Epiphenomenalism is a position in the philosophy of mind according to which mental states or events are caused by physical states or events in the brain but do not themselves cause anything. It seems as if our mental life affects our body, and, via our body, the physical world surrounding us: it seems that sharp pains make us wince, it seems that fear makes our heart beat faster, it seems that remembering an embarrassing situation makes us blush and it seems that the perception of an old friend makes us smile. In reality, however, these sequences are the result of causal processes at an underlying physical level: what makes us wince is not the pain, but the neurophysiological process which causes the pain; what makes our heart beat faster is not fear, but the state of our nervous system which causes the fear etc. According to a famous analogy of Thomas Henry Huxley, the relationship between mind and brain is like the relationship between the steam-whistle which accompanies the work of a locomotive engine and the engine itself: just as the steam-whistle is caused by the engine’s operations but has no causal influence upon it, so too the mental is caused by the workings of neurophysiological mechanisms but has no causal influence upon their operation.
In the beginning epiphenomenalism was known as the doctrine of “automatism” or as the “conscious automaton theory.” The term “epiphenomenalism” seems to have been introduced in 1890 in William James’s The Principles of Psychology (it occurs once in the chapter entitled “The Automaton-Theory;” other than that James uses the terms “automaton-theory” or “conscious automaton-theory;” see Robinson 2003). The term “epiphenomenon” was used in medicine in the late nineteenth century as a label for a symptom concurrent with, but not causally contributory to, a disease (an epiphenomenon is thus something like a secondary symptom, a mere afterglow of real phenomena). Accordingly, epiphenomenalism in the philosophy of mind holds that our actions have purely physical causes (neurophysiological changes in the brain, say), while our intention, desire or volition to act does not cause our actions but is itself caused by the physical causes of our actions. To assume that regular successions of mental and physical events—volitions followed by appropriate behavior, fear followed by an increased heart rate, pains followed by wincings etc.—reflect causal processes is to commit the fallacy of post hoc, propter hoc: “The soul stands related to the body as the bell of a clock to the works, and consciousness answers to the sound which the bell gives out when it is struck” (Huxley 1874, 242).
One of the first explicit formulations of epiphenomenalism can be found in the Essai de Psychologie of the Swiss naturalist and philosophical writer Charles Bonnet, dating from 1755: “the soul is a mere spectator of the movements of its body; [...] the latter performs of itself all that series of actions which constitutes life; [...] it moves of itself; [...] it is the body alone which reproduces ideas, compares and arranges them; which forms reasonings, imagines and executes plans of all kinds, etc.” (Bonnet 1755, 91). More than a century later, the British philosopher Shadworth Hodgson also expressed the view that “[s]tates of consciousness are not produced by previous states of consciousness, but both are produced by the action of the brain; and, conversely, there is no ground for saying that [...] states of consciousness react upon the brain or modify its action” (Hodgson 1865, part 1, ch. 5, §30). The most prominent articulation and defense of epiphenomenalism, however, stems from the Presidential Address to the British Association for the Advancement of Science of the British biologist, physiologist and philosopher Thomas Henry Huxley, published in 1874 with the suggestive title “On the hypothesis that animals are automata, and its history.” Huxley argued that brute animals and (presumably) human beings are conscious automata: they enjoy a conscious mental life, but their behavior is determined solely by physical mechanisms. Huxley was convinced that the body of humans and animals is a purely physical mechanism and that the physical processes of life are explainable in the same way as all other physical phenomena. This mechanistic conception, he held, “has not only successfully repelled every assault that has been made upon it, but [...] is now the expressed or implied fundamental proposition of the whole doctrine of scientific Physiology” (Huxley 1874, 200). Already Descartes had argued that non-human animals are mere mechanical automata and subject to the same laws as other unconscious matter, and Huxley wholeheartedly embraced Descartes’s defense of automatism by appeal to reflex actions (Huxley 1874, 218). Huxley observed that a frog with certain parts of his brain extracted was unable to initiate actions but nevertheless able to carry out a range of reflex-like actions. Since he thought that the partial leucotomy made sure the frog was totally unconscious, he concluded that consciousness was not necessary for the execution of reflex actions:
The frog walks, hops, swims, and goes through his gymnastic performances quite as well without consciousness, and consequently without volition, as with it; and, if a frog, in his natural state, possesses anything corresponding with what we call volition, there is no reason to think that it is anything but a concomitant of the molecular changes in the brain which form part of the series involved in the production of motion. (Huxley 1874, 240)
Huxley agreed with Descartes that animals are automata, but he was unwilling to accept that they are devoid of mentality: “Sleeping dogs frequently appear to dream. If they do, it must be admitted that ideation goes on in them while they are asleep; and, in that case, there is no reason to doubt that they are conscious” (Huxley 1898, 125). Huxley therefore segregated the question of consciousness from the question of the status of an automaton: animals do experience pain, but that pain is, like their bodily movements, just a result of neurophysiological processes. Animals are conscious automata. In contrast to Descartes, Huxley argued that considerations similar to those about reflex actions in frogs also suggest that we are conscious automata. He referred to a case study of a certain Dr. Mesnet who had examined a French soldier who had suffered severe brain damage during the Franco-Prussian war in 1870. From time to time this soldier fell into a trance-like state in which he was able to execute a series of complex actions while apparently being unconscious:
If the man happens to be in a place to which he is accustomed, he walks about as usual; [...] He eats, drinks, smokes, walks about, dresses and undresses himself, rises and goes to bed at the accustomed hours. Nevertheless, pins may be run into his body, or strong electric shocks sent through it, without causing the least indication of pain; no odorous substance, pleasant or unpleasant, makes the least impression; he eats and drinks with avidity whatever is offered, and takes asafœtida, or vinegar, or quinine, as readily as water; no noise affects him; and light influences him only under certain conditions. (Huxley 1874, 228)
Since Mesnet’s patient could carry out actions ordinarily performed with consciousness as initiating or coordinating element while apparently being unconscious, consciousness did not seem to be necessary for their execution. Since it was impossible to prove that the patient was indeed unconscious in his abnormal state, Huxley did not claim to have proven that humans are conscious automata, but he at least thought that “the case of the frog goes a long way to justify the assumption that, in the abnormal state, the man is a mere insensible machine” (Huxley 1874, 235). Huxley’s naturalistic or mechanistic attitude towards the body convinced him that the brain alone causes behavior. At the same time, his dualism convinced him that the mental is essentially non-physical. He reconciled these apparently discordant claims by degrading mentality to the status of an epiphenomenon.
Most contemporary philosophers reject substance dualism and the question that plagued Descartes–How can an immaterial mind whose nature is to think and a material body whose nature is to be spatially extended causally interact?–no longer arises. Moreover, many philosophers even reject Huxley’s event-dualism in favor of psychophysical event-identities. According to one version of non-reductive physicalism, for instance, every concrete mental event (every event token) is identical to a concrete physical event, although there are no one-one correlations between mental and physical properties (event types). Since fear is identical to the neurophysiological event which causes the increased heart rate, fear causes the increased heart rate, too, and epiphenomenalism seems avoided. However, the charge of epiphenomenalism re-arises in a different guise. There is a forceful intuition that events cause what they cause in virtue of some of their properties. Suppose a soprano sings the word “freedom” at a high pitch and amplitude, causing a nearby window to shatter. The singing which causes the shattering is both the singing of a high C and the singing of the word “freedom.” Intuitively, only the former, not the latter, is causally relevant for the singing’s causing the shattering: “Meaningful sounds, if they occur at the right pitch and amplitude, can shatter glass, but the fact that the sounds have meaning is irrelevant to their effect. The glass would shatter if the sounds meant something completely different or if they meant nothing at all” (Dretske 1989, 1-2). If events cause their effects in virtue of some of their properties but not in virtue of others, the question arises whether mental events (even if they are identical to physical events) cause their effects in virtue of their mental, their physical or both kinds of properties. If mental events cause their effects only in virtue of their physical properties, then their being mental events is causally irrelevant and mental properties are, in a certain sense, epiphenomena (three reasons for thinking that mental properties are causally irrelevant are discussed in section 4b). Following Brian McLaughlin, one can thus distinguish between event- or token-epiphenomenalism on the one hand and property- or type-epiphenomenalism on the other (see McLaughlin 1989, 1994). According to the event- or token-epiphenomenalism defended by Huxley, concrete physical events are causes, but mental events cannot cause anything. According to the kind of property- or type-epiphenomenalism that threatens modern non-reductive physicalism, events are causes in virtue of their physical properties, but no event is a cause in virtue of its mental properties. If event-epiphenomenalism is wrong, mental events can be causes; but if they are causes solely in virtue of their physical properties, property-epiphenomenalism is still true, and some consider this to be no less disconcerting than Huxley’s original epiphenomenalism (see
Arguments in favor of a philosophical theory typically focus on its advantages compared to other theories—that it can explain more phenomena or that it provides a more economical or a more unifying explanation of the relevant phenomena. There are no arguments for epiphenomenalism in that sense. Epiphenomenalism is just not an attractive or desirable theory. Rather, it is a theory of last resort into which people are pushed by the feeling that all the alternatives are even less plausible. Even epiphenomenalists admit that, from the first-person point of view of a thinking and feeling subject, they don’t like it. Why, then, do people embrace epiphenomenalism?
Epiphenomenalism required an intellectual climate in which two apparently discordant beliefs about the world were equally well entrenched: a dualism with respect to mind and body on the one hand and a scientific naturalism or mechanism concerning the body on the other. To most thinkers of the eighteenth and nineteenth century, it seemed obvious that human beings enjoy a mental life that resists incorporation into a purely materialist ontology. Our thoughts, sensations, desires etc. just seemed to be too dissimilar from ordinary physical phenomena for them to be “nothing but” physical phenomena. At the same time, however, science saw the advent of a decidedly naturalistic attitude towards the human body, motivated by the successes of mechanistic physics in other areas and characterized by a desire to identify the underlying causal structure of every observed phenomenon in terms of matter and motion alone. In particular, neurophysiological research was unable to reveal any mental influence upon the brain or the body. Eventually, with the demise of vitalism regarding the forces governing animate life, the conception of the physical as a causally closed system, in which physical forces are the only forces, became almost universally accepted. When combined with the naturalistic assumption that human beings are a part of the physical world and governed by its laws, this left no room for any causal efficacy of our mental life. There simply seemed to be “no gaps” (McLaughlin 1994, 278) in the causal mechanisms that could be filled by non-physical phenomena. Therefore, epiphenomenalism can be regarded as the inevitable result of the attempt to combine a scientific naturalism with respect to the body with a dualism with respect to the mind. Human beings are exhaustively governed by physical laws so that no non-physical causes must be invoked to explain their behavior, but since they are also subjects of non-physical minds, these minds must be causally irrelevant. Whenever our trust in the causal authority of the physical is overwhelmed by our first-person experience of ourselves as creatures with an essentially non-physical mind, epiphenomenalism is waiting in the wings. This holds for Huxley’s version of epiphenomenalism no less than for modern property-epiphenomenalism–both are driven by the idea that some of our mental life is distinct from that part of the physical that is the ultimate and only authority with regard to causation.
Those who defend epiphenomenalism typically do so because they fail to see how it could not be true. How could our mind make a causal difference to our physical body? This is the so-called “problem of mental causation.” That there is mental causation is part and parcel of our self-conception as freely deliberating agents that are the causal origins of their actions and do what they do because they have the beliefs and desires they have. Yet, the How of mental causation constitutes a serious philosophical problem. Its solution requires an account that shows exactly how the mental fits into the causal structure of an otherwise physical world in such a way as to exert a genuine causal influence, and any such account faces at least three difficulties. First, causation seems to require laws, but there are grounds for denying the existence of appropriate laws connecting the mental and the physical (the “Argument from the Anomaly of the Mental”). Second, causation is arguably a local or intrinsic affair, while in the case of beliefs and desires, for instance, those aspects constitutive of them insofar as they are mental are arguably relational or extrinsic (the “Argument from Anti-Individualism”). Third, we do not understand how the mental can be causally efficacious without coming into conflict with other parts of the causal structure we know (or at least suspect) to play an indispensable causal role in the production of physical effects (the “Argument from Causal Exclusion”).
The Anomalous Monism of Donald Davidson was one of the earliest versions of non-reductive physicalism (see Davidson 1970). Davidson devised it to reconcile the idea that the mental is part of the physical causal network with the idea that we are autonomous agents in voluntary control of our actions. The problem is that the latter idea requires, while the former explicitly denies, that “[m]ental events such as perceivings, rememberings, decisions, and actions resist capture in the nomological net of physical theory” (Davidson 1970, 207). On the one hand, since cause and effect must always fall under a strict causal law, if the mental is to be causally efficacious, it must be subject to strict laws. On the other hand, we can be autonomous agents only if the mental is not part of the potentially deterministic nomological network of physics; true autonomy requires that there be no strict laws connecting mental events with other mental events or with physical events and that the concepts necessary to describe, explain and predict actions and to ascribe attitudes not be reducible by definition or natural law to the concepts employed by physical sciences (Davidson 1970, 212). The exact nature of Davidson’s argument for this “anomaly of the mental” is a matter of dispute, but his idea seems to be that the existence of strict psychophysical or psychological laws, together with the strict and potentially deterministic physical laws, would be at odds with the essentially holistic and rational nature of belief attributions (Davidson 1970, 219-221.) If causation requires causes and effects to fall under strict laws, and if there are no strict laws concerning mental events, mental causation seems to be impossible. This is the “Argument from the Anomaly of the Mental.” One response would be to abandon the requirement that causes and effects must fall under strict laws. Another response would be to retain the causal law requirement but to deny that the mental is anomalous in the relevant sense. Davidson himself did neither of these. His Anomalous Monism was designed to show that mental causation is in fact compatible with the causal law requirement and the absence of strict psychological and psychophysical laws. Davidson derived Anomalous Monism from the following three seemingly inconsistent premises: (1) Principle of Causal Interaction: At least some mental events causally interact with physical events. (2) Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality: Events related as cause and effect fall under strict causal laws. (3) Principle of the Anomalism of the Mental: There are no strict psychological or psychophysical laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained. (1) and (2) apparently imply the falsity of (3): “it is natural to reason that the first two principles [...] together imply that at least some mental events can be predicted and explained on the basis of laws, while the principle of the anomalism of the mental denies this” (Davidson 1970, 209). Davidson’s goal was to interpret (1), (2), and (3) in such a way that they are not only consistent but jointly entail that particular mental events which causally interact with other events are identical to physical events. According to Davidson, (1) is an extensional claim about a relation between particular events: although the assertion of the causal relation between two events c and e requires describing them, the causal relation itself holds “no matter how they are described” (Davidson 1993, 6; 1970, 215). In contrast, (2) and (3) concern laws. Since “laws are linguistic” (Davidson 1970, 215) and thus an intensional affair, particular events fall under laws “only as described.” (2) says that whenever two events c and e are related as cause and effect, there are descriptions “dc” and “de” of c and e, respectively, under which c and e instantiate a causal law, although there may be descriptions “d*c” and “d*e” under which they do not instantiate a causal law (although “d*c caused d*e” is nevertheless a true singular causal statement). Given this, it is easy to see why Davidson thinks that (1), (2), and (3) entail that mental events which causally interact with other events must be identical to physical events. By (1), some mental event m causes or is caused by a physical event p. By (2), m and p must therefore instantiate a strict causal law. That is, there must be descriptions “dm” and “dp” of m and p, respectively, such that “dm-events cause dp-events” (or “dp-events cause dm-events”) is a strict causal law. By (3), this can only be a physical law. Hence, “dm” and “dp” must belong to the vocabulary of physics. Since events are mental or physical “only as described” and since m has with “dm” at least one physical description, m must thus be a physical event (Davidson 1970, 224). However, while causation may admittedly be an extensional relation between particular events, many philosophers have argued that which causal relations an event enters into is determined by which event-types it falls under. The singing’s being the singing of a high C, it seems, is causally relevant for its causing the shattering, while its being the singing of the word “freedom” is not. According to Anomalous Monism, Davidson’s critics claim, only the strict laws of physics can be causal laws, and hence events seem to be causally related only in virtue of falling under physical event-types, rendering mental event-types causally irrelevant:
Davidson’s argument for Anomalous Monism shows that any causal relation involving a mental event and a physical event holds only because a strict physical law subsumes the two events under physical kinds or descriptions. The fact that the mental event is a mental event, or that it is the kind of mental event that it is, appears to be entirely immaterial to the causal relation. [...] Individual mental events [...] do have causal efficacy, but only because they fall under physical kinds, and the mental kinds that they are have [...] nothing to say about what causal relations they enter into. The causal structure of the world is wholly determined by the physical kinds and properties instantiated by events of this world. (Kim 2003b, 126)
This is a prominent objection against Anomalous Monism (see, for example, Honderich 1982; Kim 1989a, 1993a; Sosa 1993). Anomalous Monism may avoid token- or event-physicalism, but it seems to succumb to type- or property-epiphenomenalism: mental events, by being identical to physical events, are causally efficacious, but that they are the kind of mental event they are adds nothing to their causal efficacy (for responses on behalf of Anomalous Monism see Campbell 1997, 1998; Davidson 1993; Lepore & Loewer 1987; McLaughlin 1989).
Anti-individualism or externalism holds that the content of mental states and the meaning of some natural language terms is a relational, or extrinsic, rather than a local, or intrinsic, property (see Burge 1979; Putnam 1975). What are local or relational properties? Suppose Sarah weighs 110 pounds, is four foot five, has blond hair and is taller than Jack. The first three properties seem to be local in the sense that they supervene upon Sarah’s internal make-up and Sarah can acquire or loose them only if she herself undergoes some change. The fourth property, in contrast, seems to be relational in the sense that Sarah has it only by courtesy of certain external facts, namely, only if there is someone else, Jack, who is smaller than she is. If Jack grows tall enough, Sarah loses the property of being taller than Jack, although she herself does not undergo any change. According to Hilary Putnam, meanings of natural kind terms are relational properties (see Putnam 1975). What Sarah means by an utterance of, say, “water,” “tiger,” “elm,” or “gold” is not determined solely by her internal make-up, but also by her environment. Consequently, such terms can mean different things in the mouth of molecularly identical twins that are indistinguishable with regard to their local properties. Meanings “just ain’t in the head,” as Putnam famously put it. Moreover, the contents of the corresponding thoughts seem to be relational properties, too: what Sarah believes when she has a belief she would express as, say, “Water is wet” is determined by the way the world is and not solely by how things are “inside” her. Tyler Burge went even further and argued that natural kind terms are not the only terms whose meaning is determined by external factors and that not only differences in the physical environment can affect the meaning of a term or the content of a belief, but also differences in a subject’s historical, linguistic, or social environment (see Burge 1979). Externalism or anti-individualism makes mental causation problematic. Causality seems to be an entirely local affair in the sense that a system’s behavior apparently supervenes upon its internal make-up. Consequently, two systems exactly alike in all internal respects will behave in exactly the same way, so that relational properties like being a genuine dollar coin or being a photo of Sarah do not seem to make a difference to the behavior of, say, a vending machine or a scanner: as long as the piece of metal inserted into a vending machine has a certain set of local properties, the vending machine will exhibit a certain behavior, no matter whether the piece of mental inserted is a genuine dollar coin or a counterfeit, and a scanner will produce a certain distribution of pixels on the screen, no matter whether the object scanned is a photo of Sarah or a piece of paper locally indistinguishable from a photo of Sarah. The assumption that causation is a local affair, when combined with externalism or anti-individualism, leads to epiphenomenalism: the meaning or content of a mental state, being a relational property, threatens to be as irrelevant for our behavior as the property of being a genuine dollar coin is for the behavior of a vending machine. In order to avoid epiphenomenalism, we must either eschew anti-individualism or show how relational mental properties can make a causal difference. Jerry Fodor tried to explicate a notion of “narrow content” according to which the mental states of intrinsically indistinguishable subjects must have the same contents, although their relationally individuated “wide contents” may differ (see Fodor 1987, ch. 1, 1991). Since narrow contents supervene upon the intrinsic make-up of a subject, Fodor held, the charge of epiphenomenalism can be avoided. However, he has recently given up on this idea because it proved extremely difficult to say exactly what narrow contents are (see Fodor 1995). Frank Jackson and Philip Pettit argue that relational properties can be causally relevant in virtue of figuring in so called “program explanations,” although strictly speaking the causal work is done solely by local properties (see, for example, Jackson & Pettit 1990). In a similar vein, Lynne Rudder Baker and Tyler Burge claim that the charge of epiphenomenalism “just melts away” (Baker 1993, 93) if we acknowledge that our explanatory practice which undoubtedly treats explanations in terms of relational properties as causal explanations trumps any metaphysical armchair argument to the contrary (see Baker 1993, 1995; Burge 1993). And Fred Dretske argues that while the triggering causes of behavior are always local, relational mental properties can make a causal difference in virtue of being structuring causes of behavior, that is, in virtue of structuring a causal system in such a way that the occurrence of a triggering neurophysiological cause causes a given behavioral effect (see, for example, Dretske 1988).
Most philosophers nowadays defend some version of non-reductive physicalism. According to non-reductive physicalism, all scientifically respectable entities are physical entities, where entities which cannot be straightforwardly reduced to physical entities—mental events or properties, for instance—are physical at least in the broad sense that they supervene or depend upon physical entities. Non-reductive physicalism is attractive because it promises to respect the naturalistic attitude characteristic of our modern scientific time while at the same time also preserving our self-conception as autonomous agents. For decades, however, Jaegwon Kim has argued that non-reductive physicalists unwittingly commit themselves to epiphenomenalism. His master argument is the so-called Causal Exclusion Argument, which he uses as a reductio ad absurdum of non-reductive physicalism: if the mental were merely supervenient upon but not reducible to the physical, as non-reductive physicalism holds, it would be causally irrelevant (barring overdetermination). Non-reductive physicalism is thus unable to steer a safe path between the Scylla of reductionism on the one hand and the Charybdis of epiphenomenalism on the other, so that those unwilling to embrace outright reductionism are forced to accept epiphenomenalism. Kim’s most recent version of the Causal Exclusion Argument, the so-called Supervenience Argument, has two stages. Stage one holds that mental properties (or, rather, their instances–a qualification that will be omitted from now on) can cause other mental properties only if they can cause physical properties. Stage two then holds that mental properties can cause physical properties only if they are reducible to physical properties or genuinely overdetermining. Since overdetermination can be ruled out, the only remaining alternatives are “reduction or causal impotence” (Kim 2005, 54). Suppose a mental property M causes a mental property M*. Since mind-body supervenience “is a shared minimum commitment of all positions that are properly called physicalist” (Kim 2005, 13), non-reductive physicalism must posit a physical supervenience base P* of M* which is (non-causally) sufficient for M*. What, then, is responsible for M*’s occurrence—M or P*? There appears to be “a tension between vertical determination and horizontal causation” (Kim 2003a, 153): “under the assumption of mind-body supervenience, M* occurs because its supervenience base P* occurs, and as long as P* occurs, M* must occur [...] regardless of whether or not an instance of M preceded it. This puts the claim of M to be a cause of M* in jeopardy: P* alone seems fully responsible for, and capable of accounting for, the occurrence of M*” (Kim 1998, 42). The upshot of this first stage of the argument is that the tension between M and P* can be resolved only by accepting that “M caused M* by causing its supervenience base P*” (Kim 2005, 40). Stage two then goes on to argue that mental-to-physical causation is impossible. Given the so-called causal closure of the physical, P* must have a sufficient and completely physical cause P, leading to a competition between M and P for the role of P*’s cause. Barring overdetermination, M seems bound to loose this competition: if P is a sufficient cause of P*, then once P is instantiated all that is required for P* to occur is done and there is nothing left for M to contribute, causally speaking. This completes stage two of the Causal Exclusion Argument. Both steps together seem to lead to epiphenomenalism–unless mental properties are reducible or genuinely overdetermining, they must be causally inert, so that with the overdetermination option and the reduction option ruled out, epiphenomenalism is the inevitable consequence. In response, non-reductive physicalists have offered compatibilist accounts of mental causation designed to explain how irreducible mental properties can play a substantial causal role in the production of physical effects, given that the causal work is done solely by physical properties. The common core of these attempts is the idea that there is some compatibilist condition C such that (1.) fulfilling C is sufficient for being causally relevant; (2.) properties which do not do any real causal work can fulfill C; (3.) C can be fulfilled by two or more properties without leading to any kind of “causal competition;” and (4.) mental properties can fulfill C. Prominent compatibilist candidates for C include figuring in counterfactual dependencies (see LePore & Loewer 1987) or program explanations (see Jackson & Pettit 1990), being a determinable of the physical properties which do the causal work (see Yablo 1992), or falling under non-strict causal laws (see Fodor 1989; McLaughlin 1989).
Intuition tells us that we, as conscious selves, are in charge of our actions, and the man in the street finds the idea that consciousness is a causally irrelevant by-product of brain processes preposterous. Empirical scientists, however, have long questioned these assumptions. Many of them think that the brain causes our actions and then makes us think that it was us who did it: “The unique human convenience of conscious thoughts that preview our actions gives us the privilege of feeling we willfully cause what we do. In fact, unconscious and inscrutable mechanisms create both conscious thought about action and the action, and also produce the sense of will we experience by perceiving the thought as cause of the action” (Wegner 2002, 98). No empirical research has provoked more philosophical discussion than Benjamin Libet’s experiments concerning the relationship between unconscious brain activity and the subjective feeling of volition during the initiation of simple motor actions (see Libet et al. 1983; Libet 1985). Previous research had shown that actions that are perceived to be the result of a conscious feeling of volition are also preceded by a pattern of brain activity known as the “readiness potential.” The question Libet and his colleagues wanted to answer was: What comes first—the feeling of volition or the readiness potential? They instructed subjects to perform a simple motor activity, like pressing a button, within a certain time frame at an arbitrary moment decided by them (“Let the urge to act appear on its own any time without any preplanning or concentration on when to act”; Libet et al. 1983, 625). The subjects were asked to remember exactly when they made the decision, when they were first aware of the “urge to act,” by noticing the position of a dot circling a clock face (the “clock” being a cathode ray oscilloscope modified so as to be able to measure time intervals of roughly fifty milliseconds). The time when the action was carried out, when the subjects actually pressed the button, was measured by electronically recording the position of the dot. On average, it took about 200 milliseconds from the first conscious feeling of voliton to the actual pressing of the button. But Libet and his collaborators also recorded the subjects’ brain activity by means of an EEG. They found that an increased electrical activity, the so-called “readiness potential,” was built up (primarily in the secondary motor cortex) on average approximately 500 milliseconds before the button was pushed, and that means approximately 300 milliseconds before the subjects felt the conscious “urge to act” (Libet’s experiments have been repeated and improved several times; see, e.g. Keller & Heckhausen 1990; Haggard & Eimer 1999; Miller & Trevena 2002; Trevena & Miller 2002). It is tempting to interpret this result as showing that the allegedly free decision of the subject was in fact determined by unconscious brain processes and that, at least insofar as decisions to act are concerned, our mind is a mere epiphenomenon, but it remains a controversial issue exactly what philosophical consequences we ought to draw from Libet’s experiments (see Pockett et al. 2006).
Epiphenomenalism has had few friends. It has been deemed “thoughtless and incoherent” (Taylor 1927, 198), “unintelligible” (Benecke 1901, 26), “quite impossible to believe” (Taylor 1963, 28) and “truly incredible” (McLaughlin 1994, 284). The resistance stems from the fact that many think that if epiphenomenalism were correct, we could not be the kind of being we are and we could not occupy the place in the world we occupy. We would instead be at the mercy of our brains and we would have to say that our actions are all our brains’ actions and that ultimately “we” have nothing to do with them.
If the eyebrows are raised they are not raised by us. What is done is not done by us. [...] We go piggy-back, and we cannot get off. Where it goes, we go. What’s “it”? The body/brain is “it.” “It” is not us, is the point. Epiphenomenalism would be the ruin of the self and that self’s life. […] Our supposed self is illusory, and we are deluded. [...] We lose ourselves when consciousness ceases to be effective in what we chose. (Hyslop 1998, 68)
In his book The Fundamental Questions of Philosophy, Alfred Cyril Ewing introduced epiphenomenalism as a theory that can be disposed of in a “conclusive fashion” (Ewing 1953, 127): “That epiphenomenalism is false is assumed in all practical life [...] and it is silly to adopt a philosophy the denial of which is implied by us every time we do anything” (Ewing 1953, 128). But what exactly is it that renders epiphenomenalism so evidently absurd?
Epiphenomenalism is counterintuitive. There’s no doubt about that. Yet, philosophy, like all science, is not concerned with intuitiveness but with truth, and that a theory is counterintuitive does not show that it is not true. In fact, a host of widely accepted and feted theories are counterintuitive at first and some remain so forever: the Copernican system, the Freudian theory of the unconscious, Einstein’s theories of special and general relativity or quantum mechanics. Einstein’s theory of relativity, for instance, is much less intuitive than Newtonian physics, but ultimately the fate of a theory depends on whether there are good arguments in favor of it, not on whether it is intuitive. If there are reasons for taking epiphenomenalism seriously, then we should do that, just as we do it in the case of the theory of relativity: “Epiphenomenalism may be counterintuitive, but it is not obviously false, so if a sound argument forces it on us, we should accept it” (Chalmers 1996, 159).
It might seem as if we can be introspectively aware of chains of mental occurrences, one of which is causing the other, for instance when we reason through an argument, write a piece of prose, or acquire a new belief by inferring it from previously held beliefs. We just know, it seems, that in these cases there is mental causation. The same may be said to be true of various chains of occurrences both inside and outside of our mind, for instance when volitions give rise to appropriate behavior, when a pain results in a wincing, or when fear makes our heart beat faster–one might say that in these cases, too, we have some immediate cognitive access to the causal efficacy of the mental. If we could indeed be in some sense “directly acquainted” with the fact that such sequences are the result of genuinely causal processes, epiphenomenalism would not be an option. Yet, our awareness of regular successions does not and cannot reveal their causal nature. The awareness of the psychological or psychophysical sequences that make up our everyday life is no more awareness of causal processes than awareness of the sequence of shadows a moving car casts (Lachs 1963, 189). Whatever those who hold that epiphenomenalism is “incompetent to take account of the obvious facts of mental life” (Taylor 1927, 198) mean, they cannot mean that it is contradicted by our immediate cognitive access to our mind’s causal effectiveness, because there is no phenomenological difference between a situation in which epiphenomenalism is false and a situation in which epiphenomenalism is true.
One of the earliest objections to epiphenomenalism starts with the observation that we have the properties we have because they contributed positively to our ancestors’ differential fitness and that a property which endows an organism with an evolutionary advantage must make a causal difference to its survival. Since we have mental properties, while our ancient ancestors did not, the argument continues, these properties must have evolved over time and therefore must be capable of making a causal difference (this argument is frequently attributed to Popper & Eccles 1977, but it was endorsed already by James 1879). Epiphenomenalists respond that mental properties may have evolved as nomologically necessary by-products of adaptive traits. A polar bear’s having a heavy coat decreases its fitness (by slowing it down), but is nevertheless an evolved trait because it was an inevitable by-product of a highly adaptive trait, namely, having a warm coat: “Having a heavy coat is an unavoidable concomitant of having a warm coat [...], and the advantages for survival of having a warm coat outweighed the disadvantages of having a heavy one” (Jackson 1982, 134). Likewise, it could be that we enjoy our mental life because its neurophysiological causes contributed positively to our ancestors’ differential fitness by making them “fitter” compared to those who lacked such neurophysiological equipment. Maybe we have a mind because it was evolutionary adaptive to have a big brain and it is nomologically impossible to have a big brain without having a mind. The problem with this response is that while we understand perfectly well why polar bears can have warm coats only in virtue of having heavy coats, we have little or no idea why it should be necessary to have a mind in order to have a big brain. Why should of all neurophysiological structures only those with a causally irrelevant mind as by-product be able to do what was required for our ancestors’ survival? If a company claims that religion is not an employment criterion, but it turns out that all its employees are of the same religion, that cries out for an explanation, and the same holds if the epiphenomenalist claims that although our mind is totally ineffective, during the course of evolution only brain structures have evolved that are accompanied by a mind as a by-product.
Another problem is that epiphenomenalism seems to render our standard response to the other minds problem impossible. According to that response, our belief that our fellow human beings have a mental life similar to ours is justified by an argument from analogy, stated in its classic form by John Stuart Mill and Bertrand Russell (Mill 1865, 190-191; Russell 1948, 208-209 & 501-504). Since our own body and outward behavior are observably similar to the body and the behavior of our fellow human beings, we are justified by analogy in believing that they enjoy a mental life similar to ours. The idea is to infer like mental causes from like behavioral effects and this does not work for the epiphenomenalist who denies that there are any mental causes. (This is an objection to epiphenomenalism only if the argument from analogy does indeed provide a good solution to the other minds problem, and that is far from obvious–notoriously, inductions based on a single positive instance are problematic and in the case of other minds there is no independent way of verifying the conclusion.) The epiphenomenalist can employ the same strategy as in the case of the argument from evolution and insist that our inference to the mental life of others need not advert to causality all the way up. If the similar behavior and the similar body of others provide evidence for anything, they provide evidence for the assumption that they are in physical states relevantly similar to those which, in us, are causally responsible for our mental life. This inference is not one from outward behavior to inward mental causes, but from outward behavior to inward neurophysiological causes and from there on further to inward mental effects, but it seems that it is no less reliable (see Benecke 1901; Jackson 1982).
Davidson famously pointed out that I may have a reason for performing an action, perform that action, and yet not perform it for that reason (Davidson 1963, 9). Suppose, for instance, I want to meet my mistress and I believe that I can attain this goal by giving her a call; suppose I also have a second-order desire to get rid off my first-order desire and I believe that I can attain this goal by calling my psychiatrist. When I finally walk to the phone, it seems, I have a reason for doing so (my first-order desire plus my corresponding belief) which is not the reason for which I walk to phone (Wilson 1997, 72). According to Davidson, the reasons for an action and the reasons for which the action is performed can be easily distinguished: the reasons for which an action is performed are those which cause the action. This explanation is not available to the epiphenomenalist who holds that no reason ever causes an action. (Again, this is an objection against epiphenomenalism only if Davidson’s distinction makes sense; see Latham 2003 for the view that it doesn’t.) In response, however, the epiphenomenalist can hold that the reasons for which an action is performed are those that are caused by the neurophysiological cause of the action.
Knowledge, memory, justification, meaning and reference all seem to require the causal efficacy of what is known, remembered, believed, meant or picked out. How, for instance, could we say that Sarah knows that there is orange juice in the fridge or that her belief that there is orange juice in the fridge is justified, if her belief were in no way causally connected to the fridge or the orange juice? The causal relation does not have to be direct–it may be that Sarah’s mother saw the orange juice in the fridge, told it to Sarah’s sister who in turn told it to Sarah, causing her thereby to believe that there is orange juice in the fridge. Most of our knowledge depends upon such indirect causal chains. We are not in direct causal contact with Plato, the cholera, Caesar’s crossing of the Rubicon or the outbreak of World War I, but we can have knowledge about these things because we are linked to them by long causal chains starting with someone who was in direct causal contact with them. According to a causal theory of knowledge, knowledge is impossible without such a causal chain, and something similar holds for justification, memory, meaning, and reference. If Sarah believes that it rained on February 1, 1953 in Amsterdam, but the rain on February 1, 1953 in Amsterdam is not causally related in any way to Sarah’s belief, then it seems that her belief cannot be justified; if the rain on that day is not causally related to Sarah’s current mental states in any way, then it seems that she cannot remember the rain on February 1, 1953 in Amsterdam; and one reason why Sarah’s twin on Putnam’s famous Twin Earth (see Putnam 1975) cannot refer to water and why by using the word “water” she cannot mean water is that she never did causally interact with water. If knowledge, justification, memory, meaning and reference require a causal contact with what is known, believed, remembered, meant and picked out, epiphenomenalism implies that we cannot have knowledge of or justified beliefs about mental states (our own or those of others), that we cannot remember past mental states, cannot refer to mental states and cannot make meaningful statements about them. However, it is absurd to hold that Sarah cannot know that she is having a toothache, that she cannot remember the feeling she had when she fell in love for the first time etc. Moreover, if a causal theory of meaning or reference is correct, then the very statements the epiphenomenalist uses to formulate her position are meaningless: “if the mental contributes nothing to the way in which the linguistic practices involving ‘[psychological' terms are developed and sustained in the speech-community [...] then [this] would deprive the epiphenomenalist of the linguistic resources to enunciate his thesis” (Foster 1996, 191). To the extent that epiphenomenalism aspires to make a meaningful statement about the nature of our mental life, it would thus be self-refuting since that is impossible if it is true (see Robinson 2006 for a discussion of this problem and for a reply on behalf of epiphenomenalism). Even if the epiphenomenalist could somehow formulate her position, it would be a pointless exercise from her point of view to try to convince us of its truth, because if she is right, rational considerations can have no causal influence upon our beliefs and actions. In response, the epiphenomenalist could argue that a causal chain cannot always be required because Sarah can know, justifiably believe or remember that bachelors are unmarried and that two plus two equals four, or use the term “the biggest star in the universe” to refer to an object even if she never causally interacted with bachelors, the number two or the biggest star in the universe. The problem, however, is that our knowledge and our memories of and our talk about our mental states seem to be fundamentally different from the typical examples of knowledge, memory, or reference that are possible without a causal contact. As Dieter Birnbacher points out (before he goes on the defend epiphenomenalism against this charge): “[such] examples show that a causal theory of knowledge cannot claim to cover all and every kind of knowledge. But this doesn’t mean that a causal theory of knowledge is implausible for other, and admittedly central, kinds of knowledge such as knowledge by perception and introspection” (Birnbacher 2006, 123-124). The epiphenomenalist has to offer a constructive account of what, if not a causal relation, grounds knowledge, justification, memory, meaning, and reference in the case of mental states. According to David Chalmers, for instance, in the case of phenomenal mental states, knowledge and justification are an immediate consequence of the fact that we have these experiences: “it is having the experiences that justifies the beliefs [about our experiences]” (Chalmers 1996, 196), because “[t]o have an experience is automatically to stand in some sort of intimate epistemic relation to the experience” (Chalmers 1996, 196-197). Since the epiphenomenalist admits that we have experiences and since we cannot have experiences without knowing that we have them, the epiphenomenalist can admit that we can have knowledge of our experiences. Chalmers also develops a non-causal account of memory and reference (Chalmers 1996, 192-203; see Robinson 1982, 2006 for competing but related proposals). Although there may be problems with such accounts, it certainly seems plausible to ask why the opponents of epiphenomenalism insist that the relation that grounds knowledge, justification, memory, reference and meaning must be causal through and through. According to the epiphenomenalist, when Sarah knows that she has a toothache or remembers the feeling she had when she first fell in love, there is a causal chain which leads from the neurophysiological cause of her toothache or her feeling to her current state of knowledge or memory. Why should such a chain be less capable of grounding knowledge or memory than a causal chain which starts with the toothache or the feeling itself? To insist without further explanation that the link has to be causal through and through does not tell us what the apparently indispensable je-ne-sais-quois about such a causal link is, without which knowledge, memory etc. are supposed to be impossible (see Pauen 2006 and Staudacher 2006 for further discussion). There are various objections against epiphenomenalism, nearly all of which are based upon the claim that this or that undeniable fact would be impossible if epiphenomenalism were true. In response, the epiphenomenalist typically points out that the causal relation she says holds between mental states and their neurophysiological correlates ensures that whenever her opponents appeal to a mental cause to account for some apparently undeniable fact, she can appeal to a physical cause which is correlated with the alleged mental cause with nomological necessity and does exactly the same causal job.
University of Bielefeld
Last updated: March 31, 2007 | Originally published: March/31/2007
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