Epistemic Justification

We often believe what we are told by our parents, friends, doctors, and news reporters. We often believe what we see, taste, and smell. We hold beliefs about the past, the present, and the future. Do we have a right to hold any of these beliefs? Are any supported by evidence? Should we continue to hold them, or should we discard some? These questions are evaluative. They ask whether our beliefs meet a standard that renders them fitting, right, or reasonable for us to hold. One prominent standard is epistemic justification.

Very generally, justification is the right standing of an action, person, or attitude with respect to some standard of evaluation. For example, a person’s actions might be justified under the law, or a person might be justified before God.

Epistemic justification (from episteme, the Greek word for knowledge) is the right standing of a person’s beliefs with respect to knowledge, though there is some disagreement about what that means precisely. Some argue that right standing refers to whether the beliefs are more likely to be true. Others argue that it refers to whether they are more likely to be knowledge. Still others argue that it refers to whether those beliefs were formed or are held in a responsible or virtuous manner.

Because of its evaluative role, justification is often used synonymously with rationality. There are, however, many types of rationality, some of which are not about a belief’s epistemic status and some of which are not about beliefs at all. So, while it is intuitive to say a justified belief is a rational belief, it is also intuitive to say that a person is rational for holding a justified belief. This article focuses on theories of epistemic justification and sets aside their relationship to rationality.

In addition to being an evaluative concept, many philosophers hold that justification is normative. Having justified beliefs is better, in some sense, than having unjustified beliefs, and determining whether a belief is justified tells us whether we should, should not, or may believe a proposition. But this normative role is controversial, and some philosophers have rejected it for a more naturalistic, or science-based, role. Naturalistic theories focus less on belief-forming decisions—decisions from a subject’s own perspective—and more on describing, from an objective point of view, the relationship between belief-forming mechanisms and reality.

Regardless of whether justification refers to right belief or responsible belief, or whether it plays a normative or naturalistic role, it is still predominantly regarded as essential for knowledge. This article introduces some of the questions that motivate theories of epistemic justification, explains the goals that a successful theory must accomplish, and surveys the most widely discussed versions of these theories.

Table of Contents

  1. Starting Points
    1. The Dilemma of Inferential Justification
    2. Explaining How Beliefs are Justified
    3. Explaining the Role of Justification
    4. Explaining Why Justification is Valuable
    5. Justification and Knowledge
  2. Internalist Foundationalism
    1. Basic Beliefs
    2. Arguments For and Against Foundationalism
  3. Internalist Coherentism
    1. Varieties of Coherence
    2. Objections to Coherentism
  4. Infinitism
    1. Arguments for Infinitism
    2. Objections to Qualified Infinitism
  5. Types of Internalism and Objections
    1. Accessibilism and Mentalism
    2. Objections to Internalism
  6. The Gettier Era
    1. The History of the Gettier Problem
    2. Responses to the Gettier Problem
  7. Externalist Foundationalism
    1. Externalism, Foundationalism, and the DIJ
    2. Reliabilism
    3. Objections to Externalism
  8. Justification as Virtue
    1. Virtue Reliabilism
    2. Virtue Responsibilism
    3. Objections to Virtue Epistemology
  9. The Value of Justification
    1. The Truth Goal
    2. Alternatives to the Truth Goal
    3. Objections to the Polyvalent View
    4. Rejections of the Truth Goal
  10. Conclusion
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Starting Points

Consider your simplest, most obvious beliefs: the color of the sky, the date of your birth, what chocolate tastes like. Are these beliefs justified for you? What would explain the rightness or fittingness of these beliefs? One prominent account of justification is that a belief is justified for a person only if she has a good reason for holding it. If you were to ask me why I believe the sky is blue and I were to answer that I am just guessing or that my horoscope told me, you would likely not consider either a good reason. In either case, I am not justified in believing the sky is blue, even if it really is blue. However, if I were to say, instead, that I remember seeing the sky as blue or that I am currently seeing that it is blue, you would likely think better of my reason. So, having good reasons is a very natural explanation of how our beliefs are justified.

Further, the possibility that my belief that the sky is blue is not justified, even if it is true that the sky is blue, suggests that justification is more than simply having a true belief. All of my beliefs may be true, but if I obtained them accidentally or by faulty reasoning, then they are not justified for me; if I am seeking knowledge, I have no right to hold them. Further still, true belief may not even be necessary for justification. If I understand Newtonian physics, and if Newton’s arguments seem right to me, and if all contemporary physicists testify that Newtonian physics is true, it is plausible to think that my belief that it is true is justified, even if Einstein will eventually show that Newton and I are wrong. We can imagine this was the situation of many physicists in the late 1700s. If this is right, justification is fallible—it is possible to be justified in believing false propositions. Though some philosophers have, in the past, rejected fallibilism about justification, it is now widely accepted. Having good reasons, it turns out, does not guarantee having true beliefs.

But the idea that justification is a matter of having good reasons faces a serious obstacle. Normally, when we give reasons for a belief, we cite other beliefs. Take, for example, the proposition, “The cat is on the mat.” If you believe it and are asked why, you might offer the following beliefs to support it:

1. I see that the cat is on the mat.

2. Seeing that X implies that X.

Together, these seem to constitute a good reason for believing the proposition:

3. The cat is on the mat.

But does this mean that proposition 3 is epistemically justified for you? Even if the combination of propositions 1 and 2 counts as a good reason to believe 3, proposition 3 is not justified unless both 1 and 2 are also justified. Do we have good reasons for believing 1 and 2? If not, then according to the good reasons account of justification, propositions 1 and 2 are unjustified, which means that 3 is unjustified. If we do have good reasons for believing 1 and 2, do we have good reasons for believing those propositions? How long does our chain of good reasons have to be before even one belief is justified? These questions lead to a classic dilemma.

a. The Dilemma of Inferential Justification

For simplicity, let’s focus on proposition 1: I see that the cat is on the mat.

Horn A: If there are no good reasons to believe proposition 1, then proposition 1 is unjustified, which means 3 is unjustified.

Horn B: If there is a good reason to believe proposition 1, say proposition 1a, then either 1a is unjustified or we need another belief, proposition 1b, to justify 1a. If this process continues infinitely, then 1 is ultimately unjustified, and, therefore, 3 is unjustified.

Either way, proposition 3 is unjustified.

Horn A of the dilemma is the problem of skepticism about justification. If our most obvious beliefs are unjustified, then no belief derived from them is justified; and if no belief is justified, we are left with an extreme form of skepticism. Horn B of the dilemma is called the regress problem. If every reason we offer requires a reason that also requires a reason, and so on, infinitely, then no belief is ultimately justified.

Both of these problems assume that all justification involves inferring beliefs from one or more other beliefs, so let’s call these two problems the dilemma of inferential justification (DIJ). And let’s call the assumption that all justification involves inference from other beliefs the inferential assumption (also called the doxastic assumption, Pollock 1986: 19).

Responses to this dilemma typically take one of two forms. On one hand, we might embrace Horn A, which is, in effect, to adopt skepticism and eschew any further attempts to justify our beliefs. This is the classic route of the Pyrrhonian skeptics, such as Sextus Empiricus, and some later Academic skeptics, such as Arcesilaus. (For more on these views, see Ancient Greek Skepticism.)

On the other hand, we might offer an explanation of how beliefs can be justified in spite of the dilemma. In other words, we might offer an account of epistemic justification that resolves the dilemma, either by constructing a third, less problematic option or by showing that Horn B is not as troublesome as philosophers have traditionally supposed. This non-skeptical route is the majority position and the focus of the remainder of this article.

Philosophers tend to agree that any adequate account of epistemic justification—that is, an account that resolves the dilemma—must do at least three things: (1) explain how a belief comes to be justified for a person, (2) explain what role justification plays in our belief systems, and (3) explain what makes justification valuable in a way that is not merely practically or aesthetically valuable.

b. Explaining How Beliefs are Justified

One of the central aims of theories of epistemic justification is to explain how a person’s beliefs come to be justified in a way that resolves the DIJ. Those who accept the inferential assumption argue either that a belief is justified if it coheres with—that is, stands in mutual support with—the whole set of a person’s beliefs (coherentism) or that an infinite chain of sequentially supported beliefs is not as problematic as philosophers have claimed (infinitism).

Among those who reject the inferential assumption, some argue that justification is grounded in special beliefs, called basic beliefs, that are either obviously true or supported by non-belief states, such as perceptions (foundationalism). Others who reject the inferential assumption argue that justification is either a function of the quality of the mechanisms by which beliefs are formed (externalism) or at least partly a function of certain qualities or virtues of the believer (virtue epistemology).

In addition to resolving the DIJ, theories of justification must explain what it is about forming or holding a belief that justifies it in order to explain how a belief is justified. Some argue that justification is a matter of a person’s mental states: a belief is justified only if a person has conscious access to beliefs and evidence that support it (internalism). Others argue that justification is a matter of a belief’s origin or the mechanisms that produce it: a belief is justified only if it was formed in a way that makes the belief likely to be true (externalism), whether through an appropriate connection with the state of affairs the belief is about or through reliable processes. The former view is called internalism because the justifying reasons—whether beliefs, experiences, testimony, and so forth—are internal mental states, that is, states consciously available to a person. The latter view is called externalism because the justifying states are outside a person’s immediate mental access; they are relationships between a person’s belief states and the states of the world outside the believer’s mental states (see Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology).

c. Explaining the Role of Justification

A second central aim of epistemology is to identify and explain the role that justification plays in our belief-forming behavior. Some argue that justification is required for the practical work of having responsible beliefs. Having certain reasons makes it possible for us to choose well which beliefs to form and hold and which to reject. This is called the guidance model of justification. Some philosophers who accept the guidance model, like René Descartes and W. K. Clifford, pair it with a strongly normative role according to which justification is a matter of fulfilling epistemic obligations. This combination is sometimes called the guidance-deontological model of justification, where “deontology” refers to one’s duties with respect to believing. Other epistemologists reject the guidance and guidance-deontological models for more descriptive models. Justification, according to these philosophers, is simply a feature of our psychology, and though our minds form beliefs more effectively under some circumstances than others, the conditions necessary for forming justified beliefs are outside of our access and control. This objective, naturalistic model of justification has it that our understanding of justification should be informed, in large part, by psychology and cognitive science.

d. Explaining Why Justification is Valuable

A third central aim of theories of justification is to explain why justification is epistemically valuable. Some epistemologists argue that justification is crucial for avoiding error and increasing our store of knowledge. Others argue that knowledge is more complicated than attaining true beliefs in the right way and that part of the value of knowledge is that it makes the knower better off. These philosophers are less interested in the truth-goal in its unqualified sense; they are more interested in intellectual virtues that position a person to be a proficient knower, virtues such as intellectual courage and honesty, openness to new evidence, creativity, and humility. Though justification increases the likelihood of knowledge under some circumstances, we may rarely be in those circumstances or may be unable to recognize when we are; nevertheless, these philosophers suggest, there is a fitting way of believing regardless of whether we are in those circumstances.

A minority of epistemologists reject any connection between justification and knowledge or virtue. Instead, they focus either on whether a belief fits into an objective theory about the world or whether a belief is useful for attaining our many and diverse cognitive goals. An example of the former involves focusing solely on the causal relationship between a person’s beliefs and the world; if knowledge is produced directly by the world, the concept of justification drops out (for example, Alvin Goldman, 1967). Other philosophers, whom we might call relativists and pragmatists, argue that epistemic value is best explained in terms of what most concerns us in practice.

Debates surrounding these three primary aims inspire many others. There are questions about the sources of justification: Is all evidence experiential, or is some non-experiential? Are memory and testimony reliable sources of evidence? And there are additional questions about how justification is established and overturned: How strong does a reason have to be before a belief is justified? What sort of contrary, or defeating, reasons can overturn a belief’s justification? In what follows, we look at the strengths and weaknesses of prominent theories of justification in light of the three aims just outlined, leaving these secondary questions to more detailed studies.

e. Justification and Knowledge

The type of knowledge primarily at issue in discussions of justification is knowledge that a proposition is true, or propositional knowledge. Propositional knowledge stands in contrast with knowledge of how to do something, or practical knowledge. (For more on this distinction, see Knowledge.) Traditionally, three conditions must be met in order for a person to know a proposition—say, “The cat is on the mat.”

First, the proposition must be true; there must actually be a state of affairs expressed by the proposition in order for the proposition to be known. Second, that person must believe the proposition, that is, she must mentally assent to its truth. And third, her belief that the proposition is true must be justified for her. Knowledge, according to this traditional account, is justified true belief (JTB). And though philosophers still largely accept that justification is necessary for knowledge, it turns out to be difficult to explain precisely how justification contributes to knowing.

Historically, philosophers regarded the relationship between justification and knowledge as strong. In Plato’s Meno, Socrates suggests that justification “tethers” true belief “with chains of reasons why” (97A-98A, trans. Holbo and Waring, 2002). This idea of tethering came to mean that justification—when one is genuinely justified—guarantees or significantly increases the likelihood that a belief is true, and, therefore, we can tell directly when we know a proposition. But a series of articles in the 1960s and 1970s demonstrated that this strong view is mistaken; justification, even for true beliefs, can be a matter of luck. For example, imagine the following three things are truth: (1) it is three o’clock, (2) the normally reliable clock on the wall reads three o’clock, and (3) you believe it is three o’clock because the clock on the wall says so. But if the clock is broken, even though you are justified in believing it is three o’clock, you are not justified in a way that constitutes knowledge. You got lucky; you looked at the clock at precisely the time it corresponded with reality, but its correspondence was not due to the clock’s reliability. Therefore, your justified true belief seems not to be an instance of knowledge. This sort of example is characteristic of what I call the Gettier Era (§6). During the Gettier Era, philosophers were pressed to revise or reject the traditional relationship.

In response, some have maintained that the relationship between justification and knowledge is strong, but they modify the concept justification in attempt to avoid lucky true beliefs. Others argue that the relationship is weaker than traditionally supposed—something is needed to increase the likelihood that a belief is knowledge, and justification is part of that, but justification is primarily about responsible belief. Still others argue that whether we can tell we are justified is irrelevant; justification is a truth-conducive relationship between our beliefs and the world, and we need not be able to tell, at least not directly, whether we are justified. The Gettier Era (§6) precipitated a number of changes in the conversation about justification’s relationship to knowledge, and these remain important to contemporary discussions of justification. But before we consider these developments, we address the DIJ.

2. Internalist Foundationalism

One way of resolving the DIJ is to reject the inferential assumption, that is, to reject the claim that all justification involves inference from other beliefs. The most prominent way of doing this while avoiding skepticism is to show that all chains of good inference culminate at a unique kind of belief called a basic belief. Basic beliefs are beliefs that need not be inferred from any other beliefs in order to be justified. This approach to resolving the dilemma is called foundationalism because basic beliefs serve as a foundation on which all other justified beliefs are supported; a person’s beliefs are related to one another like the parts of a building: beliefs justified by inference are analogous to the roof and walls, which are in turn supported by foundational basic beliefs (see Figure 1).

Foundationalism comprises a family of views, all of which claim, at minimum, that all justified beliefs are either basic or inferred from other justified beliefs. Classically, foundationalists combine this view with the claims that we can know whether a belief is justified—that is, whether it stands in an evidential chain that starts with a basic belief—and the claim that knowing whether we are justified helps us fulfill our epistemic duties—in other words, we do well when we form or keep beliefs that are well supported and discard or refuse beliefs that are not; we do poorly when we do not.

The view that justification is a matter of having certain internal mental states is called internalism, and the family of views that include both is called internalist foundationalism. There is a further debate among internalists as to whether justification requires simply having certain mental states (propositional justification) or whether justified beliefs must be based on those mental states (doxastic justification). Philosophers who reject internalism are called externalists (see §7 of this article). Another debate among internalists is whether justification helps us to fulfill epistemic duties—that is, it tells us which beliefs are epistemically permissible, obligatory, or impermissible (the deontological conception of justification)—or whether it is simply a descriptive fact about our belief systems. (For an example of the latter, see Conee and Feldman 2004).

figure 1

Figure 1: Simple Foundationalist Justification. The dots represent beliefs; the arrowsrepresent inferential relations.

a. Basic Beliefs

It is one thing to say basic beliefs resolve the DIJ and quite another thing to explain how they do. René Descartes famously argued that some beliefs are basic because they are indubitable. If a belief is genuinely indubitable, Descartes argued, it cannot be false. As it is commonly understood, dubitability is a psychological, not epistemic, matter. It might be indubitable for me that my mother loves me, even if it is not true and even if it is the sort of belief that could be doubted, even perhaps by me. But Descartes used “indubitable” to describe a belief that is clear and distinct, which is supposed to guarantee that the belief is true. (See Harry Frankfurt, 1973 for a fuller discussion of clarity and distinctness.) Other foundationalists have explained how some beliefs might stop the regress in virtue of self-evidence, or their privileged role in our belief-forming systems, or their incorrigibility.

Long before Descartes, simple mathematical propositions, such as 2 + 2 = 4, and logical propositions, such as “no one is taller than herself,” were thought to be so obvious that they could not be false. These propositions, many claimed, are self-evidently true, that is, they need no supporting evidence because any attempt to support them would be weaker than their intuitive truth. Some philosophers include perceptual experiences among self-evident beliefs, experiences such as seeing red and hearing a ringing sound. Even if you misperceive a color or a sound, or misperceive what seems to be colored or what seems to be ringing, you cannot doubt that you are having the experience of seeing redness or hearing ringing.

Another explanation for why some beliefs are basic is that they play a privileged role in our belief-forming systems. A common example of beliefs privileged in this way are those formed on the basis of sensory perception: seeing a red ball, touching what feels like a rough surface, hearing a bell. You could be hallucinating these experiences, so it is not self-evident that there is a ball, bell, or surface to experience. Nevertheless, the world impresses itself on you in this way, and it would be difficult to imagine functioning without any sense perceptions whatsoever; they play a highly privileged role in our belief systems and, therefore, can justify other beliefs (hence the emphasis that scientists have traditionally placed on observation).

Further candidates for basicality are beliefs that are true in virtue of being believed, that is, if you believe them, they are true. For example, propositions about intentional states (in other words, states about a mental state, such as hoping, doubting, thinking, believing, and so forth), logically imply the existence of the subject who is in the state. So, for anyone who, while thinking, believes the proposition “I think” can logically infer “I exist.” Beliefs that if held are true are called incorrigible. Other examples may include beliefs about introspective states such as what you believe or feel or remember. If incorrigible beliefs can be recognized as true without appeal to any other beliefs, they are good candidates for justifying other, non-basic beliefs.

Unfortunately, it is not easy to see how all of our many and various non-basic justified beliefs can be inferred from this relatively small set of basic beliefs, even if we accepted every type of basic belief just mentioned. For example, imagine you have been looking for your laptop computer. When you find it, you form the belief, “There’s my laptop.” Did seeing your computer elicit the basic belief, “I seem to be perceiving a laptop there,” from which you then inferred the belief “There’s my laptop”? Not obviously. Seeing the laptop allowed you directly—without any reasoning at all—to form the belief that you found your laptop.

Examples like these have motivated some foundationalists to expand their accounts of basic beliefs to include a wider variety of experiences. These weaker accounts allow that there are many types of non-inferentially justified beliefs, all of which are at least properly basic, where “properly basic” means a belief that is either basic in the classic sense or that meets some other condition that makes it non-inferentially justified for a person. As long as there are a sufficient number of properly basic beliefs, these philosophers argue, a certain sort of foundationalism remains plausible.

One example of how proper basicality might work is Alvin Plantinga’s (1983; 1993a) argument for the rationality of religious belief. Plantinga’s notion of proper basicality is supposed to be weak enough to avoid problems with classic basic beliefs but strong enough to avoid the DIJ. According to him, if a belief is properly basic for a person, it is rational for that person to accept it without appealing to other reasons. He uses rational instead of justified to distance himself from classical problems. (Sometimes Plantinga puts it even more weakly, such that, if a belief is properly basic for a person, that person is not irrational in holding it.) As an example, Plantinga argues that if a person is raised in a religious community where the central religious claims he hears are corroborated by the community and none of those claims is undermined by contrary experience or argument, he is not violating any epistemic duty in believing that, say, God exists. His experiences and circumstances can “call forth belief in God” in a way that does not require other beliefs and can serve as a reason to accept other beliefs (1983: 81). This is a controversial view, not least because it either changes the discussion from justification to rationality or conflates justification and rationality. Nevertheless, basic beliefs are controversial no matter how they are characterized, and Plantinga’s proper basicality is just one among several. For another attempt to defend classical foundationalism against objections, see Timothy McGrew (1995).

b. Arguments For and Against Foundationalism

Foundationalism has remained competitive in the history of justification largely because of its intuitive advantages over competing views. The most common argument for foundationalism is the positive argument that it explains how we actually form beliefs on the basis of evidence. I believe the sky is blue because I see that it is blue, not because I infer it from other beliefs about the sky. Roderick Chisholm offers a sophisticated version of this argument, concluding that “[t]hinking and believing provide us with paradigm cases of the directly evident” (1966: 28). In addition to this positive argument, foundationalists offer the negative argument that no alternative account—skepticism, coherentism, or infinitism—has the resources to satisfactorily resolve the DIJ, that is, to avoid both skepticism and an infinite regress (see BonJour and Sosa 2003). This is, perhaps, the more powerful of the arguments and merits some attention.

Skepticism motivated epistemologists to inquire into justification in the first place, so the skeptical option is generally considered a loss. As an alternative, coherentists (§3) maintain that a person’s beliefs are justified in virtue of their relationship to the person’s belief set (see Lehrer 1974). If a belief stands or can stand in a consistent, mutually supportive relationship with other beliefs—a “web of belief,” as W. V. O. Quine (1970) calls it—that belief is justified. However, there is reason to believe that, since all beliefs stand in mutually supportive relationships, at least some beliefs (perhaps all) will play an indispensable role in their own support, rendering any coherentist argument viciously circular. Since circular arguments are fallacious, if coherentism entails that justification is circular, coherentism cannot resolve the DIJ.

A more recent alternative to skepticism is infinitism (see §4), according to which all justified beliefs stand in infinite chains of inferential relations (see Klein 2005). Skepticism is avoided because every belief is justified by some other belief. Unfortunately, infinitism requires that we accept one of two questionable assumptions: either that there simply is an infinite number of justifying beliefs available (and to which our minds, in virtue of being finite, do not have access) or that there is some algorithm that, for any belief, B, can direct us to a non-circular justifying belief for B. The problem with the former assumption is that it seems to depend on faith that there is an infinite series of justifiers, which is not obviously better than having no justification at all. And the problem with the latter is that it comes dangerously close to foundationalism, where the algorithm functions as a basic belief. If the infinitist cannot refute these objections, it cannot resolve the DIJ.

These are simple concerns about coherentism and infinitism, and we consider more sophisticated objections in sections 3 and 4. But, if neither coherentism nor infinitism can provide an alternative means of resolving the original dilemma, foundationalism may be the most promising alternative to skepticism. Unfortunately for foundationalists, even if they are right that some account of basic belief would adequately resolve the dilemma of inferential justification, it is not clear that such an account is currently available. Further, there are at least two other serious objections to foundationalism.

First, there is some concern that foundationalism cannot be justified by its own account of justification, that is, foundationalism is self-defeating. Alvin Plantinga (1993b) offers a version of this objection. According to foundationalists, a belief is justified if and only if it is either basic or inferred from other justified beliefs. This criterion, though, is not itself basic on any classical conception of basic beliefs (indubitability, self-evidence, evident to the senses, or incorrigibility), and it is not clear how it could be supported by other justified beliefs.

One straightforward response to this objection is that the arguments above (the positive argument and the negative argument by elimination), do provide, contra Plantinga, inferential support for foundationalism. In fact, Plantinga (1983; 1993) expands his own notion of proper basicality precisely to avoid the self-defeat objection. Further, if sophisticated reasoning strategies like induction could be justified on foundationalist grounds, then foundationalism itself may be justified on such grounds. For example, Laurence BonJour (1998) defends rational insight as a basic source of evidence and then argues that induction is justified by rational insight. If foundationalism is roughly correct and there are arguments grounded in rational insight that justify foundationalism, foundationalism might be vindicated. Of course, there remain concerns about the circularity of such arguments.

Other philosophers use an inference to the best explanation to defend a type of basic evidence, though these views may rightly be regarded as hybrids of foundationalism and coherentism. For example, Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (2008) argue that “[p]erceptual experiences can contribute toward the justification of propositions about the world when the propositions are part of the best explanation of those experiences that is available to the person.” The idea that what have been called basic beliefs are connected with the world and how we are positioned in the world is a better explanation of why we have the evidence we have than traditional accounts of justification. Catherine Z. Elgin (2005) offers a similar account, arguing that, while perceptions have “initial tenability” given their privileged role in our belief formation, they do not obtain this tenability in isolation from our whole evidential context; over time, certain perceptual beliefs have proved themselves to have the plausibility that allows us to privilege them.

A second objection to foundationalism is the meta-justification argument. The idea is that basic beliefs cannot resolve the DIJ because, even if their justification does not depend on other beliefs, it does depend on reasons which themselves require reasons. If I believe a proposition because it is indubitable, then I must have some reason for thinking that indubitable beliefs are likely to be true. If I do not, I am stuck with Horn A, and if I do, I am stuck with Horn B. To demonstrate this problem, Peter Klein (2005) asks us to imagine an argument between Fred and Doris, where Fred has come to what he regards as the basic belief on which his argument depends; call it b.

According to Fred, b has autonomous justification, that is, is a type of basic belief. Doris happens to agree that b is autonomously justified but asks whether beliefs with autonomous warrant are likely to be true. As a foundationalist, the most plausible option for Fred is the following: “He can hold that autonomously warranted propositions are somewhat likely to be true in virtue of the fact that they are autonomously warranted” (2005: 133).

If Fred is right, however, b only works as a justification for the rest of his argument precisely because he has added something to b. What has he added? Namely, that he “has a very good reason for believing b, namely b has F and propositions with F are likely to be true.” These are propositions independent of b that serve to justify b. Klein continues: “Of course Fred, now, could be asked to produce his reasons for thinking that b has F and that basic propositions are somewhat likely to be true in virtue of possessing feature F” (2005: 134). If this is right, basic beliefs do not stop the regress of reasons (see also Smithies 2014).

One response to this criticism comes from Laurence BonJour, who argues that it is plausible to think that understanding b includes a sort of built-in awareness of the content of those additional premises Klein mentions, such that understanding b constitutes, in and of itself, a reason to hold b (BonJour and Sosa 2003: 60-68). If it is possible to have an evidential state that includes, non-inferentially, all the content necessary for having a reason to believe a proposition is true, foundationalists may be able to describe a basic belief that stops the regress and avoids skepticism. But explaining just what this state is remains a point of controversy.

Another response is to construct an inference to the best explanation, as mentioned above in response to the self-defeat objection (Elgin, 2005; Conee and Feldman, 2008). The result, again, is typically a hybrid view, which may be equivalent to giving up foundationalism. Conee and Feldman say their view is closer to a “non-traditional version of coherentism” (2008: 98). And Elgin calls her view “a very weak foundationalism or…a coherence theory” (2005: 166). This raises questions about the merits of coherentism, to which we now turn.

3. Internalist Coherentism

Like foundationalists, coherentists attempt to avoid skepticism while rejecting infinitism. But they find a further problem with foundationalism. Every sensory state (seeing red, smelling cinnamon, and so forth) must be understood in a mental context, that is, one must have a set of background experiences, beliefs, and vocabulary sufficiently large for forming and understanding beliefs. All sensory beliefs, such as “I see red” and “I smell cinnamon,” require an immensely complex set of assumptions about self-reference, seeing, colors, smelling, and scents. This means that individual beliefs are not isolated bits of information that act as bricks in a building; they are nodes of information that depend for their meaning and support on a web of relationships with other beliefs.

Many coherentists accept the inferential assumption and argue that the result is not an infinite regress of inferences, but a non-linear system of support from which justification emerges as a property of the combination of inferences. As Donald Davidson puts it, “[N]othing can count as a reason for holding a belief except another belief” (2000: 156). Other coherentists reject the inferential assumption and argue that the result is a non-linear system of support from which justification emerges as a property of the set as a whole. Keith Lehrer explains: “This does not make the belief self-justified, however, even though it might be non-inferential. The belief is not justified independently of relations to other beliefs. It is justified because of the way it coheres with other beliefs belonging to a system of beliefs” (1990: 89). As we see below (§3.b), some coherentists reject the belief requirement of the inferential assumption, arguing that perceptual experiences can play a justifying role in the set of mental states that includes a person’s beliefs.

Regardless of whether coherentists accept the inferential assumption, they can allow that some beliefs are non-inferentially generated—for example, by experiences, intuitions, hunches, and so forth. But they are committed to the idea that the justification for beliefs generated in these ways depends essentially on their relationship to the person’s complete set of beliefs. Construed in this way, coherentism is specifically a view about justification and should not be confused with coherentism about a truth. Some philosophers have held both coherentism about truth and justification (Blanshard 1939 and Lewis 1946), but many who hold coherentism about justification reject coherentism about truth (see BonJour 1985, ch. 5, and Truth).

a. Varieties of Coherence

Broadly, coherentists argue that a belief is justified just in case it stands in a system of mutually supporting relationships with other beliefs in a person’s system of beliefs. For instance, my belief that the cat is on the mat involves a complicated set of beliefs: I am seeing a cat, I am seeing a mat, I am seeing a cat on a mat, a cat is a particular kind of mammal, a mat is a particular type of floor covering, my vision is generally reliable under normal circumstances, these are normal circumstances, and so forth. It is difficult to imagine arranging these in a linear, foundationalist fashion. In addition, it is not clear whether some of these beliefs are more basic than some others. Nevertheless, they all cohere, which means they are logically consistent with one another and with other beliefs in my belief set, and they mutually support one another. The challenge for coherentists is to explain just what “mutual support” amounts to.

Whereas foundationalists employ the metaphor of a building (or a pyramid, in some cases) to explain justificational relationships, coherentists employ the metaphor of a web (or, in some cases, a raft), according to which, each node (or plank) works alongside the others in a non-linear fashion to constitute a stable, interconnected whole (see Figure 2, as well as Neurath 1932, Quine 1970, and Sosa 1980). There are four candidates for how the web or raft holds together: logical consistency, logical entailment, inductive probability, and explanation.

figure 2

      Figure 2: Simple Coherentist Justification

                P-S represent propositions;

         the arrows represent lines of inference.

The first candidate, logical consistency, is generally regarded as necessary for coherence but too weak to stand on its own. For example, the belief that P and the belief that probably not-P are logically consistent. But they are not coherent; if one of them is true, the other is not likely to be true (BonJour 1985, ch. 5). Therefore, some early coherentists added that the relationship must also include logical entailment. This view, which I will call entailment coherentism, has it that a belief is justified just in case it entails or is entailed by every other belief in a person’s belief set (Blanshard 1939). Most coherentists now reject this relationship as overly strict, primarily because it seems possible to have two very different beliefs, neither of which entails the other and yet which are both justified. For example, consider the beliefs “I am seeing a needle puncture my skin” and “I am feeling pain.” Neither belief entails the other; nevertheless, it is intuitively plausible that both belong to a coherent set of beliefs.

Because of the problems with mere consistency and consistency plus entailment, most coherentists allow that entailment is sufficient for coherence but not necessary. To capture weaker relationships, they expand the notion to include inductive probability. Inductive probability coherentism is the view that a belief is justified just in case it is a member of a set each of whose members is entailed by or made more probable by a subset of the rest. C. I. Lewis, calling this type of justification “congruence,” puts it eloquently: “A set of statements, or a set of supposed facts asserted, will be said to be congruent if and only if they are so related that the antecedent probability of any one of them will be increased if the remainder of the set can be assumed as given premises” (1962). With their emphasis on inferential relations among beliefs, entailment and inductive probability coherentism attempt to resolve the DIJ by capturing the intuitive plausibility of the inferential assumption while avoiding the difficulties with basic beliefs.

Unfortunately, inductive probability coherentism faces problems similar to those that face entailment coherentism. It seems plausible for a person to hold two justified beliefs without the antecedent probability of either increasing the epistemic probability of the other, even when conjoined with other beliefs in the set. Consider, for example, your beliefs that “the Red Sox will win the Pennant” and “John F. Kennedy was shot in 1963.” Both beliefs are reasonably part of a person’s belief system, and yet it is difficult to see how one might contribute to a set of beliefs that makes the other more probable. Second, even if a subset of beliefs in a set increase the probability of each other member, the set might not be sufficiently comprehensive or well-connected with one’s experiences to justify one’s beliefs. Imagine a set of 100 beliefs, any 99 of which render the 100th member more probable than its antecedent probability. This set passes the inductive probability test and is, therefore, coherent on this account, but it includes very few beliefs. This suggests that, in order to maintain coherence, we could arbitrarily expand or contract our set of beliefs at will to avoid loss of rationality. The only guideline is that we preserve strong inductive inferences. Unfortunately, such arbitrary sets ignore important differences in the sources of beliefs; we can imagine two inductively coherent sets, one that includes sensory beliefs and one that does not. Inductive probability coherentism, without further qualification, implies that neither set is more rational than the other. As Catherine Z. Elgin puts it, “A good nineteenth-century novel is highly coherent, but not credible on that account. Even though Middlemarch is far more coherent than our regrettably fragmentary and disjointed views…, the best explanation of its coherence lies in the novelist’s craft, not in the truth…of the story” (2005: 159-60).

A third prominent account of coherence aimed at avoiding this criticism allows that entailment and inductive probability can contribute to coherence but only insofar as they function in a plausible explanation of the set of beliefs. According to this view, known as explanatory coherentism, beliefs are justified just in case they explain or are explained by the other beliefs of the same type (Harman 1986 and Poston 2014). This view is not committed to the inferential assumption and argues that justification is an emergent property of the explanatory relations among beliefs. Catherine Z. Elgin says that “epistemic justification is primarily a property of a suitably comprehensive, coherent account, when the best explanation of coherence is that the account is at least roughly true” (2005: 158). Elgin adds that the beliefs comprising a coherent system “must be mutually consistent, cotenable, and supportive. That is, the components must be reasonable in light of one another” (2005: 158).

Explanatory coherentism takes its motivation from responses to a problem in philosophy of science that was similar to the problem that faces inductive probability coherentism (Neurath 1932 and Hempel 1935). Not every proposition in a scientific theory is derived inferentially from others, and so there is some question as to whether such propositions could be believed justifiably. It turns out, though, that those propositions play an important explanatory role in the theory that organizes evidence and concepts in plausible ways, even if those propositions have no antecedent probability outside of the system. Elgin explains, “For example, although there is no direct evidence of positrons, symmetry considerations show that a physical theory that eschewed them would be significantly less coherent than one that acknowledged them. So physicists’ commitment to positrons is epistemically appropriate” (2005: 164). This suggests that explanations can play a justifying role independently of inferential relations, thus lending plausibility to coherentism.

Explanatory coherence avoids criticisms of earlier accounts in that it (1) maintains that consistency is an important constraint on a belief set, and (2) maintains that inferential relations contribute to explanatory power, while (3) also accounting for the intuitive connection of certain beliefs with sensory evidence and non-inferential coherence relations. Nevertheless, some criticisms have led philosophers like BonJour (1985), Lehrer (1974; 1990), and Poston (2014) to add other interesting and influential conditions to coherence theories, though space prevents us from exploring them here.

b. Objections to Coherentism

There are three prominent objections to coherentism. The first, which we already encountered in §2.b, is called the circularity problem. Since coherentism depends on mutual support relations, every particular belief will likely play an essential role in its own justification, rendering coherentist justification a form of circular argument (see Figure 3).

figure 3

The problem with circular justification is that it putatively undermines the goal of justification, which is to garner support for claim. If a claim is inferred from itself (P à P), the concluding proposition has only as much support as the premise, but that is precisely what we do not know. Therefore, multiplying the inferences between a proposition and an inference to that proposition (for example, (P à Q); (Q à R); (R à S); (S à P)) cannot justify P.

In response, some coherentists argue that the circularity objection oversimplifies the view. While it is true that a belief will almost certainly play a role in its own justification, this is only problematic if we assume the justificational relationship is linear. Properly understood, justification is a property that emerges from non-linear relationships among beliefs, whether inferential or non-inferential. For example, Catharine Z. Elgin tells a story about Meg (adapted from a story by Lewis 1946), whose logic textbook was stolen. There were three witnesses to the theft, but all are unreliable witnesses (one is aloof, one has severe vision problems, and one is a known liar). Nevertheless, all three witnesses agree that the thief had spiked green hair. Despite the fact that no one of the witnesses is reliable, their independent testimony to a single, unique proposition increases the likelihood that the proposition is true. As Elgin puts it, “This [agreement] makes a difference. … Their accord evidently enhances the epistemic standing of the individual reports” (2005: 157). If this is right, the antecedently low probability of the thief’s having spiked green hair can be added to the combined strength of the testimonies to create a justified belief without vicious circularity.

A second objection to coherentism is called the isolation objection. Even if a collection of beliefs could explain, and thereby justify, its members, it is not obvious how this set of beliefs is connected with reality, that is, with the content the beliefs are about. In rejecting basic beliefs, coherentists reject privileging any particular cognitive state in the belief system, such as sensory experiences. All beliefs are treated equally and are evaluated according to whether they cohere with the belief set. But beliefs can cohere with one another regardless of whether their content expresses true propositions about reality. Coherence cannot guarantee that the set is not isolated from reality.

Some coherentists respond to this objection by making special provisions for beliefs that derive from coherence-increasing sources, such as sense experience. (BonJour (1985) calls such beliefs “cognitively spontaneous beliefs.”) This makes the degree of coherence partly a matter of how well the system of beliefs integrates sense perception. Others appeal to more abstract distinctions among types of justification. For example, Keith Lehrer (1986) distinguishes personal justification, which involves the traditional, internalist coherence requirement, from verific justification, which is an externalist requirement on coherence. While objective coherence may be outside a person’s ken, it nevertheless contributes, along with personal justification, to what Lehrer calls complete justification. This externalist requirement helps to ground a person’s system of beliefs in the world those beliefs are supposed to be about.

Another coherentist response to the isolation objection is to allow experience itself, not just beliefs about experience, to figure in the evaluation of coherence. Catherine Z. Elgin (2005) argues that we have good reasons to privilege some perceptual experiences over very coherent sets of beliefs. She argues that this is because perception does not—contra foundationalists—work in isolation from other sorts of evidence. She says, “Only observations we have reason to trust have the power to unseat theories. So it is not an observation in isolation, but an observation backed by reasons that actually discredits the theory” (162). This also explains how we are able to privilege some perceptual experiences over others (say, in unfavorable conditions), though she admits that her view includes “something other than coherence,” and allows that it is a very weak form of foundationalism. For a reply along these lines that maintains a more traditional version of coherentism, see Kvanvig and Riggs (1992).

A third objection is called the plurality objection. Because justification is determined solely by the internal coherence of a person’s beliefs, coherence theory cannot guarantee that there is “one uniquely justified system of beliefs” (BonJour 1985: 107). BonJour explains that this is because “on any plausible conception of coherence, there will always be many, probably infinitely many, different and incompatible systems of belief which are equally coherent” (ibid.). To show just how pernicious this problem is, Lehrer asks us to imagine one set of beliefs comprised of both necessary and contingent beliefs and then to imagine a second set created by negating all the contingent beliefs in the first set (1990: 90). This has the nasty implication that, if coherence is sufficient for justification, then “for any contingent statement a person is completely justified in accepting is such that he is also completely justified in accepting the denial of that statement” (ibid.).

One response to the plurality objection is to invoke a “total evidence” requirement on explanatory and probabilistic relations. While we can arbitrarily construct probabilistically and explanatorily coherent sets, there is a non-trivial sense in which non-belief states explain our beliefs: sensation, testimony, and so forth. A theory of explanation that includes the antecedent probabilities of the beliefs based on this evidence would be more coherent with our total evidence than an arbitrary set of beliefs that ignores them. Recent debates over the relationship between coherence and truth include sophisticated analyses of probabilistic assessments (Klein and Warfield 1994 and Fitelson 2003) and an interesting argument for the impossibility of coherence’s increasing the probability that a belief is true (Olsson 2009), but there is not space to develop these arguments here.

For more on coherentism, see Coherentism in Epistemology.

4. Infinitism

Infinitism is an internalist view that proposes to resolve the dilemma of inferential justification by showing that Horn B of the DIJ, properly construed, is an acceptable option. In fact, argue infinitists, there are no serious problems with an infinite chain of justifying beliefs.

Traditionally, epistemologists have rejected the idea that a belief’s linear chain of justifying beliefs can extend infinitely because it leaves all beliefs ultimately unjustified. Inferential justification is said to transmit justification, not create it; therefore, an infinite chain of justifying beliefs would have no source of support to transmit. Similarly, since one could not hold an infinite number of beliefs or mentally trace an infinitely long chain of beliefs, infinitism betrays a common internalist intuition that a person must be aware of good reasons for holding a belief.

Infinitists claim these criticisms are misguided. In practice, justification is not as tidy as epistemologists would have us believe. The traditional idea that the regress must stop or bottom out in basic beliefs is unrealistic and unnecessary. Few of us attempt to draw inferences long enough to arrive at basic beliefs. We often stop looking for reasons when we are content that we have fulfilled our epistemic responsibility, not because the chain has actually ended (Aikin 2011). Foundationalists and coherentists, then, are relatively unconcerned with ultimate justification in their own epistemic behavior and, therefore, to hold epistemic justification to such high standards renders very few of our beliefs justified. To accommodate this messiness, infinitists might reject the inferential assumption, at least as classically understood. Like coherentists, infinitists may hold that justification is an emergent property of a set of beliefs and that justification comes in degrees such that, the longer the inferential chain, the stronger the degree of justification (Klein 2005).

a. Arguments for Infinitism

There are two main lines of argument for infinitism. The first is that foundationalism and coherentism cannot stop the structure of justification from regressing infinitely. For example, Peter Klein (2005) constructs a version of the meta-justification argument against foundationalism and argues that the most plausible version of coherentism (emergent justification accounts), because of its appeal to a basic assumption about the reliability of coherent sets, is merely a disguised form of foundationalism. If these arguments hit their mark, and if externalism is ruled out, infinitism may be the only non-skeptical option available.

The second main line of argument for infinitism is that the classic objections to infinitism are aimed at overly simplistic versions of the view; they do not threaten suitably qualified versions. For example, Scott Aikin (2009) argues that concerns about the regress arise because of a conflict between two types of intuition: (1) proceduralism, which includes our standard intuitions about good reasons and responsible believing, and (2) egalitarianism, which includes our intuitions that people are generally justified in believing a lot of things (beliefs about how to set DVRs and beliefs about how to get from home to work). Aikin claims that infinitists take the demands of proceduralism more seriously than egalitarian intuitions, maintaining that justification and knowledge are very difficult to attain. The more committed we are to following our chains of evidence, the more likely we are to attain our epistemic goals. However, we often stop far from what even foundationalists would take to be the end of those chains. And at every proposed stopping point, there is an infinite number of justificational questions about the appropriateness of the terms we are using, the reliability of our perceptions and concept attributions, and so forth. If this is right, infinitism may be the most plausible implication of our epistemic intuitions.

Similarly, Peter Klein (2014) argues that infinitism is a minimal thesis about what makes justification valuable, namely, that it renders our beliefs “reason-enhanced.” He says, “Infinitism holds that a belief-state is reason-enhanced whenever S deploys a reason for believing that p. Importantly, S can make a belief-state reason-enhanced even if the basis is another belief-state that is not (yet) reason-enhanced” (2014: 105). If this is right, then the process of inferring can create or produce original epistemic support, and we need not appeal to anything like basic beliefs for ultimate support. Further, infinitists do not object to a chain of inference’s stopping, for instance, when some presuppositions are explicit. For example, reasoning about Euclidean geometry may appropriately stop at Euclid’s axioms when we agree that they are our standard of evaluation. But we can also admit that those axioms can be challenged, and our reasoning could continue indefinitely. Infinitists simply argue that this is a standard feature of all justification.

b. Objections to Qualified Infinitism

Carl Ginet (2005) argues that even qualified infinitism is motivated on spurious grounds. One argument against foundationalism is that, even for basic beliefs, one needs a reason to believe they are true, and this initiates an infinite regress of reasons. Ginet objects, however, that this argument threatens foundationalism only if all reasons are inferential reasons. Of course, this is precisely what foundationalists reject. If some non-belief reasons are justified independently of any additional reasons for thinking they are true, that is, if they are inherently reasonable, the infinitist argument against foundationalism is question-begging.

In response, the infinitist might contend that, even if its critique of foundationalism is flawed, infinitism may yet be the more plausible alternative. If infinitism captures our intuitions about justification as adequately as foundationalism, and if it requires fewer controversial concepts (basic beliefs), infinitism may be an attractive competitor.

Another objection to infinitism is that, given our finite minds, we lack complete access to the infinite set of justifying beliefs. If a person has no access to his reason for belief, then infinitism is no longer internalist and, thereby, loses its means of defusing the DIJ. Of course, the infinitist may concede this and fall back on a mentalist account of epistemic access (see §5.a below). As Ginet puts it: a belief (L) “is available to S as a reason for so believing only if S is disposed, upon entertaining and accepting (L), to believe that the fact that (L) was among his reasons for so believing” (2005: 146). If this is right, a person may have a disposition to recognize further evidence for his justifying beliefs when prompted to do so.

Nevertheless, even this mentalist-enhanced infinitism faces the concern that the process of justification is never complete. An assumption behind the DIJ is that, if for any belief, there is not a reason to believe it is true, that belief and any beliefs inferred from it are unjustified. If this is right, and the justification condition for infinitism is never actually met, then we are left with skepticism.

A variation on this criticism is the idea that inferential justification can only transmit justification and cannot originate it. The idea is that all inference is conditional ((P → Q); (Q → R); (R → S)). Given this set of propositions, is S justified for us? That depends on whether P is justified. Telling us that P is justified by N, (N → P), though, does not answer the question of whether S is justified. We still need to know whether N is justified (Dancy 1985: 55). If this is right, then no matter how long the chain of inference is—even if it is infinite—no belief is justified.

Infinitists may respond to this objection by arguing that the justification condition is not a matter of getting to a final, infinitely large set, but of increasing one’s epistemic reasons for the proposition in question. Peter Klein, using the term “warrant” for “justification,” says that infinitism is like coherentism in this respect. He says, “Infinitism is like the warrant-emergent form of coherentism because it holds that warrant for a questioned proposition emerges as the proposition becomes embedded in a set of propositions” (2005: 135). Further, Klein explains that “warrant increases not because we are getting closer to a basic proposition but rather because we are getting further from the questioned proposition” (137). This amounts to a rejection of the claim that inferential justification can only transmit justification and, therefore, that a justificational chain must be complete in order to be adequate (recall Catherine Z. Elgin’s story about Meg in §3.b above).

A worry for this response is similar to a worry for coherentism. Any criterion that implies the infinite set of beliefs is justified is either part of the set or independent of it, in which case, it, too, needs a justification. If some sort of justification-conferring awareness is built into the increasingly large set, infinitism seems like foundationalism in disguise.

A further worry is that, if infinitists do not require that a person actually have an infinite number of justifying beliefs or perform an infinite number of inferences, then infinitism seems committed to the idea that inference itself can create justification. This, however, seems implausible. Carl Ginet writes, “…acceptable inference preserves justification … [but] there is nothing in the inferential relation itself that contributes to making any of those beliefs justified” (2005: 148-49). If inference cannot produce justification, it is unclear how a belief in an infinite chain of inferences comes to be justified.

For a more detailed treatment of infinitism, see Infinitism in Epistemology.

5. Types of Internalism and Objections

As noted above (§2), the view that justification is something we can determine by directly consulting our mental states is called internalism. This view does not entail that all epistemic concepts are internal. John Greco gives an example to demonstrate the difference: “[S]uppose that someone learns the history of his country from unreliable testimony. Although the person has every reason to believe the books that he reads and the people that teach him, his understanding of history is in fact the result of systematic lies and other sorts of deception” (2005: 259). Objectively speaking, this person’s beliefs are not reliably connected with reality. Subjectively, though, he is following his evidence to their rational conclusion. Should we say this person’s beliefs are justified? Since the reliability of his sources is beyond his ability to evaluate, the internalist says he has fulfilled his epistemic duty: yes, he is justified.

For centuries, there was no serious alternative to internalism. As we will see in §6, the advent of the Gettier case in the 20th century constitutes a serious challenge to internalism, and it contributed to alternative, externalist accounts of knowledge and justification. This move to externalism also led to closer scrutiny of internalism, and new concerns about its adequacy arose. I review just two of these here. But before doing so, it is helpful to distinguish two types of internalism: accessibilism and mentalism.

a. Accessibilism and Mentalism

According to accessibilists, in order for a belief to be justified for a person, that person must have “reflective access” to good reasons for holding that belief. To have reflective access is to be directly mentally aware of reasons for holding a belief. Some accessibilists argue that a person’s access must be occurrent, that is, she must be currently aware of her reasons for holding a belief (Conee and Feldman 2004). Others hold the looser requirement that, as long as a person has had direct access to relevant justifying reason, she is justified in holding the supported belief.

According to mentalists, reflective access may be sufficient for justification, but it is not necessary. All that is necessary for a belief to be justified is that a person has mental states that justify the belief, regardless of whether a person has reflective access to those states. Mentalists allow that some non-reflectively accessible mental states can justify beliefs.

Mentalism is supposed to have several advantages over accessibilism given the standard criticisms of internalism. For example, some have objected to internalism on the grounds that it cannot accommodate intuitive cases of stored or forgotten evidence. If, for example, you are driving and not thinking about whether Washington, D.C. is the capital of the United States, or you have forgotten any evidence for this belief, are you justified in believing that it is? If not, could we say that you know it is the capital? Accessibilists claim that a person must be able to access her evidence for a belief while she is currently thinking about it and presumably without prompting. Few of us, though, hold (or even could hold) a belief with all its attendant reasons in mind at once. Similarly, it seems reasonable to imagine that a person is justified in believing a proposition for which she has forgotten her evidence. Mentalists can handle these cases by claiming that the ability to access stored facts can constitute dispositional justification, and that even in cases of forgotten evidence, it could still be the case that the fact that it is justified is consciously available, either occurrently or dispositionally (Conee and Feldman 2004).

The worry for mentalism is that, in allowing non-occurrent mental states to count as reasons, mentalism betrays its claim to be internalist. For example, there may be a lot of evidence I could have that P is true if I were in the right place at the right time. But the existence of that evidence does not obviously justify P for me since being in such a place might be a matter of luck. Being at the right place at the right time may mean that the evidence that, say, “Washington is the capital,” is in a book nearby that I never happen to read or that the evidence is one of my mental states that I am not currently thinking about, even if I could when prompted. Specifying just what it means for evidence to be available but not occurrent turns out to be quite difficult. Richard Feldman (1988) argues that in neither of these examples am I justified in believing that Washington is the capital and that a mental state counts as evidence if and only if one is currently thinking of P. Feldman embraces the counterintuitive implication that “one does not know things such as that Washington is the capital when one is not thinking of them” (237). Despite these difficulties, the distinction between accessibilism and mentalism plays an important role in the debate over internalism.

For more on accessibilism and mentalism, see §1.c of, Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology.

b. Objections to Internalism

In addition to the Gettier problem (§6), there many other lines of argument that challenge internalism. Here, I review only three. One of these lines is called the access problem. Traditional foundationalists have accepted some version of accessibilism. For example, Roderick Chisholm writes that justification is “internal and immediate in that one can find out directly, by reflection, what one is justified in believing at any time” (1989: 7). But what if the belief P that justifies my current belief Q is tucked far back in the recesses of my memory and would require more time than I currently have to access it? Am I still justified in believing Q? Or worse, imagine that I have forgotten P; there is no possibility that I can directly access it. However, Q seems true to me, I remember that I had good reasons for believing it, and I do not have any reasons to doubt Q now. Am I justified in believing Q in this case?

Without some modification, the internalist must say no in both cases—the relevant evidence is neither immediately nor reflectively available—though intuitively these are normal cases of justified belief. The standard response is two-fold. First, we must admit that justification comes in degrees: having more evidence can increase one’s justification and some evidence is stronger than others. And second, the state of seeming to be justified or remembering that I am justified can, themselves, constitute reasons for belief. Therefore, in these cases, the internalist might respond that, while the justifications are not as strong as we would prefer, they are, nonetheless, based on accessible mental states.

A second, related objection to internalism is what, following John Greco, I will call the etiology problem. Internalism tends to make justification so easy that it is unclear how one is able to distinguish between good and bad reasons. Consider an example from Greco (2005):

Charlie is a wishful thinker and believes that he is about to arrive at his destination on time. He has good reasons for believing this, including his memory of train schedules, maps, the correct time at departure and at various stops, etc. However, none of these things is behind his belief—he does not believe what he does because he has these reasons. Rather, it is his wishful thinking that causes his belief. Accordingly, he would believe that he is about arrive on time even if he were not. (261)

Why is the combination of his beliefs about schedules, maps, and time a better reason for thinking he is about to arrive than wishful thinking? Presumably, it is because those things are reliable indicators of truth, whereas wishful thinking is not. Being a reliable indicator of truth, though, is an external relationship between the belief and the world—something to which Charlie has no access. We can arrive at a similar result from imagining that Charlie does base his beliefs on his beliefs about train schedules, and so forth, but stipulating that he formed those beliefs carelessly and haphazardly, and only accidentally arrived at the correct conclusion. Nevertheless, based on these beliefs, it seems clear to Charlie that the conclusion follows.

An internalist might respond that this objection depends on the mistaken assumption that internal factors exclude empirical evidence. To see how this assumption slips in, consider how an externalist might determine that train schedules are more fitting sources of evidence than wishful thinking. Presumably, externalists would evaluate the past track record of each source of evidence to see which more reliably indicates truth. The act of “reviewing their past track records,” however, involves appealing to internal states about what seems to be their track records and, therefore, is not obviously different from what an internalist would do; one has internal access to evidence that train arrivals correspond more reliably with train schedules than with wishes. By demanding that justification depends only on external features of the belief-forming process, and then appealing to internal features to evaluate external reliability, Greco is not denying that one must have good, accessible reasons for her beliefs; he is simply disguising the internal features by including them in the external conditions (Feldman 2005: 281). Therefore, either objective etiology is essential to justification, and, therefore, since no one has access to it, we are left with skepticism, or subjective access to evidence of reliable etiology is sufficient for justification, and the externalist criticism misses its mark.

Both the access problem and the etiology problem challenge the idea that we can determine whether we are justified by appeal to internal states. But even if this challenge can be answered, internalism is sometimes thought to imply that we can voluntarily control or change what we believe, that is, that we are guided but not determined by our evidence. The view that we have voluntary control over what we believe is called doxastic voluntarism (from the Greek doxa, for “what is given” and sometimes for “what is believed”). The idea is that internalism is intuitive partially because it allows us to take responsibility for our epistemic behavior. In fact, “[n]onvoluntarism is generally taken to rule out responsibility, since one is not responsible for what one does not control” (Adler 2002: 64). Taking responsibility implies we can decide to respond to evidence well or poorly. This suggests a third objection to internalism called the guidance problem. (For presentations of the guidance problem, see John Heil 1983 and William Alston 1989.)

It turns out that it is difficult to control what we believe: try to make yourself believe you are not reading this page or that you are not real. It is unclear what it would take to convince you that such things are true. That kind of shift would seem to require a complete change in your evidence. But if that is right, then our beliefs are tied strongly to factors outside our control; we cannot simply decide what evidence we have or whether to believe on the basis of that evidence. According to this critique, the idea that internalism explains how we take responsibility for our beliefs is misguided.

In response, contemporary internalists tend to accept that our beliefs are largely determined by the evidence we perceive ourselves to have, but they reject the idea that complete or even partial voluntary control is necessary for responsibility. Carl Ginet (2001) argues that our control over our beliefs is limited but that we nonetheless may decide what to believe in those cases where the evidence is indecisive, cases “where the subject has it open to her also to not come to believe it” (74). Further, Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (2004) argue that a person’s beliefs may appropriately fit one’s evidence even if she cannot control whether she forms those beliefs. For instance:

Suppose that a person spontaneously and involuntarily believes that the lights are on in the room, as a result of the familiar sort of completely convincing perceptual evidence. This belief is clearly justified, whether or not the person cannot voluntarily acquire, lose, or modify the cognitive process that led to the belief. (85)

For a more comprehensive treatment of the debate between internalists and externalists, see Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology.

6. The Gettier Era

The idea that justification is the crucial link between true belief and knowledge seems to be implicit in epistemology since Plato. In Theatetus, Socrates gives an example of a jury that has been persuaded by hearsay of a true judgment that can only be known by an eye-witness (201b-c). This example shows that “true judgment” is not the same thing as “knowledge,” and, therefore, that some other element is needed. Theatetus suggests that knowledge is true judgment plus a logos—an account or argument. Socrates considers three ways of giving an account of a true judgment but concludes that none is plausible. Nevertheless, from then until now, philosophers have generally thought something like the Theatetus’s suggestion must be right, and most of those accounts have been internalist. Socrates’s own suggestion, in Plato’s Meno, is that knowledge is a type of remembrance of what is true based on direct experience prior to being born. Descartes tries to close the gap between true belief and knowledge with the apprehension of clarity and distinctness. Kant attempts to bring them together with the transcendental apperception of the conditions for the possibility of veridical perception. In each case, the knower is assumed to have direct access to something that explains when true belief is knowledge.

Unfortunately, a thought experiment developed in the 20th century challenges the idea that any internal criteria can distinguish knowledge from accidentally true belief. This thought experiment was named the Gettier Problem after Edmund Gettier, who introduced the most influential examples in a famously brief 1963 paper. Examples from other philosophers proliferated after Gettier’s publication, but each new instance is standardly called a “Gettier Case.”

a. The History of the Gettier Problem

The idea is that there are cases where all three conditions on knowledge are met—a belief is justified and true—and yet that belief fails to be knowledge. Although some traditional internalists have allowed that a false belief can be justified, they have resisted the idea that a belief’s justification does not contribute to the likelihood of knowing. But if Gettier cases are successful, it is possible to be justified (in the classic internalist sense) in holding a true belief without that belief’s being knowledge.

The the broken clock example in §1 is an early version of this problem, constructed by Bertrand Russell (1948). Here is another example Russell includes alongside his clock case:

There is the man who believes, truly, that the last name of the Prime Minister in 1906 began with a B, but believes this because he believes that Balfour was Prime Minister then, whereas in fact it was Campbell-Bannerman. … Such instances can be multiplied indefinitely, and show that you cannot claim to have known merely because you turned out to be right. (171)

The problem, though, contra Russell, is not merely that such a person turns out to be right; it is that the person’s belief is justified in cases where a belief turns out to be true by luck; justified true belief in these cases does not increase the likelihood that the belief is knowledge. The evidence that justifies the belief is not connected with the truth of the belief in the right way, and, recall from the introduction, believing in the right way is precisely the sort of thing justification is supposed to indicate.

Such cases trace at least as far back as Alexius Meinong (1906), but the most famous are Gettier’s. His cases are interesting because they show that such cases can occur even when our evidence includes logical entailment. In his first example, Gettier asks us to imagine that two men, Smith and Jones, have applied for the same job. Imagine also that Smith has very good reasons for believing: “Jones will get the job” and “Jones has 10 coins in his pocket.” From this, it follows logically that: “The man who will get the job has 10 coins in his pocket,” and Smith forms the belief that this is true. As it turns out, however, Smith has 10 coins in his pocket (though he does not know it) and he will get the job. So, Smith’s belief that the man who will get the job has 10 coins in his pocket is true, and he has good reasons for why this is so, but his reasons are unconnected with the real reasons it is true. Most philosophers have concluded that, since Smith’s true belief is just a matter of luck (and not a function of his reasons’ connection with the state of affairs that make it true), Smith does not know that the man who will get the job has 10 coins in his pocket.

Because of the many possible variations on cases like these, the idea that justification is based on evidence to which we have direct access faces a serious challenge. There is no clear sense in which that sort of evidence always or even regularly increases the likelihood that a belief is knowledge.

b. Responses to the Gettier Problem

Some philosophers have tried to save strong internalist justification from Gettier cases. For example, D. M. Armstrong—although he ultimately defends an externalist theory of justification—argues that Gettier cases can be avoided by adding a requirement that all evidence for a belief must be, not merely justified, but also knowledge. In the Gettier case above, since it is false that Jones will get the job, this belief cannot be knowledge for Smith and, therefore, undermines Smith’s ability to know the man who will get the job has 10 coins in his pocket. (See Feldman 1974 for a counterexample.)

Others weaken the requirements on justification by arguing that, while knowledge may have constraints outside our conscious access, justification is more plausibly about responsible or apt belief than truth. Call this weak internalist justification (see Zagzebski, 1996).

Still others argue that Gettier cases suggest either that justification is simply not an internal matter or that knowledge does not require justification. Those who argue that justification is external claim that whether a belief is justified depends on whether there is a law-like connection (conceptual or physical) between a belief and the state of affairs it is about (Bergmann 2006). This approach is externalist because it explains justification in terms of belief-forming processes outside the mental life of the believer. In adopting externalism, some treat internal mental states as irrelevant for justification, while others argue that internal states can play an indirect and partial role in justification. Ernest Sosa (1991), for example, argues that internal states can contribute to the state of affairs that grounds the reliability of certain belief-forming behaviors.

7. Externalist Foundationalism

Gettier cases, in addition to other challenges to internalism, have led some epistemologists to reject the idea that justification requires an internal condition. In its most minimal form, externalism is the view that internalism is false, that is, that some features external to the mental life of a person play a necessary role in justification (Greco 2005: 258). However, many versions of externalism also explicitly reject internal conditions for justification, at least for non-inferential knowledge. Some philosophers have developed externalist accounts of knowledge that lack any account of justification (compare, Goldman, 1967, though he has since given up this view). The debate between externalists and internalists, though, is primarily about justification. Externalist accounts of justification differ from internalist accounts by challenging the idea that justification is primarily or ultimately about good reasons when good reasons are construed as mental states.

To accommodate the external features that connect beliefs with states of the world, externalists modify what was traditionally meant by justification; rather than appealing to a person’s subjective perspective on her evidence, externalists appeal to the objective features of the belief-forming and -holding behavior. Epistemic standing is not about the reasons a person has; it is about the relationship between a belief and the world, how that belief is formed or how it is maintained, and where the relationship is not a guarantee of truth but a strong indicator of truth, typically because of a causal, lawful, conceptual, or counterfactual connection with the states of affairs the belief is about. The most prominent version of externalism is the view that a belief is justified just in case it is caused by a reliable process, where “reliable” means that the process produces more true beliefs than false.

a. Externalism, Foundationalism, and the DIJ

Externalists agree that, to resolve the DIJ, one needs to avoid infinite regress and skepticism. So, rather than grounding justification in other beliefs (as coherentists do) or in non-belief states (as classical foundationalists do), externalists ground justification and knowledge in the objective way the world contributes to belief formation or maintenance.

Some externalists, like Armstrong (1973) and Goldman (1979), make room for something like basic beliefs, from which something like non-basic beliefs are inferred. This means that contemporary externalists tend to accept the foundationalist structure—some beliefs are produced reliably by non-belief states, and some beliefs can be produced by other beliefs—though they reject the distinction between basic and non-basic beliefs. All belief-forming processes are states external to the knower’s mental states, and whether a belief is justified (and, therefore, knowledge) depends on the reliability of those processes.

Unlike classical foundationalists, who appeal to internal seemings, indubitability, or self-evidence as justifying these states, externalists like Goldman argue that these states are knowledge simply because they stand in a reliable relationship with the world. A non-inferential belief is knowledge when and because it is lawfully (Armstrong) or reliably (Goldman) produced.

b. Reliabilism

The concept of reliability is crucial to externalist theories of justification (in contrast to externalist theories of knowledge, for example, Goldman 1967, 1976 and Armstrong 1973). There are two types of reliabilist theories of justification. According to reliable indicator theories, a belief is justified just in case its reason or ground is a reliable indicator of the belief’s truth (Swain 1981 and Alston 1988). According to process reliabilism, a belief is justified just in case it was causally produced by reliable processes (Goldman 1979 and Bach 1985). Although he focuses primarily on externalist theories of knowledge, D. M. Armstrong’s “thermometer theory of knowledge” explains that certain mental states serve as reliable indicators or signs of knowledge, and therefore make the belief reasonable, or “justifiable.” Comparing non-inferential belief and a thermometer, Armstrong writes:

In some cases, the thermometer-reading will fail to correspond to the temperature of the environment. Such a reading may be compared to non-inferential false belief. In other cases, the reading will correspond to the actual temperature. Such a reading is like non-inferential true belief. (166)

There are a number of important qualifications to Armstrong’s view, but the central point is that a belief is justified independently of whether the person has reasons to believe it: “The subject’s belief is not based on reasons, but it might be said to be reasonable (justifiable), because it is a sign, a completely reliable sign, that the situation believed to exist does in fact exist” (183).

The benefit of Armstrong’s law-like account is that it suggests a counterfactual account of causal relations along the following lines: as long as a person has a means of distinguishing a proposition, P, from a mutually exclusive but very similar proposition Q, then the person is justified in believing P. For example, if Judy and Trudy are twins, and when John sees someone who looks like Judy, he would not mistake Trudy for Judy, then Sam is justified in believing that he sees Judy. “But if Sam frequently mistakes Judy for Trudy, and Trudy for Judy, he presumably does not have any way of distinguishing between them” (Goldman 1976: 778).

Unfortunately, reliable indicator theories tend to be overly strict in their analysis of cases. Goldman asks us to consider Oscar, who is standing in an open field and sees a Dachshund, from which he forms the belief that he sees a dog. As it happens, Oscar often mistakes certain dog breeds for wolves, who frequent the field. If he were to see a wolf, he might easily mistake it for a dog. Now, is his seeing a Dachshund a reliable indicator of seeing a dog? Since Oscar would likely believe he is seeing a dog regardless of whether he is seeing a wolf or a Dachshund, reliable indicator theories (at least Armstrong’s) would say his seeing a Dachshund is not a reliable indicator of seeing a dog. Whether this criticism is ultimately successful or whether it applies to all reliable indicator theories, reliable process theories quickly overshadowed interest in this type of reliabilism.

Process reliabilism is the view that a belief is justified just in case it is produced by a reliable cognitive process, where a cognitive process may include either conscious reasoning processes or unconscious mechanisms. As I formulated it earlier in this article, reliabilism is a necessary and sufficient condition for justification (“just in case”), but some reliabilists formulate weaker versions. Goldman treats it as a sufficient condition (though he argues against the plausibility of alternative sufficient conditions): “If S’s believing p at t results from a reliable cognitive belief-forming process (or set of processes), then S’s belief in p at t is justified,” (1979: 13). Kent Bach treats it as only a necessary condition: “The idea, roughly, is that to be justified a belief must be formed as the result of reliable processes…” (1985: 199). Despite these differences, externalists univocally reject internalist conditions as sufficient for justification. This commitment, however, leaves them open to a number of interesting criticisms.

c. Objections to Externalism

Though externalism, putatively, has the advantage of avoiding the Gettier problem (though this is controversial) and several other skeptical concerns and of capturing some important intuitions about knowledge, it faces several serious criticisms. On the basis of these criticisms, some internalists claim that externalists have simply changed the subject altogether and are not really talking about justification.

One famous criticism of externalism is called the generality problem. Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (1998) present an example to demonstrate the problem:

Suppose that Smith has good vision and is familiar with the visible differences among common species of trees. Smith looks out a house window one sunny afternoon and sees a plainly visible a nearby maple tree. She forms the belief that there is a maple tree near the house. Assuming everything else in the example is normal, this belief is justified and Smith knows that there is a maple tree near the house. Process reliabilist theories reach the right verdict about this case only if it is true that the process that caused Smith’s belief is reliable. (372)

Is it reliable? That depends on which process formed the belief. Was it the unique causal set of events leading to that particular belief? If so, it is not reliable, since token, or one-time, events have no historical track record. Reliabilists respond to this challenge by saying it is the type of process that must be reliable in order for a belief to be justified, not the token. If that is right, then we face the problem of determining which type of process formed the belief. Was it the “visually initiated belief-forming process,” the “process of a retinal image of such-and-such specific characteristics leading to a belief that there is a maple tree nearby,” the “process of relying on a leaf shape to form a tree-classifying judgment,” the “perceptual process of classifying by species a tree located behind a solid obstruction,” or any number of others (373)? There are innumerable options, and even if a combination of types were involved, each type would have to meet reliability conditions. Conee and Feldman conclude, “Without a specification of the relevant type, process reliabilism is radically incomplete” (373).

A second objection to externalism is called the New Evil Demon Problem (NEDP) (Cohen and Lehrer 1983). In Descartes’s original evil demon problem, in order to motivate the problem of skepticism, we are asked to consider the possibility that all our current perceptions are the fictitious construction of a being intent on deceiving us such that all our perceptual and intuitive beliefs are false. Putting the thought experiment to a very different purpose, if the evil demon world is possible, we can imagine two worlds: (1) a non-deceptive world, where our perceptions are reliably produced by the world outside of our minds, and (2) an evil demon world, where there are people just like you and me, who have exactly the same mental states that we do but whose perceptions are systematically unreliable—they track nothing of truth at that world. There are no trees, buildings, bodies, and so forth. Whatever actually exists at that world, those people have no perception of it. According to externalists—process reliabilists, in particular—the beliefs of people in the real world are justified and those of people in the demon world are unjustified, despite the fact that their mental lives are identical. Yet it is difficult to imagine that demon world beliefs about looking both ways before crossing the street and getting a second opinion about a medical diagnosis are unjustified. People who believe such things are acting responsibly from their perspective on their evidence. This suggests that reliabilism is not really about justification at all.

A third objection to externalism is what Ernest Sosa (2001) calls the metaincoherence problem, which attempts to show that a person’s belief can be externally reliable while internally unjustified. In the literature, there are two versions of the metaincoherence problem. The first is what I call first-order metaincoherence, which attempts to show that externalism is insufficient for justification. The second is what I call second-order metaincoherence, which challenges the externalist’s reasons for holding externalism.

One famous example of first-order metaincoherence is a thought experiment given in various forms by Laurence BonJour (1985) and Keith Lehrer (1990). Consider Armstrong’s Thermometer Analogy from above. Imagine there was a human thermometer, that is, someone who “undergoes brain surgery by an experimental surgeon who invents a small device which is both a very accurate thermometer and a computational device capable of generating thoughts” (Lehrer 1990: 163). This person, whom Lehrer names Mr. Truetemp, is unaware of the device despite the fact that it regularly causes him to form reliable beliefs that he unreflectively accepts about the temperature. On a given day, he might reliably form and accept the belief that it is 104 degrees Fahrenheit outside. Is this belief knowledge? Lehrer concludes: “Surely not. He has no idea whether he or his thoughts about the temperature are reliable” (164). BonJour concludes similarly, “Part of one’s epistemic duty is to reflect critically upon one’s beliefs, and such critical reflection precludes believing things to which one has, to one’s knowledge, no reliable means of epistemic access” (1985: 42).

The second-order metaincoherence problem is stated by Barry Stroud (1989):

The scientific ‘externalist’ claims to have good reason to believe that his theory is true. It must be granted that if, in arriving at his theory, he did fulfill the conditions his theory says are sufficient for knowing things about the world, then if that theory is correct, he does in fact know that it is. But still, I want to say, he himself has no reason to think that he does have good reason to think that his theory is correct. (321)

The worry is that, since externalists claim that features of the world outside the mental life of a believer ultimately determine whether a belief is justified, then, if externalism is true, externalists have no reason to believe it is true; in fact, they are committed to believing that whether their belief that it is true is justified is outside their ability to determine from within their own perspective. Again, the belief may be externally reliable, but it is internally unjustified.

If these criticisms hit their mark, epistemologists must make some difficult decisions about which approach—internalism or externalism—has the fewest or least pernicious problems. In the 21st century, much work is underway to address these problems. If one remains unconvinced, there are recent developments that attempt to salvage some of the insights of internalism and externalism. A prominent example involves introducing character traits into the conditions for justification. We turn next to this view, called virtue epistemology.

8. Justification as Virtue

Classical theories of justification that imply a normative or belief-guiding dimension are modeled largely on normative ethical theories, whether teleological, or outcome-based, accounts or deontological, or duty-based, accounts. They ask whether people are rationally obligated to, permitted to, or obligated not to hold particular beliefs given their evidence. These are decision-based theories of rational normativity, as opposed to character-based theories. Just as virtue theory offers a non-decision-based alternative in ethics, it also suggests a non-decision-based alternative in epistemology. The attitudes and circumstances under which people form, maintain, and discard beliefs can be described as virtuous or vicious, and just as decision-based theories in epistemology are concerned with rational obligation (as opposed to moral obligation), character-based theories in epistemology are concerned either with intellectual character (as opposed to moral character), or with cognitive faculties understood as traits of a person (such as reason, perception, introspection, and memory). Of course, in matters of normativity, it is not a simple task to distinguish moral dimensions from rational or intellectual ones, but space prevents us from exploring that relationship here.

Virtue theories of justification hold that part of what justifies a belief is the intellectual traits with which a believer forms or holds the belief. Just as a person’s moral virtues contribute to the goodness of an action (kindness, compassion, honesty), a person’s intellectual virtues contribute to the epistemic goodness of a belief. Virtue theorists, however, are sharply divided as to which intellectual virtues are relevant. One prominent view is that justification is a function of those virtues that enhance reliability, that is, they have a strong external component (Sosa 1980; 2007). This view is known as virtue reliabilism.

A second prominent view is that justification is a function of those intellectual virtues that contribute to more general epistemic goods, including intellectual well-being, social trust, and the righting of epistemic injustice. These virtue responsibilists regard the truth-goal in epistemology very differently than both traditional epistemologists and their virtue reliabilist counterparts (Code 1984; Montmarquet 1993; Zagzebski 2000).

a. Virtue Reliabilism

A prominent version of virtue reliabilism is offered by Ernest Sosa (1980) in attempt to resolve the tension between foundationalists and coherentists. Sosa argues that if beliefs are grounded in truth-conductive intellectual virtues (where truth-conducive is conceived in process reliabilist terms), then foundationalists have empirically stable abilities or acquired habits that help explain the connection between sensory experience and non-inferential belief. Further, reliable virtues help explain how justification emerges from a coherent set of beliefs—coherence is a type of intellectual virtue.

What do these intellectual virtues look like for Sosa? Borrowing an example from his (2007), consider an archer who is aiming at a target. In order to be successful, the archer must have a degree of competence, which Sosa calls “adroitness,” and the shot must be accurate. These features are analogous to the epistemic state of having a true belief (accuracy) that is formed on the basis of good evidence (adroitness). These two features alone, though, are insufficient for the person to believe in the right way. The person must also exercise his adroitness in circumstances that increase his likelihood of having accurate beliefs, that is, his shot must be accurate because it is adroit. Sosa calls this third feature “aptness,” “its being true because competent” (2007: 23). Some of these circumstances will be outside the believer’s control—wind gusts in the archer’s case; causal ties to the world in the epistemic case. But some—for example, the virtues—are within the believer’s control.

Sosa explains:

Aptness depends on just how the adroitness bears on the accuracy. The wind may help some, for example…. If the shot is difficult, however, from a great distance, the shot might still be accurate sufficiently through adroitness to count as apt, though with some help from the wind. (2007: 79)

Notice that the role of the wind is analogous to certain external features of a person’s belief-forming state. Nevertheless, intellectual virtues like those mentioned above can increase one’s adroitness and thereby increase the likelihood of accuracy.

Imagine a person who has good evidence that P but who either does not appeal to that evidence when forming the belief that P, appealing instead to, say, wishful thinking, or who appeals to that evidence carelessly, refusing to consider alternatives or just how strong the evidence is. Despite this person’s having good evidence, her belief is not apt because the belief’s truth was not due to the person’s competence with the evidence.

Because of this external dimension, this branch of virtue epistemology is regarded as a form of reliabilism. Unlike externalist foundationalism, however, the reliability condition is not restricted to belief-forming processes; it is also highly dependent on context. Sosa says:

An archer might manifest sublime skill in a shot that does hit the bull’s-eye. This shot is then both accurate and adroit. But it could still fail to be accurate because adroit. The arrow might be diverted by some wind, for example, so that, if conditions remained normal thereafter, it would miss the target altogether. However, shifting winds might then ease it back on track towards the bull’s-eye. (79)

In epistemic cases, the believer must be suitably virtuous such that, under normal conditions, her beliefs are accurate because they are adroit.

b. Virtue Responsibilism

Sosa’s account has been well-received, though there is disagreement as to whether it is sufficient for solving the problems at issue. One prominent criticism is that Sosa does not take his use of virtues far enough. Rather than serving a more basic truth-goal, some argue that virtues should be conceived as central to the epistemic project.

Lorraine Code (1984) coined the term virtue responsibilism in contrast to Sosa’s reliabilism, and it is the view that justification, or rather, being an intellectually responsible agent, is a matter of acting virtuously in the practice of inquiry. Code argues that epistemic responsibility the central intellectual virtue. Similarly, James Montmarquet argues that, “S is subjectively justified in believing p insofar as S is epistemically virtuous in believing p” (1993: 99). This means that virtue responsibilism is internalist through and through.

Not all virtue responsibilists, however, eschew the truth-goal. As Linda Zagzebski explains, “It would not do any good for a person to be attentive, thorough, and careful unless she was generally on the right track” (2009: 82). But unlike externalist foundationalism, “the right track,” according to virtue epistemologists, does not necessarily include producing more true beliefs than false. There is more than one virtuous outcome, for example, in cases of creativity or inventiveness. It may be that “only 5 per cent of a creative thinker’s original ideas turn out to be true,” Zagzebski explains. “Clearly, their truth conduciveness in the sense of producing a high proportion of true beliefs is much lower than that of the ordinary virtues of careful and sober inquiry, but they are truth conducive in that they are necessary for the advancement of knowledge” (2000: 465). This suggests that the conditions under which a subject is justified are highly contingent on changing context and the goal of our epistemic behaviors. And virtue epistemologists argue that this captures the typical contingency of our epistemic lives.

c. Objections to Virtue Epistemology

In addition to internal disputes between virtue reliabilists and responsibilists, there are more serious concerns with the adequacy of virtue epistemology. Virtue reliabilism faces many of the same criticisms that face traditional reliabilism, including the generality problem, the New Evil Demon Problem, and the meta-incoherence problems. Further, although there is an intuitive sense in which a reliably functioning method of forming beliefs is virtuous (in the Aristotelian sense of “excellence”), it is not clear how virtue reliabilism is substantively different from classical reliabilism. To be sure, virtue responsibilists take special pains to explain the roles of context, luck, and the knower’s aptness in forming beliefs, but these do not seem unavailable to traditional reliabilists.

Similarly, virtue responsibilism faces many of the same problems as virtue ethics. There are questions about which intellectual states count as epistemic virtues (different responsibilists have different lists), whether some virtues should be privileged over others (for example, James Montmarquet (1992) argues that epistemic conscientiousness is the preeminent intellectual virtue), and the ontological status of virtues (whether they are real dispositions or simply heuristics for categorizing types of behavior). There are also serious concerns about some extreme versions of responsibilism that completely disconnect intellectual virtue from truth-seeking, as with Code’s account, rendering discussions of intellectual virtue the province of ethics rather than epistemology.

To alleviate some of these concerns, some virtue epistemologists defend a mixed theory, arguing that an adequate virtue epistemology requires both a reliability and a responsibility condition Greco (2000).

A general concern for both types of virtue epistemology is that virtue theory associates justification too closely with the idea of credit or achievement, whether a person has formed beliefs well. Jennifer Lackey (2007, 2009), for example, argues that if knowledge is produced by the virtuous activity of others (like that of a reliable witness) or if knowledge is innate, then it is not obvious how a person’s belief-forming behavior can be virtuous or vicious, as there is no behavior involved. In the case of the reliable witness, a hearer simply accepts on the basis of the witness’s testimony. In the case of innate knowledge, the knower does nothing to increase the likelihood that her beliefs are reliable; they are reliable for reasons outside her epistemic behavior. If these criticisms are right, virtue epistemology may be unable to explain a range of important types of knowledge.

For a more detailed treatment of virtue epistemology, see Virtue Epistemology.

9. The Value of Justification

Each of the theories of justification reviewed in this article presumes something about the value of justification, that is, about why justification is good or desirable. Traditionally, as in the case of Theatetus noted above, justification is supposed to position us to understand reality, that is, to help us obtain true beliefs for the right reasons. Knowledge, we suppose, is valuable, and justification helps us attain it. However, skeptical arguments, the influence of external factors on our cognition, and the influence of various attitudes on the way we conduct our epistemic behavior suggest that attaining true beliefs for the right reason is a forbidding goal, and it may not be one that we can access internally. Therefore, there is some disagreement as to whether justification should be understood as aimed at truth or some other intellectual goal or set of goals.

a. The Truth Goal

All the theories we have considered presume that justification is a necessary condition for knowledge, though there is much disagreement about what precisely justification contributes to knowledge. Some argue that justification is fundamentally aimed at truth, that is, it increases the likelihood that a belief is true. Laurence BonJour writes, “If epistemic justification were not conducive to truth in this way…then epistemic justification would be irrelevant to our main cognitive goal and of dubious worth” (1985: 8). Others argue that there are a number of epistemic goals other than truth and that in some cases, truth need not be among the values of justification. Jonathan Kvanvig explains:

[I]t might be the case that truth is the primary good that defines the theoretical project of epistemology, yet it might also be the case that cognitive systems aim at a variety of values different from truth. Perhaps, for instance, they typically value well-being, or survival, or perhaps even reproductive success, with truth never really playing much of a role at all. (2005: 285)

Given this disagreement, we can distinguish between what I will call the monovalent view, which takes truth as the sole, or at least fundamental, aim of justification, and the polyvalent view (or, as Kvanvig calls it, the plurality view), which allows that there are a number of aims of justification, not all of which are even indirectly related to truth.

b. Alternatives to the Truth Goal

One motive for preferring the monovalent view is that, if truth is not the primary goal of justification—that is, it connects belief with reality in the right way—then one is left only with goals that are not epistemic, that is, goals that cannot contribute to knowledge. The primary worry is that, in rejecting the truth goal, one is left with pragmatism. In response, those who defend polyvalence argue that, in practice, there are other cognitive goals that are (1) not merely pragmatic, and (2) meet the conditions for successful cognition. Kvanvig explains that “not everyone wants knowledge…and not everyone is motivated by a concern for understanding. … We characterize curiosity as the desire to know, but small children lacking the concept of knowledge display curiosity nonetheless” (2005: 293). Further, much of our epistemic activity, especially in the sciences, is directed toward “making sense of the course of experience and having found an empirically adequate theory” (ibid., 294). Such goals can be produced without appealing to truth at all. If this is right, justification aims at a wider array of cognitive states than knowledge.

Another argument for polyvalence allows that knowledge is the primary aim of justification but that much more is involved in justification than truth. The idea is that, even if one were aware of belief-forming strategies that are conducive to truth (following the evidence where it leads; avoiding fallacies), one might still not be able to use those strategies without having other cognitive aims, namely, intellectual virtues. Following John Dewey, Linda Zagzebski says that “it is not enough to be aware that a process is reliable; a person will not reliably use such a process without certain virtues” (2000: 463). As noted above, virtue responsibilists allow that the goal of having a large number of true beliefs can be superseded by the desire to create something original or inventive. Further still, following strategies that are truth-conducive under some circumstances can lead to pathological epistemic behavior. Amélie Rorty, for example, argues that belief-forming habits become pathological when they continue to be applied in circumstances no longer relevant to their goals (Zagzebski, ibid., 464). If this argument is right, then truth is, at best, an indirect aim of justification, and intellectual virtues like openness, courage, and responsibility may be more important to the epistemic project.

c. Objections to the Polyvalent View

One response to the polyvalent view is to concede that there are apparently many cognitive goals that fall within the purview of epistemology but to argue that all of these are related to truth in a non-trivial way. The goal of having true beliefs is a broad and largely indeterminate goal. According to Marian David, we might fulfill it by believing a truth, by knowing a truth, by having justified beliefs, or by having intellectually virtuous beliefs. All of these goals, argues David, are plausibly truth-oriented in the sense that they derive from, or depend on, a truth goal (David 2005: 303). David supports this claim by asking us to consider which of the following pairs is more plausible:

A1. If you want to have TBs [true beliefs] you ought to have JBs [justified beliefs].

A2. We want to have JBs because we want to have TBs.

B1. If you want to have JBs you ought to have TBs.

B2. We want to have TBs because we want to have JBs. (2005: 303)

David says, “[I]t is obvious that the A’s [sic] are way more plausible than the B’s. Indeed, initially one may even think that the B’s have nothing going for them at all, that they are just false” (ibid.). This intuition, he concludes, tells us that the truth-goal is more fundamental to the epistemic project than anything else, even if one or more other goals depend on it.

Almost all theories of epistemic justification allow that we are fallible, that is, that our justified beliefs, even if formed by reliable processes, may sometimes be false. Nevertheless, this does not detract from the claim that the aim of justification is true belief, so long as it is qualified as true belief held in the right way.

d. Rejections of the Truth Goal

In spite of these arguments, some philosophers explicitly reject the truth goal as essential to justification and cognitive success. Michael Williams (1991), for example, rejects the idea that truth even could be an epistemic goal when conceived of as “knowledge of the world.” Williams argues that in order for us to have knowledge of the world, there must be a unified set of propositions that constitute knowledge of the world. Yet, given competing uses of terms, vague domains of discourse, the failure of theoretical explanations, and the existence of domains of reality we have yet to encode into a discipline, there is not a single, unified reality to study. Williams argues that because of this, we do not necessarily have knowledge of the world:

All we know for sure is that we have various practices of assessment, perhaps sharing certain formal features. It doesn’t follow that they add up to a surveyable whole, to a genuine totality rather than a more or less loose aggregate. Accordingly, it does not follow that a failure to understand knowledge of the world with proper generality points automatically to an intellectual lack. (543)

In other words, our knowledge is not knowledge of the world—that is, access to a unified system of true beliefs, as the classical theory would have it. It is knowledge of concepts in theories putatively about the world, constructed using semantic systems that are evaluated in terms of other semantic systems. If this is, in fact, all there is to knowing, then truth, at least as classically conceived, is not a meaningful goal.

Another philosopher who rejects the truth goal is Stephen Stich (1988; 1990). Stich argues that, given the vast amount of disagreement among novices and experts about what counts as justification, and given the many failures of theories of justification to adequately ground our beliefs in anything other than calibration among groups of putative experts, it is simply unreasonable to believe that our beliefs track anything like truth. Instead, Stich defends pragmatism about justification, that is, justification just is practically successful belief; thus, truth cannot play a meaningful role in the concept of justification.

A response to both views might be that, in each case, the truth goal has not been abandoned but simply redefined or relocated. Correspondence theories of truth take it that propositions are true just in case they express the world as it is. If the world is not expressible propositionally, as Williams seems to suggest, then this type of truth is implausible. Nevertheless, a proposition might be true in virtue of being an implication of a theory, and so, for example, we might adopt a more semantic than ontological theory of truth, and it is not clear whether Williams would reject this sort of truth as the aim of epistemology.

Similarly, someone might object to Stich’s treating pragmatism as if it is not truth-conductive in any relevant sense. If something is useful, it is true that it is useful, even in the correspondence sense. Even if evidence does not operate in a classical representational manner, the success of beliefs in accomplishing our goals is, nevertheless, a truth goal. (See Kornblith 2001 for an argument along these lines.)

10. Conclusion

Epistemic justification is an evaluative concept about the conditions for right or fitting belief. A plausible theory of epistemic justification must explain how beliefs are justified, the role justification plays in knowledge, and the value of justification. A primary motive behind theories of justification is to solve the dilemma of inferential justification. To do this, one might accept the inferential assumption and argue that justification emerges from a set of coherent beliefs (internalist coherentism) or an infinite set of beliefs (infinitism). Alternatively, one might reject the inferential assumption and argue that justification derives from basic beliefs (internalist foundationalism) or through reliable belief-forming processes (externalist reliabilism). If none of these views is ultimately plausible, one might pursue alternative accounts. For example, virtue epistemology introduces character traits to help avoid problems with these classical theories. Other alternatives include hybrid views, such as Conee and Feldman’s (2008), mentioned above, and Susan Haack’s (1993) foundherentism.

11. References and Further Reading

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  • Conee, E. and R. Feldman. 2004. Evidentialism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Conee, E. and R. Feldman. 1998. “The Generality Problem for Reliabilism,” in E. Sosa and J. Kim, eds. Epistemology: An Anthology. Malden: Blackwell Publishers, 372-386. Page numbers are to this anthology.
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Author Information

Jamie Carlin Watson
Email: jamie.c.watson@gmail.com
Broward College
U. S. A.