Epicurus (341—271 B.C.E.)

epicurus2Epicurus is one of the major philosophers in the Hellenistic period, the three centuries following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 B.C.E. (and of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.). Epicurus developed an unsparingly materialistic metaphysics, empiricist epistemology, and hedonistic ethics. Epicurus taught that the basic constituents of the world are atoms, uncuttable bits of matter, flying through empty space, and he tried to explain all natural phenomena in atomic terms. Epicurus rejected the existence of Platonic forms and an immaterial soul, and he said that the gods have no influence on our lives. Epicurus also thought skepticism was untenable, and that we could gain knowledge of the world relying upon the senses. He taught that the point of all one’s actions was to attain pleasure (conceived of as tranquility) for oneself, and that this could be done by limiting one’s desires and by banishing the fear of the gods and of death. Epicurus’ gospel of freedom from fear proved to be quite popular, and communities of Epicureans flourished for centuries after his death.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Sources
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void
    2. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe
    3. Differences from Democritus
      1. Weight
      2. The Swerve
      3. Sensible Qualities
    4. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena
    5. The Gods
    6. Philosophy of Mind
    7. Perception
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Canon: Sensations, Preconceptions, and Feelings
    2. Anti-skeptical Arguments
      1. The “Lazy Argument”
      2. The Self-refutation Argument
      3. The Argument from Concept-formation
  5. Ethics
    1. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical
    2. Types of Pleasure
    3. Types of Desire
    4. The Virtues
    5. Justice
    6. Friendship
    7. Death
      1. The No Subject of Harm Argument
      2. The Symmetry Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collections of Primary Sources
    2. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus’ Philosophy

1. Life

Epicurus was born around 341 B.C.E., seven years after Plato’s death, and grew up in the Athenian colony of Samos, an island in the Mediterranean Sea. He was about 19 when Aristotle died, and he studied philosophy under followers of Democritus and Plato. Epicurus founded his first philosophical schools in Mytilene and Lampsacus, before moving to Athens around 306 B.C.E. There Epicurus founded the Garden, a combination of philosophical community and school. The residents of the Garden put Epicurus’ teachings into practice. Epicurus died from kidney stones around 271 or 270 B.C.E.

After Epicurus’ death, Epicureanism continued to flourish as a philosophical movement. Communities of Epicureans sprang up throughout the Hellenistic world; along with Stoicism, it was one of the major philosophical schools competing for people’s allegiances. Epicureanism went into decline with the rise of Christianity. Certain aspects of Epicurus’ thought were revived during the Renaissance and early modern periods, when reaction against scholastic neo-Aristotelianism led thinkers to turn to mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena.

2. Sources

Epicurus was a voluminous writer, but almost none of his own work survives. A likely reason for this is that Christian authorities found his ideas ungodly. Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century CE , wrote a 10-book Lives of the Philosophers, which includes three of Epicurus’ letters in its recounting of the life and teachings of Epicurus. These three letters are brief summaries of major areas of Epicurus’ philosophy: the Letter to Herodotus, which summarizes his metaphysics, the Letter to Pythocles, which gives atomic explanations for meteorological phenomena, and the Letter to Menoeceus, which summarizes his ethics. It also includes the Principal Doctrines, 40 sayings which deal mainly with ethical matters.

Because of the absence of Epicurus’ own writings, we have to rely on later writers to reconstruct Epicurus’ thought. Two of our most important sources are the Roman poet Lucretius (c. 94-55 B.C.E.) and the Roman politician Cicero (106-43 B.C.E.). Lucretius was an Epicurean who wrote De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things), a six-book poem expounding Epicurus’ metaphysics. Cicero was an adherent of the skeptical academy, who wrote a series of works setting forth the major philosophical systems of his day, including Epicureanism. Another major source is the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 CE), a Platonist. However, both Cicero and Plutarch were very hostile toward Epicureanism, so they must be used with care, since they often are less than charitable toward Epicurus, and may skew his views to serve their own purposes.

Although the major outlines of Epicurus’ thought are clear enough, the lack of sources means many of the details of his philosophy are still open to dispute.

3. Metaphysics

Epicurus believes that the basic constituents of the world are atoms (which are uncuttable, microscopic bits of matter) moving in the void (which is simply empty space). Ordinary objects are conglomerations of atoms. Furthermore, the properties of macroscopic bodies and all of the events we see occurring can be explained in terms of the collisions, reboundings, and entanglements of atoms.

a. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void

Epicurus’ metaphysics starts from two simple points: (1) we see that there are bodies in motion, and (2) nothing comes into existence from what does not exist. Epicurus takes the first point to be simply a datum of experience. The second point is a commonplace of ancient Greek philosophy, derived from the Principle of Sufficient Reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).

First, because bodies move, there must be empty space for them to move in, and Epicurus calls this empty space ‘void.’ Second, the ordinary bodies that we see are compound bodies–that is, bodies which are made up of further bodies, which is shown by the fact that they can be broken down into smaller pieces. However, Epicurus thinks that this process of division cannot go on indefinitely, because otherwise bodies would dissolve away into nothing. Also, there must be basic and unchangeable building blocks of matter in order to explain the regularities in nature. These non-compound bodies are atoms–literally, ‘uncuttables.’ Only bodies and void exist per se, that is, exist without depending for their existence on something else. Other things–such as colors, time, and justice–are ultimately explicable as attributes of bodies.

b. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe

Because Epicurus believes that nothing comes into existence from nothing, he thinks that the universe has no beginning, but has always existed, and will always exist. Atoms, too, as the basic building blocks of all else, cannot come into existence, but have always existed. Our particular cosmos, however, is only a temporary agglomeration of atoms, and it is only one of an infinite number of such cosmoi, which come into existence and then dissolve away. Against Aristotle, Epicurus argues that the universe is unlimited in size. If the universe were limited in size, says Epicurus, you could go to the end of it, stick your fist out, and where your fist was located would be the new ‘limit’ of the universe. Of course, this process could be reiterated an endless number of times. Since the universe is unlimited in size, there must also be an unlimited number of atoms and an infinite amount of void. If the number of atoms were limited, then the ‘density’ of atoms in any region would effectively be zero, and there would be no macroscopic bodies, as there evidently are. And there must be an unlimited amount of void, since without a limitless amount of void, the infinite number of atoms would be unable to move.

c. Differences from Democritus

Up to this point, Epicurus is largely following the thought of Democritus, a pre-Socratic philosopher and one of the inventors of atomism. However, he modifies Democritus’ atomism in at least three important ways.

i. Weight

The first is that Epicurus thinks that atoms have weight. Like Democritus, Epicurus believes that atoms have the properties of size, shape, and resistance. Democritus explains all atomic motion as the result of previous atomic collisions, plus the inertia of atoms. Aristotle, however, criticizes Democritus on this point, saying that Democritus has not explained why it is that atoms move at all, rather than simply standing still. Epicurus seems to be answering this criticism when he says that atoms do have a natural motion of direction–’downward’–even though there is no bottom to the universe. This natural motion is supposed to give an explanation for why atoms move in the first place. Also, Epicurus thinks that it is evident that bodies do tend to travel down, all else being equal, and he thinks that positing weight as an atomic property accounts for this better than thinking all atomic motion is the result of past collisions and inertia.

ii. The Swerve

The second modification of Democritus’ views is the addition of the ‘swerve.’ In addition to the regular tendency of atoms to move downward, Epicurus thinks that occasionally, and at random times, the atoms swerve to the side. One reason for this swerve is that it is needed to explain why there are atomic collisions. The natural tendency of atoms is to fall straight downward, at uniform velocity. If this were the only natural atomic motion, the atoms never would have collided with one another, forming macroscopic bodies. As Lucretius puts it, they would ‘fall downward, like drops of rain, through the deep void.’ The second reason for thinking that atoms swerve is that a random atomic motion is needed to preserve human freedom and ‘break the bonds of fate,’ as Lucretius says. If the laws of atomic motion are deterministic, then the past positions of the atoms in the universe, plus these laws, determine everything that will occur, including human action. Cicero reports that Epicurus worries that, if it has been true from eternity that, e.g., “Milo will wrestle tomorrow,” then presently deliberating about whether to make it true or false would be idle.

iii. Sensible Qualities

The third difference between Epicurus and Democritus has to do with their attitudes toward the reality of sensible properties. Democritus thinks that, in reality, only atoms and the void exist, and that sensible qualities such as sweetness, whiteness, and the like exist only ‘by convention.’ It is controversial exactly how to understand Democritus’ position, but most likely he is asserting that atoms themselves have no sensible qualities–they are simply extended bits of stuff. The sensible qualities that we think bodies have, like sweetness, are not really in the object at all, but are simply subjective states of the percipient’s awareness produced by the interaction of bodies with our sense-organs. This is shown, thinks Democritus, by the fact that the same body appears differently to different percipients depending on their bodily constitution, e.g., that a ‘white’ body appears yellow to somebody with jaundice, or that honey tastes bitter to an ill person. From this, Democritus derives skeptical conclusions. He is pessimistic about our ability to gain any knowledge about the world on the basis of our senses, since they systematically deceive us about the way the world is.

Epicurus wants to resist these pessimistic conclusions. He argues that properties like sweetness, whiteness, and such do not exist at the atomic level–individual atoms are not sweet or white–but that these properties are nonetheless real. These are properties of macroscopic bodies, but the possession of these properties by macroscopic bodies are explicable in terms of the properties of and relations amongst the individual atoms that make up bodies. Epicurus thinks that bodies have the capability to cause us to have certain types of experiences because of their atomic structure, and that such capabilities are real properties of the bodies. Similar considerations apply for properties like “being healthy,” “being deadly,” and “being enslaved.” They are real, but can only apply to groups of atoms (like people), not individual atoms. And these sorts of properties are also relational properties, not intrinsic ones. For example, cyanide is deadly–not deadly per se, but deadly for human beings (and perhaps for other types of organisms). Nonetheless, its deadliness for us is still a real property of the cyanide, albeit a relational one.

d. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena

One important aspect of Epicurus’ philosophy is his desire to replace teleological (goal-based) explanations of natural phenomena with mechanistic ones. His main target is mythological explanations of meteorological occurrences and the like in terms of the will of the gods. Because Epicurus wishes to banish the fear of the gods, he insists that occurrences like earthquakes and lightning can be explained entirely in atomic terms and are not due to the will of the gods. Epicurus is also against the intrinsic teleology of philosophers like Aristotle. Teeth appear to be well-designed for the purpose of chewing. Aristotle thinks that this apparent purposiveness in nature cannot be eliminated, and that the functioning of the parts of organisms must be explained by appealing to how they contribute to the functioning of the organism as a whole. Other philosophers, such as the Stoics, took this apparent design as evidence for the intelligence and benevolence of God. Epicurus, however, following Empedocles, tries to explain away this apparent purposiveness in nature in a proto-Darwinian way, as the result of a process of natural selection.

e. The Gods

Because of its denial of divine providence, Epicureanism was often charged in antiquity with being a godless philosophy, although Epicurus and his followers denied the charge. The main upshot of Epicurean theology is certainly negative, however. Epicurus’ mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena are supposed to displace explanations that appeal to the will of the gods. In addition, Epicurus is one of the earliest philosophers we know of to have raised the Problem of Evil, arguing against the notion that the world is under the providential care of a loving deity by pointing out the manifold suffering in the world.

Despite this, Epicurus says that there are gods, but these gods are quite different from the popular conception of gods. We have a conception of the gods, says Epicurus, as supremely blessed and happy beings. Troubling oneself about the miseries of the world, or trying to administer the world, would be inconsistent with a life of tranquility, says Epicurus, so the gods have no concern for us. In fact, they are unaware of our existence, and live eternally in the intermundia, the space between the cosmoi. For Epicurus, the gods function mainly as ethical ideals, whose lives we can strive to emulate, but whose wrath we need not fear.

Ancient critics thought the Epicurean gods were a thin smoke-screen to hide Epicurus’ atheism, and difficulties with a literal interpretation of Epicurus’ sayings on the nature of the gods (for instance, it appears inconsistent with Epicurus’ atomic theory to hold that any compound body, even a god, could be immortal) have led some scholars to conjecture that Epicurus’ ‘gods’ are thought-constructs, and exist only in human minds as idealizations, i.e., the gods exist, but only as projections of what the most blessed life would be.

f. Philosophy of Mind

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to put forward an Identity Theory of Mind. In modern versions of the identity theory, the mind is identified with the brain, and mental processes are identified with neural processes. Epicurus’ physiology is quite different; the mind is identified as an organ that resides in the chest, since the common Greek view was that the chest, not the head, is the seat of the emotions. However, the underlying idea is quite similar. (Note: not all commentators accept that Epicurus’ theory is actually an Identity Theory.)

The main point that Epicurus wants to establish is that the mind is something bodily. The mind must be a body, thinks Epicurus, because of its ability to interact with the body. The mind is affected by the body, as vision, drunkenness, and disease show. Likewise, the mind affects the body, as our ability to move our limbs when we want to and the physiological effects of emotional states show. Only bodies can interact with other bodies, so the mind must be a body. Epicurus says that the mind cannot be something incorporeal, as Plato thinks, since the only thing that is not a body is void, which is simply empty space and cannot act or be acted upon.

The mind, then, is an organ in the body, and mental processes are identified with atomic processes. The mind is composed of four different types of particles–fire, air, wind, and the “nameless element,” which surpasses the other particles in its fineness. Although Epicurus is reticent about the details, some features of the mind are accounted for in terms of the features of these atoms–for instance, the mind is able to be moved a great deal by the impact of an image (which is something quite flimsy), because of the smallness of the particles that make up the mind. The mind proper, which is primarily responsible for sensation and thought, is located in the chest, but Epicurus thinks that there is also a ‘spirit,’ spread throughout the rest of the body, which allows the mind to communicate with it. The mind and spirit play roles very similar to those of the central and peripheral nervous systems in modern theory.

One important result of Epicurus’ philosophy of mind is that death is annihilation. The mind is able to engage in the motions of sensation and thought only when it is housed in the body and the atoms that make it up are properly arranged. Upon death, says Epicurus, the container of the body shatters, and the atoms disperse in the air. The atoms are eternal, but the mind made up of these atoms is not, just as other compound bodies cease to exist when the atoms that make them up disperse.

g. Perception

Epicurus explains perception in terms of the interaction of atoms with the sense-organs. Objects continually throw off one-atom-thick layers, like the skin peeling off of an onion. These images, or “eidola,” fly through the air and bang into one’s eyes, from which one learns about the properties of the objects that threw off these eidola. This explains vision. Other senses are analyzed in similar terms; e.g., the soothing action of smooth atoms on the tongue causes the sensation of sweetness. As noted above, Epicurus maintains that such sensible qualities are real qualities of bodies.

4. Epistemology

Epicurus’ epistemology is resolutely empiricist and anti-skeptical. All of our knowledge ultimately comes from the senses, thinks Epicurus, and we can trust the senses, when properly used. Epicurus’ epistemology was contained in his work the ‘Canon,’ or ‘measuring stick,’ which is lost, so many of the details of his views are unavailable to us. 4a. The Canon: sensations, preconceptions, and feelings

Epicurus says that there are three criteria of truth: sensations, ‘preconceptions,’ and feelings. Sensations give us information about the external world, and we can test the judgments based upon sensations against further sensations; e.g., a provisional judgment that a tower is round, based upon sensation, can be tested against later sensations to be corroborated or disproved. Epicurus says that all sensations give us information about the world, but that sensation itself is never in error, since sensation is a purely passive, mechanical reception of images and the like by sense-organs, and the senses themselves do not make judgments ‘that’ the world is this way or that. Instead, error enters in when we make judgments about the world based upon the information received through the senses.

Epicurus thinks that, in order to make judgments about the world, or even to start any inquiry whatsoever, we must already be in possession of certain basic concepts, which stand in need of no further proof or definition, on pain of entering into an infinite regress. This concern is similar to the Paradox of Inquiry explored by Plato in the Meno, that one must already know about something in order to be able to inquire about it. However, instead of postulating that our immaterial souls had acquaintance with transcendent Forms in a pre-natal existence, as Plato does, Epicurus thinks that we have certain ‘preconceptions’–concepts such as ‘body,’ ‘person,’ ‘usefulness,’ and ‘truth’–which are formed in our (material) minds as the result of repeated sense-experiences of similar objects. Further ideas are formed by processes of analogy or similarity or by compounding these basic concepts. Thus, all ideas are ultimately formed on the basis of sense-experience.

Feelings of pleasure and pain form the basic criteria for what is to be sought and avoided.

b. Anti-skeptical Arguments

Epicurus is concerned to refute the skeptical tendencies of Democritus, whose metaphysics and theory of perception were similar to Epicurus’. At least three separate anti-skeptical arguments are given by Epicureans:

i. The “Lazy Argument”

Epicurus says that it is impossible to live as a skeptic. If a person really were to believe that he knows nothing, then he would have no reason to engage in one course of action instead of another. Thus, the consistent skeptic would engage in no action whatsoever, and would die.

ii. The Self-refutation Argument

If a skeptic claims that nothing can be known, then one should ask whether he knows that nothing can be known. If he says ‘yes,’ then he is contradicting himself. If he doesn’t say yes, then he isn’t making a claim, and we don’t need to listen to him.

iii. The Argument from Concept-formation

If the skeptic says that nothing can be known, or that we cannot know the truth, we can ask him where he gets his knowledge of concepts such as ‘knowledge’ and ‘truth.’ If the senses cannot be relied on, as the skeptic claims, then he is not entitled to use concepts such as ‘knowledge’ and ‘truth’ in formulating his thesis, since such concepts derive from the senses.

5. Ethics

Epicurus’ ethics is a form of egoistic hedonism; i.e., he says that the only thing that is intrinsically valuable is one’s own pleasure; anything else that has value is valuable merely as a means to securing pleasure for oneself. However, Epicurus has a sophisticated and idiosyncratic view of the nature of pleasure, which leads him to recommend a virtuous, moderately ascetic life as the best means to securing pleasure. This contrasts Epicurus strongly with the Cyrenaics, a group of ancient hedonists who better fit the stereotype of hedonists as recommending a policy of “eat, drink, and be merry.”

a. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical

Epicurus’ ethics starts from the Aristotelian commonplace that the highest good is what is valued for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else, and Epicurus agrees with Aristotle that happiness is the highest good. However, he disagrees with Aristotle by identifying happiness with pleasure. Epicurus gives two reasons for this. The main reason is that pleasure is the only thing that people do, as a matter of fact, value for its own sake; that is, Epicurus’ ethical hedonism is based upon his psychological hedonism. Everything we do, claims Epicurus, we do for the sake ultimately of gaining pleasure for ourselves. This is supposedly confirmed by observing the behavior of infants, who, it is claimed, instinctively pursue pleasure and shun pain. This is also true of adults, thinks Epicurus, but in adults it is more difficult to see that this is true, since adults have much more complicated beliefs about what will bring them pleasure. But the Epicureans did spend a great deal of energy trying to make plausible the contention that all activity, even apparently self-sacrificing activity or activity done solely for the sake of virtue or what is noble, is in fact directed toward obtaining pleasure for oneself.

The second proof, which fits in well with Epicurus’ empiricism, supposedly lies in one’s introspective experience. One immediately perceives that pleasure is good and that pain is bad, in the same way that one immediately perceives that fire is hot; no further argument is needed to show the goodness of pleasure or the badness of pain. (Of course, this does not establish Epicurus’ further contention that only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and only pain is intrinsically bad.)

Although all pleasures are good and all pains evil, Epicurus says that not all pleasures are choiceworthy or all pains to be avoided. Instead, one should calculate what is in one’s long-term self-interest, and forgo what will bring pleasure in the short-term if doing so will ultimately lead to greater pleasure in the long-term.

b. Types of Pleasure

For Epicurus, pleasure is tied closely to satisfying one’s desires. He distinguishes between two different types of pleasure: ‘moving’ pleasures and ‘static’ pleasures. ‘Moving’ pleasures occur when one is in the process of satisfying a desire, e.g., eating a hamburger when one is hungry. These pleasures involve an active titillation of the senses, and these feelings are what most people call ‘pleasure.’ However, Epicurus says that after one’s desires have been satisfied, (e.g., when one is full after eating), the state of satiety, of no longer being in need or want, is itself pleasurable. Epicurus calls this a ‘static’ pleasure, and says that these static pleasures are the best pleasures.

Because of this, Epicurus denies that there is any intermediate state between pleasure and pain. When one has unfulfilled desires, this is painful, and when one no longer has unfulfilled desires, this steady state is the most pleasurable of all, not merely some intermediate state between pleasure and pain.

Epicurus also distinguishes between physical and mental pleasures and pains. Physical pleasures and pains concern only the present, whereas mental pleasures and pains also encompass the past (fond memories of past pleasure or regret over past pain or mistakes) and the future (confidence or fear about what will occur). The greatest destroyer of happiness, thinks Epicurus, is anxiety about the future, especially fear of the gods and fear of death. If one can banish fear about the future, and face the future with confidence that one’s desires will be satisfied, then one will attain tranquility (ataraxia), the most exalted state. In fact, given Epicurus’ conception of pleasure, it might be less misleading to call him a ‘tranquillist’ instead of a ‘hedonist.’

c. Types of Desire

Because of the close connection of pleasure with desire-satisfaction, Epicurus devotes a considerable part of his ethics to analyzing different kinds of desires. If pleasure results from getting what you want (desire-satisfaction) and pain from not getting what you want (desire-frustration), then there are two strategies you can pursue with respect to any given desire: you can either strive to fulfill the desire, or you can try to eliminate the desire. For the most part Epicurus advocates the second strategy, that of paring your desires down to a minimum core, which are then easily satisfied.

Epicurus distinguishes between three types of desires: natural and necessary desires, natural but non-necessary desires, and “vain and empty” desires. Examples of natural and necessary desires include the desires for food, shelter, and the like. Epicurus thinks that these desires are easy to satisfy, difficult to eliminate (they are ‘hard-wired’ into human beings naturally), and bring great pleasure when satisfied. Furthermore, they are necessary for life, and they are naturally limited: that is, if one is hungry, it only takes a limited amount of food to fill the stomach, after which the desire is satisfied. Epicurus says that one should try to fulfill these desires.

Vain desires include desires for power, wealth, fame, and the like. They are difficult to satisfy, in part because they have no natural limit. If one desires wealth or power, no matter how much one gets, it is always possible to get more, and the more one gets, the more one wants. These desires are not natural to human beings, but inculcated by society and by false beliefs about what we need; e.g., believing that having power will bring us security from others. Epicurus thinks that these desires should be eliminated.

An example of a natural but non-necessary desire is the desire for luxury food. Although food is needed for survival, one does not need a particular type of food to survive. Thus, despite his hedonism, Epicurus advocates a surprisingly ascetic way of life. Although one shouldn’t spurn extravagant foods if they happen to be available, becoming dependent on such goods ultimately leads to unhappiness. As Epicurus puts it, “If you wish to make Pythocles wealthy, don’t give him more money; rather, reduce his desires.” By eliminating the pain caused by unfulfilled desires, and the anxiety that occurs because of the fear that one’s desires will not be fulfilled in the future, the wise Epicurean attains tranquility, and thus happiness.

d. The Virtues

Epicurus’ hedonism was widely denounced in the ancient world as undermining traditional morality. Epicurus, however, insists that courage, moderation, and the other virtues are needed in order to attain happiness. However, the virtues for Epicurus are all purely instrumental goods–that is, they are valuable solely for the sake of the happiness that they can bring oneself, not for their own sake. Epicurus says that all of the virtues are ultimately forms of prudence, of calculating what is in one’s own best interest. In this, Epicurus goes against the majority of Greek ethical theorists, such as the Stoics, who identify happiness with virtue, and Aristotle, who identifies happiness with a life of virtuous activity. Epicurus thinks that natural science and philosophy itself also are instrumental goods. Natural science is needed in order to give mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena and thus dispel the fear of the gods, while philosophy helps to show us the natural limits of our desires and to dispel the fear of death.

e. Justice

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to give a well-developed contractarian theory of justice. Epicurus says that justice is an agreement “neither to harm nor be harmed,” and that we have a preconception of justice as “what is useful in mutual associations.” People enter into communities in order to gain protection from the dangers of the wild, and agreements concerning the behavior of the members of the community are needed in order for these communities to function, e.g., prohibitions of murder, regulations concerning the killing and eating of animals, and so on. Justice exists only where there are such agreements.

Like the virtues, justice is valued entirely on instrumental grounds, because of its utility for each of the members of society. Epicurus says that the main reason not to be unjust is that one will be punished if one gets caught, and that even if one does not get caught, the fear of being caught will still cause pain. However, he adds that the fear of punishment is needed mainly to keep fools in line, who otherwise would kill, steal, etc. The Epicurean wise man recognizes the usefulness of the laws, and since he does not desire great wealth, luxury goods, political power, or the like, he sees that he has no reason to engage in the conduct prohibited by the laws in any case.

Although justice only exists where there is an agreement about how to behave, that does not make justice entirely ‘conventional,’ if by ‘conventional’ we mean that any behavior dictated by the laws of a particular society is thereby just, and that the laws of a particular society are just for that society. Since the ‘justice contract’ is entered into for the purpose of securing what is useful for the members of the society, only laws that are actually useful are just. Thus, a prohibition of murder would be just, but antimiscegenation laws would not. Since what is useful can vary from place to place and time to time, what laws are just can likewise vary.

f. Friendship

Epicurus values friendship highly and praises it in quite extravagant terms. He says that friendship “dances around the world” telling us that we must “wake to blessedness.” He also says that the wise man is sometimes willing to die for a friend. Because of this, some scholars have thought that in this area, at least, Epicurus abandons his egoistic hedonism and advocates altruism toward friends. This is not clear, however. Epicurus consistently maintains that friendship is valuable because it is one of the greatest means of attaining pleasure. Friends, he says, are able to provide one another the greatest security, whereas a life without friends is solitary and beset with perils. In order for there to be friendship, Epicurus says, there must be trust between friends, and friends have to treat each other as well as they treat themselves. The communities of Epicureans can be seen as embodying these ideals, and these are ideals that ultimately promote ataraxia.

g. Death

One of the greatest fears that Epicurus tries to combat is the fear of death. Epicurus thinks that this fear is often based upon anxiety about having an unpleasant afterlife; this anxiety, he thinks, should be dispelled once one realizes that death is annihilation, because the mind is a group of atoms that disperses upon death.

i. The No Subject of Harm Argument

If death is annihilation, says Epicurus, then it is ‘nothing to us.’ Epicurus’ main argument for why death is not bad is contained in the Letter to Menoeceus and can be dubbed the ‘no subject of harm’ argument. If death is bad, for whom is it bad? Not for the living, since they’re not dead, and not for the dead, since they don’t exist. His argument can be set out as follows:

  1. Death is annihilation.
  2. The living have not yet been annihilated (otherwise they wouldn’t be alive).
  3. Death does not affect the living. (from 1 and 2)
  4. So, death is not bad for the living. (from 3)
  5. For something to be bad for somebody, that person has to exist, at least.
  6. The dead do not exist. (from 1)
  7. Therefore, death is not bad for the dead. (from 5 and 6)
  8. Therefore death is bad for neither the living nor the dead. (from 4 and 7)

Epicurus adds that if death causes you no pain when you’re dead, it’s foolish to allow the fear of it to cause you pain now.

ii. The Symmetry Argument

A second Epicurean argument against the fear of death, the so-called ‘symmetry argument,’ is recorded by the Epicurean poet Lucretius. He says that anyone who fears death should consider the time before he was born. The past infinity of pre-natal non-existence is like the future infinity of post-mortem non-existence; it is as though nature has put up a mirror to let us see what our future non-existence will be like. But we do not consider not having existed for an eternity before our births to be a terrible thing; therefore, neither should we think not existing for an eternity after our deaths to be evil.

6. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it’s a selection of further texts to read for those who want to learn more about Epicurus and Epicureanism. Most of the books listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

a. Collections of Primary Source

  • The Epicurus Reader, translated and edited by Brad Inwood and L.P. Gerson, Hackett Publishing.
    • This inexpensive collection has most of the major extant writings of Epicurus, in addition to other ancient sources such as Cicero and Plutarch who wrote about Epicureanism. (Lucretius is not included much.) However, there is little commentary or explication of the material, and some of the primary sources are fairly opaque.
  • The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: translations of the principal sources, with philosophical commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge University Press.
    • This excellent book organizes the texts into sections topically, (e.g., “Atoms,” “Soul,” “Language,” “Death,”) and follows each selection of texts with commentary and explication. Vol. 2, which contains the original Greek and Latin texts, has a fine, if somewhat dated (1987) bibliography at the end.Lucretius, De Rerum Natura

There are many different editions of Lucretius’ masterpiece, an extended exposition of Epicurus’ metaphysics, philosophy of mind, and natural science. I personally like the translation by Rolfe Humphries: Lucretius: The Way Things Are. The De Rerum Natura of Titus Lucretius Carus, Indiana University Press. Humphries translates Lucretius’ poem as a poem, not as prose, yet the translation is still very clear and readable.

b. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus’ Philosophy

The books below are all well-written and influential. They deal in-depth with problems of interpreting particular areas of Epicurus’ philosophy, while still remaining, for the most part, accessible to well-educated general readers. They also have extensive bibliographies. However, do not assume that the interpretations of Epicurus in these books are always widely accepted.

  • Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind, by Julia Annas, University of California Press.
    • This book deals with Epicurean and Stoic theories of what the mind is.
  • Epicurus’ Ethical Theory : The Pleasures of Invulnerability, by Phillip Mitsis, Cornell University Press.
    • This book is concerned with all of the major areas of Epicurean ethics, from pleasure, to friendship, justice, and human freedom. Mitsis is especially good at showing how Epicurus’ conception of pleasure differs from that of the utilitarians.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press.
    • This book focuses deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but is still a good source of information on Epicurean ethics, especially if one wants to put Epicurean ethics in the context of other ancient ethical theories.
  • Epicurus’ Scientific Method, by Elizabeth Asmis, Cornell University Press.
    • The best book-length treatment of Epicurus’ epistemology available. A little more technical than the books above, but still fairly accessible.

Author Information

Tim O’Keefe
Email: see web page
Georgia State University
U. S. A.