cream flavor is chocolate, and Lois now knows Superman’s favorite ice cream flavor, which Jimmy did not. We might stipulate that Lois does not know that Jimmy distinguishes Clark and Superman; Jimmy tells her something about Clark, and Lois just assimilates that information into a single “Clark/Superman” file.
The knowledge-preservationist might argue, as in the reply to Goldberg’s case above, that S’s belief is either inferentially-based, or that T somehow did tell S that n is F. However, it seems plain that T, not knowing that n is m, or perhaps not knowing about n at all, could not know that n is F—Jimmy did not know that Clark was Superman, and he wasn’t talking about Superman. So the Knowing T response seems blocked. Could this case be seen as inferentially-based, rather than testimonially-based? Here, unlike in Goldberg’s case, S may not even be conscious that he is conceiving of the object differently than T. In the Jones-wasn’t-there case, though, S explicitly modifies T’s statement that p, because he knows why q is the more reasonable belief to form. Because differences between how T and S conceptualize the object of their beliefs may not be noticed, there is stronger ground for saying that the presence of such a difference would not prevent S’s beliefs from being testimonially-based. However, if S’s belief that m is F is receiving epistemic benefits from his background knowledge that n is m, then there may be some plausibility in saying that S’s belief is somehow based in part on that knowledge, even if it is non-inferential. Lois is utilizing, even unwittingly and unconsciously, her knowledge that Clark is Superman. (Cf. Heck 1995:99 (“[O]ne can not come to know things about George Orwell from assertions containing ‘Eric Blair.’”).
Goldberg 2005 presents a case where even unreliable testimony produces testimonially-based knowledge. T sees evidence that p which is usually misleading, but is luckily not misleading on this occasion—in Goldberg’s example, the evidence is an opaque carton of milk which A, an eccentric writer, usually replaces each morning with an empty carton, but A forgot this morning; p is “there is milk in the fridge.” T tells S that p, an observer of the testimony, A, is nearby, and would have corrected T’s testimony had it been incorrect. S’s belief is, Goldberg thinks, safe, because A’s presence would have prevented T’s false testimony from being believed, but T’s testimony itself is unsafe, because it is based on evidence that, in the circumstances, is usually misleading.
The Not-Testimony response is an option here. Even though S’s belief is formed in response to T telling him that p, an essential part of S’s belief-sustaining environment is A’s safety-guaranteeing presence. Goldberg (at 308) gives his defense of S’s knowledge by considering a case in which S knows about A’s role. It seems quite plausible that in that case, S is not relying solely on T, but on the T-in-A’s-presence hybrid. In the case where S does not know that A is guaranteeing the reliability of his belief that p, Goldberg still thinks that S knows that p—A’s guaranteeing function alone, and not S’s explicit reliance on that function, is enough. It might seem a bit odd to suggest that S’s belief is not testimonially-based, when S herself has no other conscious basis for her belief than the fact that T told her that p. However, if, unknown to S, S’s belief receives epistemic benefits because on A’s guaranteeing function, it also seems possible for S’s belief to be differently based because of A’s guaranteeing function. The actual reason why S has the belief she has is partly T, and partly A. If we understand the case this way, Goldberg’s case is a case where beliefs partly based on defective testimony can amount to knowledge, precisely because the other part of the basis of that belief cures the defect in the testimony.
Knowing T—the response that T herself knows that p, and in fact that her testimony is reliable—is also a possibility, if we pay close attention to T’s belief and testimony over time. Suppose T tells S that p at time t, and that it would take A at least time Δt to correct T’s testimony, had it in fact been false. If S believes T straightaway, then at time t, before A’s correction mechanism could have worked in any event, it does not seem right to say that S’s belief is safe. Only after A has had a chance to correct the testimony, but has not, would S’s belief amount to knowledge. S’s belief at time t+Δt may be knowledge, but not his belief at time t. But what about T? T’s belief that p is unreliable at time t, and so is his testimony that p, because it was based on evidence that is usually misleading. But at time t+Δt, T has as much right as S to rely on A’s failure to correct the testimony that p. So at time t+Δt, T also knows that p. We could say the very same thing about T’s testimony: it is unsafe and unreliable at time t, but at time t+Δt, it is itself safe and reliable—or at least as safe and reliable as S’s belief based upon it. In other words, T and S are ignorant, and T’s testimony unreliable, at time t, but T and S know that p, and T’s testimony is reliable, at time t+Δt.
Goldberg 2007:322ff. discusses a similar case in which S receives clues about T’s reliability in addition to T’s testimony itself. Due to wishful thinking, T always believes that the Yankees have won, and always says so. Sometimes, however, the Yankees do win, and T reads so in the newspaper. When T’s belief is based on wishful thinking, he displays tell-tale signs, such as failing to look S in the eye, which would lead S not to believe him. When T’s belief is based on genuine information that the Yankees won, these signs are absent, and S would believe him. As a result, Goldberg says that S’s belief in the Yankees-actually-won case is safe and should count as knowledge, even though T’s belief is not. The Not-Testimony response is again possible: S’s belief is based not on T’s testimony alone, but on the signs that would indicate unreliability.
Graham 2000b:371ff. discusses a similar case. T has trouble distinguishing two twins, A and B, but S does not. T tells S that A knocked over a vase, and S knows that B could not have done it. T’s testimony is unreliable, because T cannot tell A from B, and B might as easily have knocked over the vase. The Not-Testimony response is somewhat plausible here: S’s belief is not based simply on T’s testimony, but also on his knowledge that B did not knock over the vase. As with Goldberg’s case, S may not be aware of the fact that T is unreliable, and so may not be aware of the contribution of S’s additional knowledge about B in sustaining S’s belief about A knocking over the vase. But also as in Goldberg’s case, there is some reason to think that if an additional source provides epistemic benefits to S’s belief, it can also make a difference in the basis for S’s belief, albeit a difference of which S may be unaware.
As noted above, the S-side and T-side questions are far from an exhaustive map of the important issues in the epistemology of testimony. This section does not give a full map of other issues, but notes two particularly prominent ones.
One interesting issue is the extent to which the two main issues discussed above are related. Some philosophers connect their views on the internal and external questions, but they do so in both directions. For instance, Fricker 2006b:603 argues that knowledge-preservationism regarding testimonial knowledge fits best with a relatively demanding approach to testimonial justification in which S has a second-order belief about T’s knowledge:
When the hearer [S] … believes [T] because she takes his speech at face value, as an expression of knowledge, then … [S]’s belief in what she is told is grounded in her belief that T knows what he asserted. … Several writers have endorsed the principle that a recipient of testimony can come to know what is testified to only if the testifier knows whereof she speaks. In my account this fact is … derived from a description of the speech act of telling….
On the other hand, Dummett 1994:264 suggests that knowledge-preservationism fits best with a less demanding approach, because it suggests a strong analogy with memory:
In the case of testimony … if the concept of knowledge is to be of any use at all, and if we are to be held to know anything resembling the body of truths we normally take ourselves to know, the non-inferential character of our acceptance of what others tell us must be acknowledged as an epistemological principle, rather than a mere psychological phenomenon. Testimony should not be regarded as a source, and still less as a ground, for knowledge: it is the transmission from one individual to another of knowledge acquired by whatever means.
Among thinkers who have considered both issues in detail, all four possible sorts of view are represented.
|Conditions on Testifier for Testimonially-Based Knowledge
|Relatively more demanding (Knowledge-Preservationism)||Relatively less demanding (Anti-Knowledge-Preservationism)|
|Conditions on Recipient for Testimonially-Based Justification (S-side issues)||Relatively more demanding (Reductionism)||Audi
|Relatively less demanding (Anti-Reductionism)||Burge
An extensive literature exists on the general nature of the epistemic relationship between the testifier T and our epistemic subject S. For instance, Reid 1785 says that testimony is distinguished by S relying on T’s authority for the proposition that p. Goldberg 2006 says that forming a testimonially-based belief allows S (in the right conditions) to “pass the epistemic buck” to T. Moran 2006, Watson 2004, Hinchman 2007, Ross 1986, Fried 1978, and Austin 1946 all promote variants of the view that in testifying, T is offering an assurance to S that p is true, akin to a promise. Schmitt 2006 says that testimonially-based beliefs involve “transindividual reasons,” such that T’s initial reasons are transferred to S, though S may not comprehend what they are. (Related to Schmitt’s view on this issue is the large question, unfortunately beyond the scope of this article at this time, of whether testimony requires an irreducibly social account of epistemology. For an introduction to some of these issues, see the articles in Schmitt 1994.) Green 2006 says that testimonial relationships are a form of epistemic agency, such that T’s actions on S’s behalf should be considered the action of S’s agent, and so subject to the legal maxim qui facit per alium, facit per se (he who acts through another acts himself).
One issue is whether these views really compete with one another. These characterizations might conceivably all be true: in testifying, T might be giving an assurance, thereby offering to serve as an epistemic agent, thereby transferring his reasons to S, and allowing S to rely on T’s authority and pass the epistemic buck to him.
Related to the general characterization of the testimonial link between T and S is what counts as “testimony.” For instance, Graham 1997 defends a relatively broad characterization of testimony. He argues that T testifies if his statement that p is offered as evidence that p. He criticizes Coady 1992, who holds that T testifies only if he actually has the relevant competence and T’s statement that p is directed to those in need of evidence, for whom p is relevant to some disputed or unresolved question. Lackey 2006b defends a hybrid view of testimony, distinguishing “hearer testimony” from “speaker testimony.” The former takes place if the latter takes place if T reasonably intends to convey the information that p in virtue of the communicable content of an act of communication, while the latter takes place if S reasonably takes T’s act of communication as conveying the information that p in virtue of the communicable content of an act of communication.
Christopher R. Green
University of Mississippi
Last updated: October 31, 2008 | Originally published: October/31/2008
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/ep-testi/
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