Epistemic closure principles state that the members of an epistemic set (such as propositions known by me) bear a given relation (such as known deductive entailment) only to other members of that epistemic set. The principle of the closure of knowledge under known logical entailment is that one knows everything that one knows to be logically entailed by something else one knows. For instance, if I know grass is green, and I know that grass is green deductively entails that grass is green or the sky is blue, then I know that grass is green or the sky is blue. Epistemic closure principles are employed in philosophy in myriad ways, but some theorists reject such principles, and they remain controversial.
Some people see closure principles as capturing the idea that we can add to our store of knowledge by accepting propositions entailed by what we know; others claim that this is a misunderstanding, and that closure principles are silent as to how a piece of knowledge is, or can be, acquired. For instance, the proposition I have a driver’s license issued by the state of North Carolina entails that North Carolina is not a mere figment of my imagination. According to the principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment, if I know the former claim, and I know the entailment, I know the latter claim. Some insist, however, that this must be distinguished from the (possibly) false claim that I could come to know the latter on the basis of my knowing the former, since my basis for knowing the former involves presupposing the latter (by taking my sense experience and memory at more or less face value, for instance).
Closure principles are employed in both skeptical and anti-skeptical arguments. The skeptic points out that if one knows an ordinary common sense proposition (such as that one has hands) to be true, and knows that this proposition entails the falsity of a skeptical hypothesis (such as that one is a handless brain in a vat, all of whose experiences are hallucinatory), one could know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis, in virtue of knowledge being closed under known entailment. Since one cannot know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis (or so the skeptic maintains), one also must not know the truth of the common sense claim that one has hands. Alternatively, the anti-skeptic might insist that we do know the truth of the common sense proposition, and hence, in virtue of the closure principle, we can know that the skeptical hypothesis is false. Although the closure principle is sometimes used by anti-skeptics, some view the rejection of closure as the key to refuting the skeptic.
A set is closed under a particular relation if all the members of the set bear the relation only to other members of the set. The set of true propositions is closed under entailment because true propositions entail only other truths. Since false propositions sometimes entail truths, false propositions are not closed under entailment. Epistemic closure principles state that members of an epistemic set (such as my justified beliefs) are closed under a given relation (which may be a non-epistemic relation, like entailment, or an epistemic one, such as known entailment).
A simple closure principle is the principle that knowledge is closed under entailment:
If a subject S knows that p, and p entails q, then S knows that q.
Less schematically, this says that if one knows one thing to be true and the known claim logically entails a second thing, then one knows the second thing to be true. This principle has obvious counter-examples. A complicated theorem of logic is entailed by anything (and hence by any proposition one knows), but one may not realize this and may thus fail to believe (or even grasp) the theorem. Since one must at least believe a proposition in order to know that it is true, we see that one may fail to know something entailed by something else that one knows. Additionally, even if a proposition is entailed by something one knows, if one comes to believe the proposition through some epistemically unjustified process, one will fail to know the proposition (since one’s belief of it will be unjustified). For instance, if one knows that one will start a new job today and then comes to believe that one will either start a new job today or meet a handsome stranger based on the testimony of her astrologist, then perhaps she will fail to know the truth of the entailed disjunction.
It is more plausible that knowledge is closed under known entailment:
If S knows that p, and knows that p entails q, then S knows that q.
As stated, however, the principle seems vulnerable to counter-examples similar to the ones just discussed. The subject might fail to put his knowledge that p together with knowledge that p entails q and thus fail to infer q at all. One might know that she has ten fingers and that if she has ten fingers then the number of her fingers is not prime, but simply not bother to go on to deduce and form the belief that her number of fingers is not prime. Alternatively, although the subject could have come to believe q by inferring it correctly from something else that she knows (since she is aware of the entailment), she instead might have come to believe q through some other, epistemically unjustified, process.
How can we capture the idea that one can add to one’s store of knowledge by recognizing and assenting to what is entailed by what one already knows? This formulation seems suitably qualified:
If S knows that p, and comes to believe that q by correctly deducing it from her belief that p, then S knows that q.
Less formally, if I know one thing, correctly deduce another thing from it, and come to believe this second thing by so deducing it, then I know the second thing to be true. This principle eliminates counterexamples in which the subject fails to believe the entailed claim (and thus fails to know it) or comes to believe the entailed claim for bad reasons (and thus fails to know the claim). (Henceforth, uses in this article of the phrase “the principle of closure of knowledge under known entailment” should be regarded as referring to this preferred formulation of the principle).
So much is built into the antecedent of this principle that it might now seem trivial but, as we shall see, it has been disputed on various grounds.
We would seem to have similar grounds for supposing that justified belief is closed under known entailment. One is epistemically justified in believing whatever one correctly deduces from one’s justified beliefs. This captures the idea that one way to add to one’s store of justified beliefs is to believe things entailed by your justified beliefs. When one reasons validly, the justification that one has for the premises carries over to the conclusion.
The mere fact that justification is (ordinarily taken to be) one of the necessary conditions for knowledge does not strictly entail that justification is closed under the same operations (such as known entailment) that knowledge is closed under. As Steven Hales (1995) has pointed out, to argue in this manner is to commit the fallacy of division: to infer from the fact that a whole thing has a particular quality, that each of its components must have this quality as well. For instance, it does not follow from the fact that the glee club is loud that each, or even any, of the individual singers in the glee club is loud. Knowledge might be closed under known entailment even if justified belief is not, if all the counterexamples to the closure of justification were examples in which the justified belief was missing at least one of the necessary conditions for knowledge. There seems to be no particular reason to believe that this is the case, however. (See Brueckner 2004 for more on this point).
The closure principles discussed thus far are instances of single premise closure. For instance, one’s knowledge that a given particular premise is true, when combined with a correct deduction from that premise of a conclusion, seems to guarantee that one knows the conclusion. There are also multiple premise closure principles. Here is an example:
If S knows that p and knows that q, and S comes to believe r by correctly deducing it from p and q, then S knows that r.
That is, if I know two things to be true and can deduce a third thing from the first two, then I know the third thing to be true. There is good reason to be dubious of multiple premise closure principles of justification, such as
If S is justified in believing that p and justified in believing that q, and S correctly deduces r from p and q, then S is justified in believing that r.
Lottery examples reveal the difficulty. Given that there are a million lottery tickets and that exactly one of them must win, it is plausible (though not obvious) that for any particular lottery ticket, I am justified in believing that it will lose. So I am justified in believing that ticket one will lose, that ticket two will lose, and so forth, for every ticket. But if I know that there are a million tickets, and I am justified in believing each of a million claims to the effect that ticket n will lose and I can correctly deduce from these claims that no ticket will win, then by closure I would be justified in concluding that no ticket will win, which by hypothesis is false. Justified belief is fallible, in that one can be justified in believing something even if there is a chance that one is mistaken; conjoin enough of the right sort of justified but fallible beliefs and the resulting conjunction will be unlikely to be true, and thus unjustified.
If knowledge, like justified belief, is fallible (say, only 99.9% certainty is required), then multiple premise closure principles for knowledge will fail as well. One could be sufficiently certain for knowledge about each of a thousand claims (“I will not die today”; “I will not die tomorrow”; …; “I will not die exactly 569 days from today”; etc.), but not sufficiently certain of the conjunction of these claims (“I will not die on any of the next thousand days”) in order to know it, even though it is jointly entailed by those thousand known claims (and thus true). The fallibility of knowledge is far more controversial than the fallibility of justified belief, however.
Similarly, closure might be thought to hold for different types of knowledge, such as a priori knowledge (i.e. knowledge not gotten through sense experience, to oversimplify a bit). If one knows a priori that p, and knows a priori that p entails q, then one knows a priori that q. Intuitively, it seems that if one knows the premises of an argument a priori and is able to validly deduce a conclusion from those premises, one would know the conclusion a priori as well. This last point is on weaker ground, however, as discussed in Section 5b.
The closure principle, now qualified to handle the straightforward counterexamples, has been employed in skeptical and anti-skeptical arguments, in support of a dogmatic refusal pay attention to evidence that counts against what one knows, to generate a paradox about self-knowledge, and for many other philosophical ends. These uses are described in brief in this section, and in greater detail in later sections.
The skeptic may argue as follows:
If one really knew the ordinary common sense claim to be true, one could deduce the falsity of the skeptical claim from it and come to know that the skeptical claim is false (by closure). The fact that one cannot know that the skeptical claim is false (as per the first premise) demonstrates that one does not in fact know that the common sense proposition is true either. (See also Contemporary Skepticism).
But one person’s modus tollens (the inference from if p then q and not-q to the conclusion not-p) is another person’s modus ponens (the inference from if p then q and p to the conclusion q), as we can see from an anti-skeptical argument of the sort associated with G.E. Moore. (See Moore 1959).
From the fact that one knows that she has hands and this is incompatible with a skeptical hypothesis under which her hands are illusory, one can infer, and thus come to know (if closure is correct), the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis.
The closure principle can be used even in defense of a dogmatic rejection of any recalcitrant evidence that counts against something that one takes oneself to know. The argument runs as follows (adapted from Harman 1973):
This result seems paradoxical, however, as most would claim that it is epistemically irresponsible to ignore all the evidence against what one takes oneself to know, simply because it is evidence against what one takes oneself to know. It is plausible (though hardly obvious) that one takes oneself to know each thing that one believes (considered individually). If this is conjoined with the argument above, it entails that one ought to ignore any evidence against what one believes. This seems to be an even more ill-considered policy.
The closure principle also figures prominently in a paradox about self-knowledge and knowledge of the external world. It is now widely accepted that some thought contents are individuated externally. That is, there are some thought contents that one could not have unless one was in an environment or linguistic community that is a certain way. On this view, one could not think the thought that water is wet were one not in an environment with water, or at least with some causal connection to water. Given content externalism, it seems we may argue as follows (the argument is due to McKinsey 1991):
The conclusion follows from an application of the closure principle, but what makes this paradoxical is that it appears that the knowledge that is attributed in the premises depends on reflection alone (introspection plus a priori reasoning), whereas the knowledge attributed in the conclusion is empirical. If the premises are correct, and closure holds, I can know an empirical fact by reflection alone (since I know it on the basis of premises than can be known by reflection alone). Something seems to have gone wrong and it is unclear which premise, if any, is the culprit.
Closure principles figure in another philosophical puzzle about knowledge of “ordinary propositions”, those we ordinarily take ourselves to know, and “lottery propositions,” those that, although extremely likely, we do not ordinarily take ourselves to know. Suppose that one is struggling to get by on a pensioner’s income. It seems plausible to say that one knows one will not be able to afford a mansion on the French Riviera this year. However, that one will not be able to afford the mansion this year entails that one will not win the lottery. By the closure principle, since one knows that one will not be able to afford the mansion, and knows that this entails that one will not win the lottery, one must know that one will not win the lottery. However, very few are inclined at accept that one knows one will not win the lottery. After all, there’s a chance one could win.
To determine whether someone is epistemically justified in believing something, one must do so from a particular point of view. One may consider the point of the view of the agent who holds the belief or of someone who possesses all the relevant information (which may be unavailable to the agent). To oversimplify, those who consider only the subject’s perspective when evaluating the subject’s epistemic justification are epistemic internalists, and those who adopt the point of view of one with all the relevant information are epistemic externalists. An account of epistemic justification is internalist if it requires that all the elements necessary for an agent’s belief to be epistemically justified are cognitively accessible to the agent; that is, these elements (say, evidence or reasons) must be internal to the agent’s perspective. Externalist theories of justification, on the other hand, allow that some of the elements necessary for epistemic justification (such as a belief’s being produced by a process that makes it objectively likely to be true) may be cognitively inaccessible to the agent and external to the agent’s perspective.
There are so many varieties of internalism and externalism that further generalization is perilous. Considering the theories’ respective treatments of the problem of induction illustrates the basic difference between them. Hume famously argued that although we rely on inductive inferences, we have access to no non-question begging justification for doing so, as our only grounds for thinking that induction will continue to be reliable is that it always has been reliable. This is an inductive justification of the belief that induction is epistemically justified. If Hume is right, then a typical internalist will concede that beliefs based on inductive reasoning are not epistemically justified. An externalist, however, might insist that such beliefs are justified, provided that inductive reasoning as a matter of fact is a process that reliably produces mostly true beliefs, whether the agent who reasons inductively has access to that fact or not. On the other hand, an epistemic internalist might rate the beliefs of a brain in a vat or a victim of Cartesian evil demon deception as epistemically justified, provided that they were formed in a way that seems reasonable from the point of the view of the agent (the brain in a vat), such as through the careful consideration of evidence (evidence, albeit, that is misleading). The epistemic externalist, however, likely would rate such an agent’s beliefs as unjustified, on the basis of evidence not accessible to the agent, such as that the belief-forming processes she relies on make her beliefs extremely likely to be false.
For the most part, internalist accounts of knowledge are those that appeal to an internalist conception of epistemic justification and externalist accounts of knowledge employ an externalist conception of justification. (Alternatively, one may be an internalist about justification and an externalist about knowledge, by rejecting the view that epistemic justification is one of the requirements for knowledge.) Perhaps the greatest challenge to closure principles for knowledge comes from externalist theories of knowledge, notably those of Robert Nozick and Fred Dretske.
It strikes many that some version of the closure principle must be true. The idea that no version of the principle is true is, according to one noted epistemologist, “one of the least plausible ideas to come down the philosophical pike in recent years.” (Feldman 1995) Nevertheless, philosophers have argued against the epistemic closure principle on many different grounds. One serious challenge to closure arose from those who proposed the “tracking” analysis of knowledge (notably Nozick 1981). According to the tracking theory, to know that p is to track the truth of p. That is, one’s true belief that p is knowledge if and only if the following two conditions hold: if p were not the case, one would not believe that p, and if p were the case, one would believe that p. For one’s belief that p to be knowledge, one’s belief must be sensitive to the truth or falsity of p; that sensitivity is captured by the two subjunctive conditions above. One knows that Albany is the capital of New York only if one would not believe it if it were false, and would believe it if it were true. (See also Robert Nozick’s epistemology).
This is an externalist theory of knowledge because whether or not an agent satisfies the subjunctive conditions for knowledge may not be cognitively accessible to the agent. To evaluate an agent’s belief, with respect to whether it meets those conditions, it may be necessary to adopt the point of view of someone with information not accessible to the agent.
Let’s illustrate this with an example similar to Nozick’s own (1981, 207). Let p be the belief that one is sitting in a chair in Jerusalem. Let q be the belief that one’s brain is not floating in a tank on Alpha Centauri, being artificially stimulated so as to make one believe one is sitting in a chair in Jerusalem. Suppose one has a true belief that p. In the “closest” counterfactual situations (to employ the terminology of one account of truth-conditions for subjunctives) in which p is false (say, one is standing in Jerusalem, or one is sitting in Tel Aviv), one will not believe p. In close counterfactual situations in which one is sitting in Jerusalem, one does believe that p. One’s belief of p tracks the truth of p and thus counts as knowledge.
Suppose, on the other hand, that one has a true belief that q. If one’s belief that q were false, however (and one really was in this predicament on Alpha Centauri), one would still believe (falsely) that one was not in Alpha Centauri (q). One’s belief that q, while actually true, does not track the truth of q (being held when q is true but not when q is false). Hence, the belief that q does not count as knowledge.
How does this relate to the closure of knowledge? The proposition that one is sitting in Jerusalem (p) entails that one’s brain is not floating in a tank in Alpha Centauri, being stimulated so as to make one think that one is sitting in Jerusalem (q). We may suppose that one can correctly deduce q from p. Even so, since one’s belief that p tracks the truth of p and counts as knowledge and one’s belief that q does not do so, knowledge fails to be closed under known entailment. One may know that p, and know that p entails q (and come to believe the latter by correctly deducing it from the former), and yet fail to know that q.
Nozick’s account has at least two virtues. One is that the tracking analysis of knowledge is plausible. The other is that the rejection of closure allows us to reconcile the following two claims, both of which seem plausible but had seemed incompatible: (1) we do know many common sense propositions, such as that I have hands, and (2) we do not know that skeptical hypotheses, such as that I am a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat, are false. One desideratum of a theory of knowledge is that it refutes skepticism while accounting for the plausibility and persuasiveness of the skeptic’s case against common sense knowledge claims. Both the skeptic and the Moorean anti-skeptic come up short here. The skeptic must deny our common sense knowledge claims and the Moorean must maintain that we can know the falsity of skeptical hypotheses. As long as we accept the closure principle, whether we are skeptics or anti-skeptics, we cannot maintain both that we know common sense propositions and that we do not know that the skeptical hypotheses are false, since we know that the common sense propositions entail the falsity of the skeptical propositions. Knowledge of the truth of the common sense claims would, if knowledge is closed under known entailment, guarantee our knowledge that skeptical hypotheses are false. Citing our failure to know that skeptical hypotheses are false, the skeptic applies modus tollens and infers that we must not know the common sense propositions. The rejection of closure blocks this move by the skeptic.
This is not to say that there are not plausible counterexamples to the tracking account of knowledge. I may know my mother is not the assassin since she was with me when the assassination took place. But counterfactually, if she were the assassin, I would still believe she was not, since after all I couldn’t believe such a thing of my mother. My belief that my mother is not the assassin fails to track the truth, since I would have believed it even if it were false, but it seems quite plausible that I do know she’s not the assassin, as my evidence for her innocence is quite overwhelming – my mother cannot be in two places at once. Tracking accounts like Nozick’s, which do not make reference to the reasons the agent has for the belief in question, seem vulnerable to such counterexamples.
Dretske’s account of knowledge is as follows: one’s true belief that p on the basis of reason R is knowledge that p if only if (i) one’s belief that p is based on R and (ii) R would not hold if p were false. Less formally, we may put this as follows: one knows a given claim to be true only if one has a reason to believe that it is true, and one would not have this reason to believe it if it were not true. (See Dretske 1971). This is an externalist account because whether an agent meets conditions (i) and (ii) above may be inaccessible to the agent. One could believe a claim on the basis of a particular reason without being able to explain one’s reliance on that reason, and without knowing whether one would still have the reason if the claim were false. For instance, one might believe that one’s toes are curled on the basis of proprioceptive evidence (evidence that one would not have if one’s toes were not curled), without one having any idea what proprioception is, what sort of evidence one has for the claim that one’s toes are curled, or whether one would have such evidence even if one’s toes were uncurled.
Let’s illustrate Dretske’s account with his famous zebra example (Dretske 1970). Suppose one is in front of the zebra display at the zoo. One believes that one is seeing zebras on the basis of perceptual evidence. Furthermore, in the closest possible worlds in which one is not seeing zebras (where the display is of camels or tigers), one would not have that perceptual evidence. Consequently, one knows that one is now seeing zebras, on the basis of the perceptual evidence one is having. Consider, however, the belief that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised by zoo staff to resemble zebras. Whatever one’s reason for believing this claim (say, that it is just very unlikely that the zoo would deceive people in that fashion), one would still have this reason even if the belief were false (and one was seeing mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras). Hence, one would not know that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras.
As with Nozick’s account, this provides a counterexample to the closure of knowledge. One can know that one is now seeing zebras, one can correctly deduce from this that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras, and yet fail to know that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras. Furthermore, Dretske’s account better handles the counterexample to Nozick’s theory. One believes (truly) that one’s mother is not the assassin, on the grounds that one was with one’s mother at the time the assassination happened (and that mother cannot be in two places at once) and one would not have this reason to think mother innocent if she were indeed the assassin. Thus, one knows that one’s mother is not the assassin, since the evidence is absolutely conclusive, despite the fact that if one’s mother were the assassin, one would still believe that she wasn’t, on the basis of a different, bad reason.
Even Dretske’s account is plausibly vulnerable to counterexample. Suppose that one believes correctly at noon on Tuesday that Jones is chair of one’s department, on the basis of the typical sort of evidence (say, recollection of Jones being installed in the position, the department’s website listing Jones as chair, and so forth). Suppose that at five minutes past noon on Tuesday, Jones is suddenly struck dead by a bolt of lightning (and is consequently no longer chair). Did one know at noon, five minutes prior to the death, that Jones was the chair? Since one would have had that same set of reasons to believe at noon that Jones was chair even in the closest possible worlds in which he was not chair at noon (that is, worlds in which he’d been struck dead by lightning five minutes before noon), one does not actually know at noon that Jones is the chair. Those who find this verdict implausible (that is, those who think one does know on the basis of the typical evidence that Jones is the chair, right up until the moment that Jones suddenly is struck dead and stops being the chair), may find Dretske’s account of knowledge wanting. (The example is adapted from Brueckner and Fiocco 2002).
Further justification of Dretske’s for denying closure is that there are other sentential operators that are not closed under known entailment and behave in many respects like the knowledge operator. (See Dretske 1970). Dretske defines a sentential operator O to be fully penetrating when O(p) is closed under known entailment. That is, O is penetrating if and only if: O(p) entails O(q) if p is known to entail q. “It is true that” is a penetrating operator, since, if p is known to entail q, “it is true that p” must entail “it is true that q”. “It is surprising that” is non-penetrating; although it is surprising that tomatoes are growing on the apple tree, it is not surprising that something is growing on the apple tree. Some operators are semi-penetrating. An operator is semi-penetrating when it penetrates only to a certain subset of a given proposition’s entailments.
For instance, “R is an explanatory reason for” seems to be a semi-penetrating operator. Within a range of cases, if p is known to entail q, then R is an explanatory reason for p entails R is an explanatory reason for q. A reason that explains why Bill and Harold are invited to every party necessarily is a reason why Harold is invited to every party. Similarly, “knows that” seems to penetrate through similar entailments; if one knows that Bill and Harold are invited to every party, then one knows that Harold is invited to every party.
However, “R is an explanatory reason for my painting the walls green” need not entail “R is an explanatory reason for my painting the walls.” Depending on the context, a reason that explains why I painted my walls green may be a reason why I did something entailed by my painting the walls green, such as my not painting the walls red, but may not be a reason why I did something else entailed by my painting the walls green, such as my not wallpapering the walls green. The emphasis is crucial. A reason to paint the walls green is a reason not to paint them red, but may not be a reason to paint rather than wallpaper. A reason to paint the walls green may be a reason not to paint the floor green, but it might be neutral as to the color. Consideration of ordinary demands for reasons shows that emphasis, or other contextual factors, determines a certain range of reasons to be relevant and a certain range irrelevant. The same reason will not suffice to explain each of the following: “I bought tomatoes,” “I bought tomatoes” and “I bought tomatoes”, even though these three sentences entail and are entailed by exactly the same claims, since they are logically equivalent. Dretske says that no fact is an island and that various contextual factors will determine, for each operator, its relevant alternatives (i.e. the negations of the consequents to which the operator penetrates). (See also Contextualism in Epistemology, Chapter 3, on Dretske and the denial of closure).
On the other hand, some philosophers view the closure principle as so obviously true that, rather than reject it to accommodate a given theory of knowledge, they would reject the account of knowledge in order to keep closure. Dretske’s account of knowledge has been much discussed in the philosophical literature. One consequence of this rejection of closure in favor of his account that hardly seems felicitous is that one could truly say, “I know that that animal is a zebra and I know that zebras are not mules, but I don’t know that that animal is not a cleverly disguised mule.” Or, “I know I have hands, and I know that if I have hands I am not handless, but I don’t know that I am not a handless brain in a vat.” Worse yet, “I know it is not a mule, but I don’t know it’s not a cleverly disguised mule.” These claims (“abominable conjunctions,” according to DeRose 1995) sound at best paradoxical and at worst absurd. This seems to point to the extreme plausibility of some form or another of the closure principle.
Dretske (2005a, 17-18) agrees that such statements sound absurd, but maintains that they are true. They may violate conventional conversational expectations and they may be met with incomprehension, but they are not self-contradictory. “Empty” and “flat” are often taken to be absolute concepts (since to be empty is to not contain anything at all and to be flat is to have no bumps), but also context-relative, in that whether a particular item counts as a thing or a bump depends on the context. It sounds a bit strange to say that the warehouse is empty, but has lots of dust, gas molecules, and empty crates in it. The utterance may violate conversational rules, but the utterance might, despite all that, be true, if the concepts of emptiness and flatness are as described. So too with the abominable conjunctions if the attendant conception of knowledge is correct. Philosophers may always appeal to Gricean conversational implicatures to blunt the objection that their view entails absurd claims. Truth and conversational propriety are not one and the same. (Paul Grice is the philosopher most closely associated with the view that communication is guided by various conversational maxims and that some utterances are conversationally inappropriate, even if true, because they invite misunderstanding. For instance, the utterance “Mary insulted her boss and she was fired,” is true even if Mary did not insult her boss until after she was fired, but it would be an inappropriate remark in most contexts, since the listener naturally would conclude that the insult preceded the dismissal. For more on this, see Grice 1989).
John Hawthorne (2005: 30-31) makes two points in reply. First, he says, it is unclear what sort of Gricean mechanism could make it true but conversationally inappropriate to utter “S knew that p and correctly deduced q from p, but did not know that q.” Second, an appeal of this sort can at best explain why we do not utter certain true propositions, but not why we actually believe their negations. Even if it is true that one’s wife is his best friend, it would be inappropriate for him to introduce her to someone as his best friend. But the conversational mechanism at play here could hardly be an explanation for why he believed that his wife was not his best friend (even though she was). Why, if the denial of closure is true but conversationally infelicitous, do so many not only not deny closure in conversations but in fact believe that the closure principle is true?
One might reply that many people, even philosophers, are apt in some situations to mistake what is conversationally appropriate for what is true (as with conditional claims that have false antecedents), so an explanation of why a true claim violates conversational norms might well explain why people believe the negation of the claim.
There are alternative strategies for refuting skepticism that seem to have many of the virtues of the tracking account of knowledge, but do not entail the falsity of closure principles. Contextualism, for example, says that knowledge attributions are sensitive to context, in that a subject S might know a proposition p relative to one context, but simultaneously fail to know that p relative to another context. The contextual factors to which knowledge attributions are taken to be sensitive include things like whether a particular doubt has been raised or acknowledged and the importance of the belief being correct.
In an ordinary context, where skeptical scenarios have not been raised, the standards for knowledge are quite low, but, in contexts in which skeptical doubts have been raised, such as an epistemology class, standards for knowledge have been raised to levels that typically cannot be met. One might know relative to the everyday context that she has hands, but fail to know this relative to the skeptic’s context, because a skeptical scenario has been raised and she cannot rule it out.
Or a true belief with a certain level of justification might count as knowledge as long as it is not terribly important that the belief be correct, but would no longer be knowledge if the stakes were raised. One might know that the bank will be open on Saturday after confirming that the bank has Saturday hours, even if one has not checked whether the bank has changed its hours in the past two weeks, as long as no great harm will befall one if it turns out one is wrong. But if financial ruin will befall one were a check not deposited before Monday, then one’s justification might need to be stronger before it would be correct to say that one knows the bank is open Saturday.
The contextualist then can reconcile the intuitions that it is sometimes correct to attribute to someone knowledge of everyday common sense propositions, despite her inability to rule out skeptical propositions, and that we are sometimes correct in refusing to attribute knowledge of the falsity of a skeptical scenario when the subject is unable to rule out such scenarios. But the contextualist can do this while accepting at least some version of closure. The contextualist says that epistemic closure holds within an epistemic context, but fails inter-contextually. For instance, in the everyday, low epistemic standards context, one knows that one has hands and anything that one can correctly deduce from this claim, such as that one is not a handless being deceived into thinking that one has hands. In the context with much higher epistemic standards, one knows neither that one is not a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat, nor (by an application of the closure of knowledge under known entailment) that one has hands. Closure will fail only when it extends across contexts. For instance, if one were to cite one’s knowledge that one has hands (in the ordinary context) as grounds for saying in the heightened context that one knows that the brain in a vat hypothesis is false (as the Moorean might), one would illegitimately apply the closure principle. The skeptic’s citing one’s failure to know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis (in the heightened context) as entailing that one does not know the common sense proposition (in the ordinary context) would be a similar misuse of the closure principle.
If a theory of knowledge is independently plausible and can answer the skeptic without denying closure, then, everything else being equal, we ought to be reluctant to reject closure just so that we can accept the tracking account of knowledge. Contextualism, of course, is plagued with problems of its own. One such problem is as follows: since whether one knows a claim or not depends on how stringent the epistemic standards are in the context and the standards can be raised by a particular doubt occurring to someone in the context, contextualism seems to imply that it is easier to know things if one spends time with the stupid or incurious or if one is stupid or incurious.
The plausibility of the denial of closure may well depend not only on whether it is a way to avoid skepticism, but on whether it is the only way to do so. (Dretske does insist that the only plausible way to refute skepticism is by denying closure. See his 2005a and 2005b for a defense of this claim, trenchant criticisms of the contextualist theory, and responses to criticisms of the tracking theory.)
One of the strengths claimed for the tracking account of knowledge is that it blocks the standard skeptical argument, since it involves the rejection of closure. Not all skeptical arguments employ closure principles, however, so it is unclear how much anti-skeptical value would accrue from denying closure. Underdetermination arguments might be the best skeptical arguments and they do not depend (at least explicitly) on closure.
Underdetermination is a relation that holds between two or more theories, when the theories are incompatible, but empirically equivalent. Underdetermination skeptical arguments rely crucially on the premise that if two theories are incompatible but compatible with all the available (and perhaps possible) data, we cannot know that one is true and the other false. Compare, for example, the thesis that I have hands, which I perceive through sense perception, and the thesis that I am a handless brain in a vat, artificially stimulated so as to have misleading sense perceptions. These theses are incompatible, but they are empirically equivalent. Whichever thesis were true, I would have the same sort of experiences. Suppose we adopt the following principle: if two incompatible theses both entail (or predict) the same observational data, then that observational data does not support (or justify belief of) one of the theses over the other. With this principle and the premise that the two theses are incompatible but observationally equivalent, we can deduce that our apparent perception of our hands does not justify us in believing that we have hands.
The argument is greatly oversimplified, but the outline of the skeptical argument from underdetermination now ought to be clear. The argument does not explicitly employ any closure premise, so the rejection of closure would seem not to undermine the argument in any straightforward way. One could always argue that the appeal of the argument from underdetermination implicitly relies on the closure principle or that the argument from underdetermination is objectionable on other grounds. Skeptical arguments from underdetermination, however, seem as plausible as other skeptical arguments and their plausibility seems not to depend on the plausibility of any of the closure principles.
Infinite regress arguments for skepticism also do not straightforwardly appeal to closure. A regress argument that no belief is epistemically justified (and hence than no belief counts as knowledge) runs as follows. We assume that all justification is inferential. That is, every justified belief is justified by appeal to some other justified belief. The basis for this claim might be the nature of argumentation. One is justified in believing a conclusion if one is justified in believing the premises that support the conclusion. If the conclusion is one of the premises, then the argument is question-begging, or circular, and not rationally persuasive. But if every justified belief can be justified only be inferring it from some further justified belief and there cannot be an infinite regress of justified beliefs, then it must be that no beliefs are justified. (A foundationalist about justification, on the other hand, while agreeing that an infinite regress of justified beliefs is impossible, insists that there are justified beliefs, and hence that some beliefs are justified non-inferentially, or in other words, that some justified beliefs are basic or foundational). The claim that no justified belief is self-justifying does not entail any closure principle of justification or knowledge, so the argument seems to be independent of closure and thus not vulnerable to arguments against closure principles. (See also Ancient Skepticism).
The proponent of the tracking account of knowledge need not answer all forms of the skeptical argument with the same tools, so even if some skeptical arguments do not depend on the closure principle, the tracking analysis might provide the resources for countering the skeptical arguments from underdetermination or regress.
At least one philosopher (Audi 1988, 76-8; 1991, 77-84) has claimed that the justification of dogmatism, adapted from Harman (see section 2 of this article), is a reductio ad absurdum of the epistemic closure principle. If closure allows one to infer, and thus know, that any evidence against something one knows must be misleading and may be ignored, then closure must be rejected.
Audi’s example is of a man who adds up a series of numbers and thereby knows the sum of the numbers. But the man’s wife (whom he considers to be a better mathematician) says that he has added the numbers incorrectly and gotten the wrong sum. If the man knows that the sum is n, and knows that his wife says the sum is not n, then by closure he knows that his wife is wrong. (This is so, as “the sum is n and my wife says the sum in not n” entails that “my wife is wrong;” one knows the former claim and knows it entails the latter, so one knows the latter). Since he knows his wife is wrong, there is no need to recalculate the sum. (Similar examples appear in Dretske 1970 and Thalberg 1974). If one believes something only when one takes oneself to know it, as is plausible, then by this reasoning one has reason to dismiss any evidence against something that one believes.
Denying the closure principle to avoid the odd dogmatic conclusion has some initial appeal, but there are alternative solutions that do not require us to reject such a compelling principle. And, as Feldman says (1995, 493), there is a general reason not to resolve the paradox by denying closure. To say, “Yes, I know that p is true, and that p entails q, but I draw the line at q,” seems irrational. To refuse to accept what you know to be the consequences of your beliefs, he says, is to be “patently unreasonable.” Not only is it infelicitous to deny closure, but the dogmatist argument may be blocked without doing so.
For instance, one could take the dogmatism argument to be a reductio ad absurdum of the anti-skeptical position. This is the tack taken by Peter Unger (1975). If we deny that one could know that p (say, that the sum of the numbers is n), then even if we accept closure, we have no reason to suppose that one could know that all evidence against p was misleading.
Alternatively, Roy Sorensen (Sorensen 1988) argues that given that one knows that p, the conditional “If E is evidence against p, then E is misleading” is a junk conditional, in that although it may be known to be true, this knowledge cannot be expanded under modus ponens. That is to say, if “if p then q” is a junk conditional, the conditional can be known to be true, but it could not be the case that simultaneously the conditional is known and that knowledge of the antecedent p would justify one in believing the consequent q. Some conditionals are known to be true on the basis of the extreme unlikelihood of the antecedent, but are such that if one acquired evidence that supports the antecedent, one would not be justified in inferring the consequent because the probability of the antecedent is inversely proportional to the probability of the conditional. That is, if one were to learn that the antecedent of the conditional was true, one would no longer have reason to accept (and would no longer know) the conditional. “If this is a Cuban cigar, then I’m a monkey’s uncle!” is an example of such a conditional. This conditional can be known to be true, in virtue of the antecedent being known to be false, but if one were to find evidence that this is indeed a Cuban cigar, one should not infer that he is a monkey’s uncle. Rather, one should conclude that perhaps one did not know the conditional to be true after all, since one has evidence that its antecedent was true and its consequent false. In short, if a conditional is a junk conditional one cannot come to know the consequent q in virtue of one’s knowing the antecedent p and the conditional if p then q, because one’s knowledge of the conditional depends on the falsity of the antecedent.
Given that one knows that r (say, that one’s car is in parking lot A), one knows that the conditional “if there is any evidence against r, however strong, then it must be misleading” is true. Part of one’s basis for knowing that r might be that one has reason to believe that there is no strong evidence against r. But if one were to learn of strong evidence against r, such as testimony that one’s car had been towed, one ought, at least in some cases, to consider the possibility that one does not in fact know that r, rather than simply inferring that the testimony is misleading. Learning the truth of the antecedent – that there is strong evidence against r – may undermine the justification for believing the conditional itself, thus making the conditional resistant to modus ponens. Knowledge of the conditional depends on one’s knowing that the antecedent is false. Finding evidence in favor of the antecedent – even if in fact it is misleading – may weaken one’s justification for the conditional, such that one no longer knows the conditional to be true.
This blocking of the dogmatist argument does not involve denying closure, though. The reason the modus ponens inference fails to go through is because the conditional is a “junk” conditional; one can know the conditional to be true only if one does not know the antecedent to be true, and the closure principle applies only if one simultaneously knows both the conditional and its antecedent to be true.
Another explanation that does not require the denial of closure is due to Michael Veber (Veber 2004). He says that even if the dogmatist argument is sound, the principle “If a piece of evidence E is known by S to be misleading, S ought to disregard it,” ought not to be endorsed on grounds of human fallibility. We are frequently enough wrong in taking ourselves to know what we in fact do not know that following such a principle would lead one to disregard evidence that is not misleading. There is nothing wrong with the principle, provided it is correctly applied; but due to the difficulty or impossibility of correctly applying it, adopting such a policy is contraindicated.
Michael McKinsey (1991) discovered a paradox about content externalism that has prompted some reconsideration of how knowledge is transmitted through deductive reasoning.
Content externalism (or anti-individualism) is, to greatly oversimplify, the thesis that we are only able to have thoughts with certain contents because we inhabit environments of certain sorts. (Putnam 1975 and Burge 1979 are the most notable defenses of this view). Molecule-for-molecule duplicates could differ in their contents due to differences in their environments. According to the externalist, my twin on Twin Earth might be an exact duplicate of me, but if Twin Earth contains a different but similar light metal used to make baseball bats, cans, and so forth instead of aluminum, then even if the denizens of Twin Earth call this metal “aluminum,” their thoughts are not thoughts about aluminum. This view is a repudiation of the Cartesian view of the mental, according to which the contents of our thoughts are what they are independent of the surrounding world.
Externalism has been defended and criticized on many different grounds, but the debate about externalism has pivoted largely on its implications for the thesis that we have privileged access to the contents of our own thoughts. How does one know that she is now thinking that some cans are made from aluminum, rather than the thought that some cans are made from twaluminum (as we may call it), which is what she would be thinking if she lived on Twin Earth? Incompatibilists about externalism and privileged access point out that the two thoughts are introspectively indiscriminable if externalism is true and argue that one could only know which of these thoughts one is now thinking through empirical investigation of one’s environment.
Compatibilists about externalism and self-knowledge often argue that if a subject has a mental state with a particular content (say, a belief that some cans are made of aluminum) in virtue of that subject bearing a certain relation to an external state of affairs (say, aluminum, rather than twaluminum, being present in one’s environs), then any mental state the subject has about that particular mental state of his, like his belief that he believes some cans are made of aluminum, will also stand in a similar relation to the same external state of affairs (aluminum, rather than twaluminum, being present). Hence, this second-order mental state (i.e. a mental state about a mental state) will involve the same content as the first-order belief (say, that some cans are made of aluminum). In short, one will believe that he believes cans are made of aluminum only if one in fact does believe that cans are made of aluminum, since both of these states bear a causal relation to aluminum, rather than twaluminum. (See Burge 1988 and Heil 1988). Whatever makes it the case that S thinks that p (instead of q) will also make it the case that S thinks I am thinking that p (instead of I am thinking that q). Coupled with a reliabilist theory of knowledge, these second-order beliefs count as knowledge since they cannot go wrong and the thesis of privileged access is reconciled with externalism.
Enter McKinsey’s Paradox. We assume that we know content externalism to be true and that it is compatible with a suitably robust thesis of privileged access to thought contents. We may now reason as follows:
The knowledge attributed in the premises is a priori in the broad sense that includes knowledge gotten through introspection and/or philosophical reflection. That knowledge is not gained via empirical investigation of the external world. The conclusion follows by an application of the closure principle. What is paradoxical is that, given closure, it seems that one can know the truth of an empirical claim about the external world (say, that one’s environment contains water or that it contains aluminum rather than twaluminum) simply by inferring it from truths known by reflection or introspection. This argument bolsters the incompatibilist’s case: since it is only by investigation of the world that one can know that one meets a particular set of external conditions and since the premises (including closure) entail that this fact can be known on the basis of knowledge not dependent on investigation of the world, either the privileged access premise or the externalist thesis must be false (provided that the closure principle is correct).
There are many responses to this argument. Some reject externalism, some (like McKinsey) deny privileged access, and some compatibilists (Brueckner 1992) argue that even if externalism is known to be true, nothing as specific as the second premise of the argument could be known a priori. But perhaps the most influential attempt to solve the paradox is due to Martin Davies (1998) and Crispin Wright (2000). They argue that even though arguments like McKinsey’s are valid and their premises are known to be true, this knowledge is not transmitted across the entailment to the conclusion. At first blush, it seems like Davies and Wright are rejecting closure, which is certainly one way to deal with the paradox. Davies and Wright accept closure, though, and only reject a related but stronger epistemological principle that says that knowledge is transmitted over known entailment.
Davies and Wright are distinguishing between the closure of knowledge under known entailment and what they take to be a common misreading of it. The closure principle says that if one knows that p and knows that p entails q, then one knows that q, but the principle is silent on what one’s basis or justification for q is and does not claim that the basis for q is the knowledge that p and that p entails q. The principle of the transmission of knowledge under known entailment, however, states that if one knows that p, and knows that p entails q, then one knows q on that basis – what enables one to know that p and that p entails q also enables one to know that q. Davies and Wright accept the closure principle but deny the transmission principle, arguing that it fails when the inference from p to q is, although valid, not cogent. Here cogency is understood as an argument’s aptness for producing rational conviction.
One way an argument could be valid but fail to be cogent is that the justification for the premises presupposes the truth of the conclusion. If I reason from the premise that I have a drivers license issued by the state of North Carolina (based on visual inspection of my license and memory of having obtained it at the North Carolina Department of Motor Vehicles) to the conclusion that there exists an external world, including North Carolina, outside my mind, it is plausible that my justification for the premise (taking sense experience and memory at face value) presupposes the truth of the conclusion. If this is so, then it seems that the premise could not be my basis for knowing the conclusion. Anyone in doubt about the conclusion would not accept the premise, so although the premise entails the conclusion, the premise could not provide the basis for rational conviction that the conclusion is true. Such an argument is valid, but not cogent. It would not be a counterexample to closure, for anyone who knows the premise and the entailment also must know the conclusion, but it is a counterexample to the transmission principle, since the conclusion would not be known on the basis of the knowledge of the premise.
According to Davies and Wright, the McKinsey argument is valid but not cogent because knowledge of the conclusion is presupposed in one’s supposed introspective knowledge of the premises. Thus, it is a counterexample to transmission, but poses no threat to closure. The non-empirical access to the externally individuated thought contents is conditional on the assumption that certain external conditions obtain (such as that one’s environs include aluminum rather than twaluminum), which can only be confirmed empirically. Thus one may not reason from the non-empirical knowledge claimed in the premises to non-empirical knowledge of an empirical truth that enjoys presuppositional status with regard to the premises. That one has a thought about water may entail that one bears a causal relation to water in one’s environment (if externalism is correct) and one may know the former and the entailment only if one knows the latter, but one may not cogently reason from the premise to the conclusion, since the inference begs the question. Anyone who doubts the conclusion of the McKinsey argument in the first place would not (or at least should not — the presuppositions of our premises are not always recognized as such) be moved to accept the premises that entail it.
Consider then the following principle about a priori knowledge:
(APK) If a subject knows something a priori and correctly deduces (a priori) from it a second thing, then the subject knows a priori the second claim.
We can describe this principle in two equivalent ways. It is the principle of closure of a priori knowledge under correct a priori deduction and, alternatively, it is a specific instance of the principle of transmission of knowledge under known entailment, since it claims that the a priori basis for knowledge of the premise transmits to the conclusion, allowing it to be known a priori as well. If Davies and Wright are correct, the principle is false because counterexamples may be found in deductions that are valid but not cogent.
Davies and Wright apply this distinction between transmission and closure to Moore’s anti-skeptical argument as well. Although it is true that the negation of the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis is entailed by an ordinary proposition, such as that I have hands, the existence of the external world is presupposed in the justification for that premise and, therefore, may not be justifiably inferred from that premise. Moore’s argument is not cogent, so it is a counterexample to transmission, which we have reason to reject anyhow, and not a counterexample to closure (or so Davies and Wright argue).
This is plausibly another sort of conditional that is not expandable by modus ponens. Unlike the junk conditionals, which cannot be expanded because the conditional can be known to be true only when the antecedent of the conditional is not known to be true, conditionals in which the justification for the antecedent presupposes justification for the consequent – we may call them conditionals of presupposition – cannot be expanded because the relevant modus ponens inference would not be cogent. The inference would be question-begging.
The distinction that Davies and Wright argue for also applies to closure principles for justified belief. If they are correct, then justified belief could be closed under known entailment even if justification is not necessarily transmitted across known entailment. The counterexamples to the transmission principle for knowledge would also function as counterexamples for the transmissibility of justified belief.
Some have argued that the Davies-Wright line of argument fails to solve the McKinsey paradox. Whether they are right is beyond the scope of this entry. But the distinction Davies and Wright have drawn between transmission and closure is an important one. That if one knows that p and has validly deduced q from p, one must know that q, tells us nothing about one’s basis for q. Although quite often it can and will, in some instances knowledge of p cannot provide the basis for knowledge of q, even though p entails q, because the justification for p presupposes q. One knows that q (on some independent basis), so there is no counterexample to closure, but q will not be known on the basis of p, so the transmission principle is false.
Clarifying the closure principle as a principle about the distribution of knowledge across known entailment, rather than as a principle about the transmission or acquisition of knowledge, divorces the closure principle, to some extent, from the initial intuitive support for it, which is the idea that we can add to our store of knowledge (or justified belief) by accepting what we know to be entailed by propositions we know (or justifiably believe). On this understanding of closure, knowledge and justified belief are distributed across known entailment even when drawing the inference in question could not add to one’s store of knowledge or justified belief.
The closure principle also figures in a paradox about our knowledge of “ordinary propositions” and “lottery propositions.” Ordinary propositions are those that we ordinarily suppose ourselves to know. Lottery propositions are those with a high likelihood of being true, but which we are ordinarily disinclined to say that we know. Suppose that one lives on a fixed income and struggles to make ends meet. It seems that one knows one will not be able to afford a mansion on the French Riviera this year. One’s not being able to afford the mansion this year entails that one will not win the big lottery this year. By the closure principle, since one knows that one will not be able to afford the mansion and one knows that one’s not being able to afford the mansion entails that one will not win the lottery, one must know that one will not win the lottery. Most, however, are disinclined to say that one could know that one will not win the lottery. There’s always a chance, after all (provided that one buys a ticket).
This phenomenon is widespread. Ordinarily, one who keeps up with politics could be said to know that Dick Cheney is the U.S. Vice-President. That Cheney is the Vice-President entails that Cheney did not die of a heart attack thirty seconds ago. But it seems that one does not know that Cheney did not die of a heart attack in the last thirty seconds. How could one know such a thing? (The coining of the term “lottery proposition” and the discovery that this phenomenon is widespread, is due to Jonathan Vogel).
The apparently inconsistent triad is (i) one knows the ordinary proposition, (ii) one fails to know the lottery proposition, and (iii) closure. One may eliminate the inconsistency by denying closure on the sort of grounds that Dretske and Nozick cite. Plausibly, one’s belief of so-called ordinary propositions tracks the truth, while one’s belief of lottery propositions does not. If Cheney were not Vice-President, one would not believe he was, but had Cheney died in the past thirty seconds, one still would believe he was Vice-President.
One might bite the skeptical bullet and insist that one really does not know that Cheney is Vice-President. One of a more anti-skeptical bent might maintain that one can really know the lottery propositions, such as that Cheney did not die in the last thirty seconds. Such a resolution has considerable costs, but denying closure is not among them.
Alternatively, one might argue for a contextualist handling of the problem that does not require the denial of closure or biting the skeptical or anti-skeptical bullet.
John M. Collins
East Carolina University
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 13, 2006 | Originally published: